Often referred to as “the second Buddha” by Tibetan and East Asian Mahayana (Great Vehicle) traditions of Buddhism, Nagarjuna offered sharp criticisms of Brahminical and Buddhist substantialist philosophy, theory of knowledge, and approaches to practice. Nagarjuna’s philosophy represents something of a watershed not only in the history of Indian philosophy but in the history of philosophy as a whole, as it calls into questions certain philosophical assumptions so easily resorted to in our attempt to understand the world. Among these assumptions are the existence of stable substances, the linear and one-directional movement of causation, the atomic individuality of persons, the belief in a fixed identity or selfhood, and the strict separations between good and bad conduct and the blessed and fettered life. All such assumptions are called into fundamental question by Nagarjuna’s unique perspective which is grounded in the insight of emptiness (sunyata), a concept which does not mean “non-existence” or “nihility” (abhava), but rather the lack of autonomous existence (nihsvabhava). Denial of autonomy according to Nagarjuna does not leave us with a sense of metaphysical or existential privation, a loss of some hoped-for independence and freedom, but instead offers us a sense of liberation through demonstrating the interconnectedness of all things, including human beings and the manner in which human life unfolds in the natural and social worlds. Nagarjuna’s central concept of the “emptiness (sunyata) of all things (dharmas),” which pointed to the incessantly changing and so never fixed nature of all phenomena, served as much as the terminological prop of subsequent Buddhist philosophical thinking as the vexation of opposed Vedic systems. The concept had fundamental implications for Indian philosophical models of causation, substance ontology, epistemology, conceptualizations of language, ethics and theories of world-liberating salvation, and proved seminal even for Buddhist philosophies in India, Tibet, China and Japan very different from Nagarjuna’s own. Indeed it would not be an overstatement to say that Nagarjuna’s innovative concept of emptiness, though it was hermeneutically appropriated in many different ways by subsequent philosophers in both South and East Asia, was to profoundly influence the character of Buddhist thought.
Precious little is known about the actual life of the historical Nagarjuna. The two most extensive biographies of Nagarjuna, one in Chinese and the other in Tibetan, were written many centuries after his life and incorporate much lively but historically unreliable material which sometimes reaches mythic proportions. However, from the sketches of historical detail and the legend meant to be pedagogical in nature, combined with the texts reasonably attributed to him, some sense may be gained of his place in the Indian Buddhist and philosophical traditions.
Nagarjuna was born a “Hindu,” which in his time connoted religious allegiance to the Vedas, probably into an upper-caste Brahmin family and probably in the southern Andhra region of India. The dates of his life are just as amorphous, but two texts which may well have been authored by him offer some help. These are in the form of epistles and were addressed to the historical king of the northern Satvahana dynasty Gautamiputra Satakarni (ruled c. 166-196 CE), whose steadfast Brahminical patronage, constant battles against powerful northern Shaka Satrap rulers and whose ambitious but ultimately unsuccessful attempts at expansion seem to indicate that he could not manage to follow Nagarjuna’s advice to adopt Buddhist pacifism and maintain a peaceful realm. At any rate, the imperial correspondence would place the significant years of Nagarjuna’s life sometime between 150 and 200 CE. Tibetan sources then may well be basically accurate in portraying Nagarjuna’s emigration from Andhra to study Buddhism at Nalanda in present-day Bihar, the future site of the greatest Buddhist monastery of scholastic learning in that tradition’s proud history in India. This emigration to the north perhaps followed the path of the Shaka kings themselves. In the vibrant intellectual life of a not very tranquil north India then, Nagarjuna came into his own as a philosopher.
The occasion for Nagarjuna’s “conversion” to Buddhism is uncertain. According to the Tibetan account, it had been predicted that Nagarjuna would die at an early age, so his parents decided to head off this terrible fate by entering him in the Buddhist order, after which his health promptly improved. He then moved to the north and began his tutelage. The other, more colorful Chinese legend, portrays a devilish young adolescent using magical yogic powers to sneak, with a few friends, into the king’s harem and seduce his mistresses. Nagarjuna was able to escape when they were detected, but his friends were all apprehended and executed, and, realizing what a precarious business the pursuit of desires was, Nagarjuna renounced the world and sought enlightenment. After having been converted, Nagarjuna’s adroitness at magic and meditation earned him an invitation to the bottom of the ocean, the home of the serpent kingdom. While there, the prodigy initiate “discovered” the “wisdom literature” of the Buddhist tradition, known as the Prajnaparamita Sutras, and on the credit of his great merit, returned them to the world, and thereafter was known by the name Nagarjuna, the “noble serpent.”
Despite the tradition’s insistence that immersion into the scriptural texts of the competing movements of classical Theravada and emerging “Great Vehicle” (Mahayana) Buddhism was what spurred Nagarjuna’s writings, there is rare extended reference to the early and voluminous classical Buddhist sutras and to the Mahayana texts which were then being composed in Nagarjuna’s own language of choice, Sanskrit. It is much more likely that Nagarjuna thrived on the exciting new scholastic philosophical debates that were spreading throughout north India among and between Brahminical and Buddhist thinkers. Buddhism by this time had perhaps the oldest competing systematic worldview on the scene, but by then Vedic schools such as Samkhya, which divided the cosmos into spiritual and material entities, Yoga, the discipline of meditation, and Vaisesika, or atomism were probably well-established. But new and exciting things were happening in the debate halls. A new Vedic school of Logic (Nyaya) was making its literary debut, positing an elaborate realism which categorized the types of basic knowable things in the world, formulated a theory of knowledge which was to serve as the basis for all claims to truth, and drew out a full-blown theory of correct and fallacious logical argumentation. Alongside it, within the Buddhist camp, sects of metaphysicians emerged with their own doctrines of atomism and fundamental categories of substance. Nagarjuna was to undertake a forceful engagement of both these new Brahminical and Buddhist movements, an intellectual endeavor till then unheard of.
Nagarjuna saw in the concept sunya, a concept which connoted in the early Pali Buddhist literature the lack of a stable, inherent existence in persons, but which since the third century BCE had also denoted the newly formulated number “zero,” the interpretive key to the heart of Buddhist teaching, and the undoing of all the metaphysical schools of philosophy which were at the time flourishing around him. Indeed, Nagarjuna’s philosophy can be seen as an attempt to deconstruct all systems of thought which analyzed the world in terms of fixed substances and essences. Things in fact lack essence, according to Nagarjuna, they have no fixed nature, and indeed it is only because of this lack of essential, immutable being that change is possible, that one thing can transform into another. Each thing can only have its existence through its lack (sunyata) of inherent, eternal essence. With this new concept of “emptiness,” “voidness,” “lack” of essence, “zeroness,” this somewhat unlikely prodigy was to help mold the vocabulary and character of Buddhist thought forever.
Armed with the notion of the “emptiness” of all things, Nagarjuna built his literary corpus. While argument still persists over which of the texts bearing his name can be reliably attributed to Nagarjuna, a general agreement seems to have been reached in the scholarly literature. Since it is not known in what chronological order his writings were produced, the best that can be done is to arrange them thematically according to works on Buddhist topics, Brahminical topics and finally ethics Addressing the schools of what he considered metaphysically wayward Buddhism, Nagarjuna wrote Fundamental Verses on the Middle Way (Mulamadhyamakakarika), and then, in order to further refine his newly coined and revolutionary concept, the Seventy Verses on Emptiness (Sunyatasaptati), followed by a treatise on Buddhist philosophical method, the Sixty Verses on Reasoning (Yuktisastika).. Included in the works addressed to Buddhists may have been a further treatise on the shared empirical world and its establishment through social custom, called Proof of Convention (Vyavaharasiddhi), though save for a few cited verses, this is lost to us, as well as an instructional book on practice, cited by one Indian and a number of Chinese commentators, the Preparation for Enlightenment (Bodhisambaraka). Finally is a didactic work on the causal theory of Buddhism, the Constituents of Dependent Arising (Pratityasumutpadahrdaya). Next came a series of works on philosophical method, which for the most part were reactionary critiques of Brahminical substantialist and epistemological categories, The End of Disputes (Vigrahavyavartani) and the not-too-subtly titled Pulverizing the Categories (Vaidalyaprakarana). Finally are a pair of religious and ethical treatises addressed to the king Gautamiputra, entitled To a Good Friend (Suhrlekha) and Precious Garland (Ratnavali). Nagarjuna then was a fairly active author, addressing the most pressing philosophical issues in the Buddhism and Brahmanism of his time, and more than that, carrying his Buddhist ideas into the fields of social, ethical and political philosophy.
It is again not known precisely how long Nagarjuna lived. But the legendary story of his death once again is a tribute to his status in the Buddhist tradition. Tibetan biographies tell us that, when Gautamiputra’s successor was about to ascend to the throne, he was anxious to find a replacement as a spiritual advisor to better suit his Brahmanical preferences, and unsure of how to delicately or diplomatically deal with Nagarjuna, he forthrightly requested the sage to accommodate and show compassion for his predicament by committing suicide. Nagarjuna assented, and was decapitated with a blade of holy grass which he himself had some time previously accidentally uprooted while looking for materials for his meditation cushion. The indomitable logician could only be brought down by his own will and his own weapon. Whether true or not, this master of skeptical method would well have appreciated the irony.
At the heart of what is called skepticism is doubt, a suspension of judgment about some states of affairs or the correctness of some assertion. There are of course many things, both in the world and in the claims people make about the world, which can be doubted, questioned, rejected, or left in skeptical abeyance. But in addition to the many different things which can be doubted, there are also different ways of doubting. Doubt can be haphazard, as when a person sees another person at night and is unsure of whether that other person is his friend; it can be principled, as when a scientist refuses to take into account non-material or divine causes in a physical process she is investigating; it can be systematic, as when a philosopher doubts conventional explanations of the world, only in search of a more fundamental, all-inclusive explanation of experience, a la Socrates, Descartes or Husserl (Nagarjuna was for the most part a skeptic of this sort). It can also be all-inclusive and self-reflective, an attitude demonstrated by the Greek philosopher Pyrrho, who doubted all claims including his own claim to doubt all claims. Consequently, there are as many different kinds of skeptics as there can be found different kinds or ways of doubting. Nagarjuna was considered a skeptic in his own philosophical tradition, both by Brahmanical opponents and Buddhist readers, and this because he called into question the basic categorical presuppositions and criteria of proof assumed by almost everyone in the Indian tradition to be axiomatic. HiBut despite this skepticism, Nagarjuna did believe that doubt should not be haphazard, it requires a method. This idea that doubt should be methodical, an idea born in early Buddhism, was a revolutionary innovation for philosophy in India. Nagarjuna carries the novelty of this idea even further by suggesting that the method of doubt of choice should not even be one’s own, but rather ought to be temporarily borrowed from the very person with whom one is arguing! But in the end, Nagarjuna was convinced that such disciplined, methodical skepticism led somewhere, led namely to the ultimate wisdom which was at the core of the teachings of the Buddha.
The standard philosophical interpretation of doubt in Indian thought was explained in the Vedic school of logic (Nyaya). Gautama Aksapada, the author of the fundamental text of the Brahminical Logicians, was probably a contemporary of Nagarjuna. He formulated what by then must have been a traditional distinction between two kinds of doubt. The first kind is the haphazard doubt about an object all people experience in their everyday lives, when something is encountered in one’s environment and for various reasons mistaken for something else because of uncertainty of what precisely the object is. The stock examples used in Indian texts are seeing a rope and mistaking it as a snake, or seeing conch in the sand and mistaking it as silver. The doubt that can arise as a result of realizing one is mistaken or unsure about a particular object can be corrected by a subsequent cognition, getting a closer look at the rope for instance, or having a companion tell you the object in the sand is conch and not silver. The correcting cognition removes doubt by offering some sort of conclusive evidence about what the object in question happens to be. The other kind of doubt is roughly categorical doubt, exemplified specifically by a philosopher who may wonder about or doubt various categories of being, such as God’s existence, the types of existing physical substance or the nature of time. In order to resolve this latter kind of philosophical doubt, the preferred method of the Logicians was a formal debate. Debates provided a space wherein judges presided, established rules for argument and counter-argument, recognized logical fallacies and correct forms of inference and two interlocutors seeking truth all played their roles in the establishment of the correct position. The point is that, according to traditional Brahminical thinking, certain and correct objective knowledge of the world was possible; one could in principle know whatever one sought to know, from what that object lying in darkness is to the types of causation that operated in the world to God’s existence and will for human beings. Skepticism, though a natural attitude and a fundamental aid to human beings in both their everyday and reflective lives, can be overcome provided one arms oneself with the methods of proof supplied by common-sense logic. For Nyaya, while anything and everything can be doubted, any and every doubt can be resolved. The Brahminical Logician, the Naiyayika, is a cagey and realistic but staunch philosophical optimist.
The early Buddhists were not nearly so sure about the possibility of ultimate knowledge of the world. Indeed, the founder of the tradition, Siddhartha Gautama Sakyamuni (the “Buddha” or “awakened one”), famously refused to answer questions about such airy metaphysical ponderings like “Does the world have a beginning or not?”, “Does God exist?” and “Does the soul perish after death or not?” Convinced that human knowledge was best suited and most usefully devoted to the diagnosis and cure of human beings’ own self-destructive psychological obsessions and attachments, the Buddha compared a person convinced he could find the answers to such ultimate questions to a mortally wounded soldier on a battlefield who, dying from arrow-delivered poison, demanded to know everything about his shooter before being taken to a doctor. Ultimate knowledge cannot be attained, at least cannot be attained before the follies and frailties of human life bring one to despair. Unless human beings attain self-reflective, meditative enlightenment, ignorance will always have the upper hand over knowledge in their lives, and this is the predicament they must solve in order to alleviate their poorly understood suffering. The early traditional texts show how the Buddha developed a method for refusing to answer such questions in pursuit of ultimate, metaphysical knowledge, a method which came to be dubbed the “four error” denial (catuskoti). When asked, for example, whether the world has a beginning or not, a Buddhist should respond by denying all the logically alternative answers to the query; “No, the world does not have a beginning, it does not fail to have a beginning, it does not have and not have a beginning, nor does it neither have nor not have a beginning.” This denial is not seen to be logically defective in the sense that it violates the law of excluded middle (A cannot have both B and not-B), because this denial is more a principled refusal to answer than a counter-thesis, it is more a decision than a proposition. That is to say that one cannot object to this “four error” denial by simply saying “the world either has a beginning or it does not” because the Buddha is recommending to his followers that they should take no position on the matter (this is in modern propositional logic known as illocution). This denial was recommended because wondering about such questions was seen by the Buddha as a waste of valuable time, time that should be spent on the much more important and doable task of psychological self-mastery. The early Buddhists, unlike their Brahminical philosophical counterparts, were skeptics. But in their own view, their skepticism did not make the Buddhists pessimists, but on the contrary, optimists, for even though the human mind could not answer ultimate questions, it could diagnose and cure its own must basic maladies, and that surely was enough.
But in the intervening four to six centuries between the lives of Siddartha Gautama and Nagarjuna, Buddhists, feeling a need to explain their worldview in an ever burgeoning north Indian philosophical environment, traded in their skepticism for theory. Basic Buddhist doctrinal commitments, such as the teaching of the impermanence of all things, the Buddhist rejection of a persistent personal identity and the refusal to admit natural universals such as “treeness,” “redness” and the like, were challenged by Brahminical philosophers. How, Vedic opponents would ask, does one defend the idea that causation governs the phenomenal world while simultaneously holding that there is no measurable temporal transition from cause to effect, as the Buddhists appeared to hold? How, if the Buddhists are right in supposing that no enduring ego persists through our experienced lives, do all of my experiences and cognitions seem to be owned by me as a unitary subject? Why, if all things can be reduced to the Buddhist universe of an ever-changing flux of atoms, do stable, whole objects seem to surround me in my lived environment? Faced with these challenges, the monk-scholars enthusiastically entered into the debates in order to make the Buddhist worldview explicable. A number of prominent schools of Buddhist thought developed as a result of these exchanges, the two most notable of which were the Sarvastivada (“Universal Existence”) and Sautrantika (“True Doctrine”). In various fashions, they posited theories which depicted causal efficacy as either present in all dimensions of time or instantaneous, of personal identity being the psychological product of complex and interrelated mental states, and perhaps most importantly, of the apparently stable objects of our lived experience as being mere compounds of elementary, irreducible substances with their “own nature” (svabhava). Through the needs these schools sought to fulfill, Buddhism entered the world of philosophy, debate, thesis and verification, world-representation. The Buddhist monks became not only theoreticians, but some of the most sophisticated theoreticians in the Indian intellectual world.
Debate has raged for centuries about how to place Nagarjuna in this philosophical context. Ought he to be seen as a conservative, traditional Buddhist, defending the Buddha’s own council to avoid theory? Should he be understood as a “Great Vehicle” Buddhist, settling disputes which did not exist in traditional Buddhism at all but only comprehensible to a Mahayanist? Might he even be a radical skeptic, as his first Brahminical readers appeared to take him, who despite his own flaunting of philosophy espoused positions only a philosopher could appreciate? Nagarjuna appears to have understood himself to be a reformer, primarily a Buddhist reformer to be sure, but one suspicious that his own beloved religious tradition had been enticed, against its founder’s own advice, into the games of metaphysics and epistemology by old yet still seductive Brahminical intellectual habits. Theory was not, as the Brahmins thought, the condition of practice, and neither was it, as the Buddhists were beginning to believe, the justification of practice. Theory, in Nagarjuna’s view, was the enemy of all forms of legitimate practice, social, ethical and religious. Theory must be undone through the demonstration that its Buddhist metaphysical conclusions and the Brahminical reasoning processes which lead to them are counterfeit, of no real value to genuinely human pursuits. But in order to demonstrate such a commitment, doubt had to be methodical, just as the philosophy it was meant to undermine was methodical.
The method Nagarjuna suggested for carrying out the undoing of theory was, curiously, not a method of his own invention. He held it more pragmatic to borrow philosophical methods of reasoning, particularly those designed to expose faulty argument, to refute the claims and assumptions of his philosophical adversaries. This was the strategy of choice because, if one provisionally accepts the concepts and verification rules of the opponent, the refutation of the opponent’s position will be all the more convincing to the opponent than if one simply rejects the opponent’s system out of hand. This provisional, temporary acceptance of the opponent’s categories and methods of proof is demonstrated in how Nagarjuna employs different argumentative styles and approaches depending on whether he is writing against the Brahmins or Buddhists. However, he slightly and subtly adapts each of their respective systems to suit his own argumentative purposes.
For the Brahminical metaphysicians and epistemologists, Nagarjuna accepts the forms of logical fallacies outlined by the Logicians and assents to enter into their own debate format. But he picks a variation on a debate format which, while acknowledged as a viable form of discourse, was not most to the Nyaya liking. The standard Nyaya debate, styled vada or “truth” debate, pits two interlocutors against one another who bring to the debate opposing theses (pratijna or paksa) on a given topic, for instance a Nyaya propoenet defending the thesis that authoritative verbal testimony is an acceptable form of proof and a Buddhist proponent arguing that such testimony is not a self-standing verification but can be reduced to a kind of inference. Each of these opposed positions will then serve as the hypothesis of a logical argument to be proven or disproven, and the person who refutes the adversary’s argument and establishes his own will win the debate. However, there was a variety of this kind of standard format called by the Logicians the vitanda or “destructive” debate. In vitanda, the proponent of a thesis attempts to establish it against an opponent who merely strives to refute the proponent’s view, without establishing or even implying his own. If the opponent of the proffered thesis cannot refute it, he will lose; but he will also lose if in refuting the opponent’s thesis, he is found to be asserting or implying a counter-thesis. Now, while the Brahminical Naiyayikas considered this format good logical practice as it were for the student, they did not consider vitanda to be the ideal form of philosophical discourse, for while it could possibly expose false theses as false, it could not, indeed was not designed to, establish truth, and what good is reason or philosophical analysis if they do not or cannot pursue and attain truth?
For his own part, Nagarjuna would only assent to enter a philosophical debate as a vaitandika, committed to destroying the Brahminical proponents’ metaphysical and epistemological positions without thereby necessitating a contrapositive. In order to accomplish this, Nagarjuna armed himself with the full battery of accepted rejoinders to fallacious arguments the Logicians had long since authorized, such as infinite regress (anavastha), circularity (karanasya asiddhi) and vacuous principle (vihiyate vadah) to assail the metaphysical and epistemological positions he found problematic. It should be noted that later, very popular and influential schools of Indian Buddhist thought, namely the schools of Cognition (Vijnanavada) and Buddhist Logic (Yogacara-Sautranta) rejected this purely skeptical stance of Nagarjuna and went on to establish their own positive doctrines of consciousness and knowledge, and it was only with later, more synthetic schools of Buddhