Gaius Musonius Rufus was one of the four great Stoic philosophers of the Roman empire, along with Seneca, Epictetus,, and Marcus Aurelius. A renowned Stoic teacher, Musonius conceived of philosophy as nothing but the practice of noble behavior. He advocated a commitment to live for virtue, and not pleasure, since virtue saves us from the mistakes that ruin life. Though philosophy is more difficult to learn than other subjects, it is more important because it corrects the errors in thinking that lead to errors in acting, he maintained. He also called for the practice of austere personal habits, including the simplest vegetarian diet, and minimal, inexpensive garments and footwear; this is in order to achieve a good, sturdy life in accord with the principles of Stoicism. He believed that philosophy must be studied not to cultivate brilliance in arguments or an excessive cleverness, but to develop good character, a sound mind, and a tough, healthy body. Musonius condemned all luxuries and disapproved of sexual activity outside of marriage. He also argued that women should receive the same education in philosophy as men, since the virtues are the same for both sexes. He praised the married life with lots of children. He affirmed the Stoic orthodoxy through advocating that death, injury, insult, pain, poverty, and exile are not to be feared since none of them are evils.
Gaius Musonius Rufus was born before 30 C.E. in Volsinii, an Etruscan city of Italy, as a Roman eques (knight), the class of aristocracy ranked second only to senators. He was a friend of Rubellius Plautus, whom Nero, the Roman emperor, saw as a threat. When Nero banished Rubellius around 60 C.E., Musonius accompanied him on his exile to Asia Minor. After Rubellius died in 62 C.E. Musonius returned to Rome, where he taught and practiced Stoicism, which roused the suspicion of Nero. On discovery of the great conspiracy against Nero, led by Calpurnius Piso in 65 C.E., the emperor banished Musonius to the arid and desolate island of Gyaros in the Aegean Sea. He returned to Rome under the reign of Galba in 68 C.E. and tried to advocate peace to the Flavian army approaching Rome. In 70 C.E. Musonius secured the conviction of the philosopher Publius Egnatius Celer, who had betrayed Barea Soranus, a friend of Rubellius Plautus. Musonius was exiled a second time, by Vespasian, but returned to Rome during the reign of Titus. Musonius was highly respected and had a considerable following during his life. He died before 101-2 C.E.
Either Musonius wrote nothing himself, or what he did write is lost, because none of his own writings survive. His philosophical teachings survive as thirty-two apophthegms (pithy sayings) and twenty-one longer discourses, all apparently preserved by others and all in Greek, except for Aulus Gellius’ testimonia in Latin. For this reason, it is likely that he lectured in Greek. Musonius favored a direct and concise style of instruction. He taught that the teacher of philosophy should not present many arguments but rather should offer a few, clear, practical arguments oriented to his listener and couched in terms known to be persuasive to that listener.
Musonius believed that (Stoic) philosophy was the most useful thing. Philosophy persuades us, according to Stoic teaching, that neither life, nor wealth, nor pleasure is a good, and that neither death, nor poverty, nor pain is an evil; thus the latter are not to be feared. Virtue is the only good because it alone keeps us from making errors in living. Moreover, it is only the philosopher who seems to make a study of virtue. The person who claims to be studying philosophy must practice it more diligently than the person studying medicine or some other skill, because philosophy is more important, and more difficult to understand, than any other pursuit. This is because, unlike other skills, people who study philosophy have been corrupted in their souls with vices and thoughtless habits by learning things contrary to what they will learn in philosophy. But the philosopher does not study virtue just as theoretical knowledge. Rather, Musonius insists that practice is more important, as it effectively leads us to action, than theory. He held that though everyone is naturally disposed to live without error and has the capacity to be virtuous, someone who has not actually learned the skill of virtuous living cannot be expected to live without error any more than someone who is not a trained doctor, musician, scholar, helmsman, or athlete could be expected to practice those skills without error.
In one of his lectures Musonius recounts the advice he offered to a visiting Syrian king. A king must protect and help his subjects, so a king must know what is good or bad, helpful or harmful, useful or useless for people. But to diagnose these things is precisely the philosopher’s job. Since a king must also know what justice is and make just decisions, a king must study philosophy. A king must possess self-control, frugality, modesty, courage, wisdom, magnanimity, the ability to prevail in speech over others, the ability to endure pain, and must be free of error. Philosophy, Musonius argued, is the only art that provides all such virtues. To show his gratitude the king offered him anything he wanted, to which Musonius asked only that the king adhere to the principles set forth.
Musonius held that since a human being is made of body and soul, we should train both, but the latter demands greater attention. This dual method requires becoming accustomed to cold, heat, thirst, hunger, scarcity of food, a hard bed, abstaining from pleasures, and enduring pains. This method strengthens the body, inures it to suffering, and makes it fit for every task. He believed that the soul is similarly strengthened by developing courage through enduring hardships, and by making it self-controlled through abstaining from pleasures. Musonius insisted that exile, poverty, physical injury, and death are not evils and a philosopher must scorn all such things. A philosopher regards being beaten, jeered at, or spat upon as neither injurious nor shameful and so would never litigate against anyone for any such acts, according to Musonius. He argued that since we acquire all good things by pain, the person who refuses to endure pain all but condemns himself to not being worthy of good.
Musonius criticized cooks and chefs while defending farming as a suitable occupation for a philosopher and no obstacle to learning or teaching essential lessons.
Musonius’ extant teachings emphasize the importance of daily practices. For example, he emphasized that what one eats has significant consequences. He believed that mastering one’s appetites for food and drink is the basis for self-control, a vital virtue. He argued that the purpose of food is to nourish and strengthen the body and to sustain life, not to provide pleasure. Digesting our food gives us no pleasure, he reasoned, and the time spent digesting food far exceeds the time spent consuming it. It is digestion which nourishes the body, not consumption. Therefore, he concluded, the food we eat serves its purpose when we’re digesting it, not when we’re tasting it.
The proper diet, according to Musonius, was lacto-vegetarian. These foods are least expensive and most readily available: raw fruits in season, certain raw vegetables, milk, cheese, and honeycombs. Cooked grains and some cooked vegetables are also suitable for humans, whereas a meat-based diet is too crude for human beings and is more suitable for wild beasts. Those who eat relatively large amounts of meat seemed slow-witted to Musonius.
We are worse than brute animals when it comes to food, he thought, because we are obsessed with embellishing how our food is presented and fuss about what we eat and how we prepare it merely to amuse our palates. Moreover, too much rich food harms the body. For these reasons, Musonius thought that gastronomic pleasure is undoubtedly the most difficult pleasure to combat. He consequently rejected gourmet cuisine and delicacies as a dangerous habit. He judged gluttony and craving gourmet food to be most shameful and to show a lack of moderation. Indeed, Musonius was of the opinion that those who eat the least expensive food can work harder, are the least fatigued by working, become sick less often, tolerate cold, heat, and lack of sleep better, and are stronger, than those who eat expensive food. He concluded that responsible people favor what is easy to obtain over what is difficult, what involves no trouble over what does, and what is available over what isn’t. These preferences promote self-control and goodness.
Musonius advocated a similarly austere philosophy about clothes. The purpose of our clothes and footwear is strictly protection from the elements. So clothes and shoes should be modest and inexpensive, not attract the attention of the foolish. One should dress to strengthen and toughen the body, not to bundle up in many layers so as never to experience cold and heat and make the body soft and sensitive. Musonius recommended dressing to feel somewhat cold in winter and avoiding shade in the summer. If possible, he advised, go shoeless.
The purpose of houses, he believed, was to protect us from the elements, to keep out cold, excessive heat, and the wind. Our dwelling should protect us and our food the way a cave would. Money should be spent both publicly and privately on people, not on elaborate buildings or fancy décor. Beds or tables of ivory, silver, or gold, hard-to-get textiles, cups of gold, silver, or marble—all such furnishings are entirely unnecessary and shamefully extravagant. Items that are expensive to acquire, hard to use, troublesome to clean, difficult to guard, or impractical, are inferior when compared with inexpensive, useful, and practical items made of cast iron, plain ceramic, wood, and the like. Thoughtless people covet expensive furnishings they wrongly believe are good and noble. He said he would rather be sick than live in luxury, because illness harms only the body, whereas living in luxury harms both the body and the soul. Luxury makes the body weak and soft and the soul undisciplined and cowardly. Musonius judged that luxurious living fosters unvarnished injustice and greed, so it must be completely avoided.
For the ancient Roman philosophers, following their Greek predecessors, the beard was the badge of a philosopher. Musonius said that a man should cut the hair on his scalp the way he prunes vines, by removing only what is useless and bothersome. The beard, on the other hand, should not be shaved, he insisted, because (1) nature provides it to protect a man’s face, and (2) the beard is the emblem of manhood, the human equivalent of the cock’s comb and the lion’s mane. Hair should never be trimmed to beautify or to please women or boys. Hair is no more trouble for men than feathers are for birds, Musonius said. Consequently, shaving or fastidiously trimming one’s beard were acts of emasculation.
Musonius believed that women ought to receive the same education in philosophy as men by means of the following arguments. First, the gods have given women the same power of reason as men. We use reason to consider whether an action is good or bad, honorable or shameful. Second, the female has the same senses as men: sight, hearing, smell, and the rest. Third, the sexes share the same parts of the body: head, torso, arms, and legs. Fourth, women have an equal desire for virtue and a natural affinity for it. Women, no less than men, are by nature pleased by noble, just deeds and censure their opposites. Therefore, Musonius concluded, it is just as appropriate for women to study philosophy, and thereby to consider how to live honorably, as it is for men.
Moreover, he reasoned, a woman must be able to manage an estate, to account for things beneficial to it, and to supervise the household staff. A woman must also have self-control. She must be free from sexual improprieties and must exercise self-control over other pleasures. She must neither be a slave to desires, nor quarrelsome, nor extravagant, nor vain. A self-controlled woman, Musonius believed, controls her anger, is not overcome by grief, and is stronger than every emotion. But these are the character traits of a beautiful person, whether male or female.
Musonius argued that a woman who studies philosophy would be just, a blameless partner in life, a good and like-minded co-worker, a careful guardian of husband and children, and completely free from the love of gain and greed. She would regard it worse to do wrong than to be wronged, and worse to take more than one’s share than to suffer loss. No one, Musonius insisted, would be more just than she. Moreover, a philosophic woman would love her children more than her own life. She would not hesitate to fight to protect her children any more than a hen that fights with predators much larger than she is to protect her chicks.
He considered it appropriate for an educated woman to be more courageous than an uneducated woman and for a woman trained in philosophy to be more courageous than one untrained in philosophy. Musonius noted that the tribe of Amazons conquered many people with weapons, thus demonstrating that women are fully capable of courageously participating in armed conflict. He thought it appropriate for the philosophic woman not to submit to anything shameful out of fear of death or pain. Nor is it appropriate for her to bow down to anyone, whether well-born, powerful, wealthy, or even a tyrant. Musonius saw the philosophic woman as holding the same beliefs as the Stoic man: she thinks nobly, does not judge death to be an evil, nor life to be a good, nor shrinks from pain, nor pursues lack of pain above all else. Musonius thought it likely that this kind of woman would be self-motivated and persevering, would breast-feed her children, serve her husband with her own hands, and do without hesitation tasks which some regard as appropriate for slaves. Thus, he judged that a woman like this would be a great advantage for her husband, a source of honor for her kinfolk, and a good example for the women who know her.
Musonius believed that sons and daughters should receive the same education, since those who train horses and dogs train both the males and the females the same way. He rejected the view that there is one type of virtue for men and another for women. Women and men have the same virtues and so must receive the same education in philosophy, by his view.
When it comes to certain tasks, on the other hand, Musonius was less egalitarian. He believed that the nature of males is stronger and that of females is weaker, and so the most suitable tasks ought to be assigned to each nature accordingly. In general, men should be assigned the heavier tasks (e.g. gymnastics and being outdoors), women the lighter tasks (e.g. spinning yarn and being indoors). Sometimes, however, special circumstances—such as a health condition—would warrant men undertaking some of the lighter tasks which seem to be suited for women, and women in turn undertaking some of the harder ones which seem more suited for men. Thus, Musonius concludes that no chores have been exclusively reserved for either sex. Both boys and girls must receive the same education about what is good and what is bad, what is helpful and what is harmful. Shame towards everything base must be instilled in both sexes from infancy on. Musonius’ philosophy of education dictated that both males and females must be accustomed to endure toil, and neither to fear death nor to become dejected in the face of any misfortune.
Musonius’ opposition to luxurious living extended to his views about sex. He thought that men who live luxuriously desire a wide variety of sexual experiences, both legitimate and illegitimate, with both women and men. He remarked that sometimes licentious men pursue a series of male sex-partners. Sometimes they grow dissatisfied with available male sex-partners and choose to pursue those who are hard to get. Musonius condemned all such recreational sex acts. He insisted that only those sex acts aimed at procreation within marriage are right. He decried adultery as unlawful and illegitimate. He judged homosexual relationships as an outrage contrary to nature. He argued that anyone overcome by shameful pleasure is base in his lack of self-control, and so blamed the man (married or unmarried) who has sex with his own female slave as much as the woman (married or unmarried) who has sex with her male slave.
Musonius argued that there must be companionship and mutual care of husband and wife in marriage since its chief end is to live together and have children. Spouses should consider all things as common possessions and nothing as private, not even the body itself. But since procreation can result from sexual relations outside of marriage, childbirth cannot be the only motive for marriage. Musonius thought that when each spouse competes to surpass the other in giving complete care, the partnership is beautiful and admirable. But when a spouse considers only his or her own interests and neglects the other’s needs and concerns, their union is destroyed and their marriage cannot help but go poorly. Such a couple either splits up or their relationship becomes worse than solitude.
Musonius advised those planning to marry not to worry about finding partners from noble or wealthy families or those with beautiful bodies. Neither wealth, nor beauty, nor noble birth promotes a sense of partnership or harmony, nor do they facilitate procreation. He judged bodies that are healthy, normal in form, and able to function on their own, and souls that are naturally disposed towards self-control, justice, and virtue, as most fit for marriage.
Since he held that marriage is obviously in accordance with nature, Musonius rejected the objection that being married gets in the way of studying philosophy. He cited Pythagoras, Socrates, and Crates as examples of married men who were fine philosophers. To think that each should look only to his own affairs is to think that a human being is no different from a wolf or any other wild beast whose nature is to live by force and greed. Wild animals spare nothing they can devour, they have no companions, they never work together, and they have no share in anything just, according to Musonius. He supposed that human nature is very much like that of bees, who are unable to live alone and die when isolated. Bees work and act together. Wicked people are unjust and savage and have no concern for a neighbor in trouble. Virtuous people are good, just, and kind, and show love for their fellow human beings and concern for their neighbors. Marriage is the way for a person to create a family to provide the well-being of the city. Therefore, Musonius judged that anyone who deprives people of marriage destroys family, city, and the entire human race. He reasoned that this is because humans would cease to exist if there were no procreation, and there would be no just and lawful procreation without marriage. He concluded that marriage is important and serious because great gods (Hera, Eros, Aphrodite) govern it.
Musonius opined that the bigger a family, the better. He thought that having many children is beneficial and profitable for cities while having few or none is harmful. Consequently, he praised the wise lawgivers who forbade women from agreeing to be childless and from preventing conception, who enacted punishment for women who induced miscarriages, who punished married couples who were childless, and who honored married couples with many children. He reasoned that just as the man with many friends is mightier than the man without friends, the father with many children is much mightier than the man who has few or none. Musonius was very impressed by the spectacle of a husband or wife with their many children crowded around them. He believed that no procession for the gods and no sacred ritual is as beautiful to behold, or as worthy of being witnessed, as a chorus of many children leading their parents through the city. Musonius scolded those who offered poverty as an excuse for not raising many children. He was outraged by the well-off or affluent refusing to raise children who are born later so that the earlier-born may be better off. It was an unholy act, for Musonius, to deprive the earlier-born of siblings to increase their inheritance. He thought it much better to have many siblings than to have many possessions. Possessions invite plots from neighbors. Possessions need protection. Siblings, he taught, are one’s greatest protectors. Musonius opined that the man who enjoys the blessing of many loyal brothers is most worthy of emulation and most beloved by the gods.
When asked whether one’s parents should be obeyed in all matters, Musonius answered as follows. If a father, who was neither a doctor nor knowledgeable about health and sickness, ordered his sick son to take something he believed would help, but which would in fact be useless, or even harmful, and the sick son, knowing this, does not comply with his father’s order, would not be acting disobediently. Similarly, if the father was ill and asked for wine or inappropriate food that would worsen his illness if consumed, and the son, knowing better, refused to give them to his ill father, would not be acting disobediently. Even less disobedient, Musonius argued, is the son who refuses to steal or embezzle money entrusted to him when his greedy father commands it. The lesson is that refusing to do what one ought not to do merits praise, not blame. The disobedient person disobeys orders that are right, honorable, and beneficial, and acts shamefully in doing so. But to refuse to obey a shameful, blameworthy command of a parent is just and blameless. The obedient person obeys only his parent’s good, appropriate advice, and obeys all of such advice. The law of Zeus orders us to be good, and being good is the same thing as being a philosopher, Musonius taught.
The best thing to have on hand during old age, Musonius argued, is living in accord with nature, the definitive goal of life according to the Stoics. Human nature, he thought, can be better understood by comparing it to the nature of other animals. Horses, dogs, and cows are all inferior to human beings. We do not consider a horse to reach its potential by merely eating, drinking, mating without restraint, and doing none of the things suitable for a horse. Nor do we regard a dog as reaching its potential if it merely indulges in all sorts of pleasures while doing none of the things for which dogs are thought to be good. Nor would any other animal reach its potential by being glutted with pleasures but failing to function in a manner appropriate to its species. Hence, no animal comes into existence for pleasure. The nature of each animal determines the virtue characteristic of it. Nothing lives in accord with nature except what demonstrates its virtue through the actions which it performs in accord with its own nature. Therefore, Musonius concluded, the nature of human beings is to live for virtue; we did not come into existence for the sake of pleasure. Those who live for virtue deserve praise, can rightly think well of themselves, can be hopeful, courageous, cheerful, and joyful. The human being, Musonius taught, is the only creature on earth that is the image of the divine. Since we have the same virtues as the gods, he reasoned, we cannot imagine better virtues than intelligence, justice, courage, and self-control. Therefore, a god, since he has these virtues, is stronger than pleasure, greed, desire, envy, and jealousy. A god is magnanimous and both a benefactor to, and a lover of, human beings. Consequently, Musonius reasoned, inasmuch as a human being is a copy of a god, a human being must be considered to be like a god when he acts in accord with nature. The life of a good man is the best life, and death is its end. Wealth is no defense against old age, Musonius thought, because wealth lets people enjoy food, drink, sex, and other pleasures, but never supplies contentment to a wealthy person nor banishes his grief. Therefore, the good man lives without regret, and according to nature by accepting death fearlessly and boldly in his old age, living happily and honorably till the end.
After his death Musonius was admired by philosophers and theologians alike. His greatest student was Epictetus, who mentions him several times in The Discourses of Epictetus written by Arrian, Epictetus’ student. Epictetus’ philosophy was deeply influenced by Musonius.
William O. Stephens
U. S. A.
Last updated: April 17, 2013 | Originally published: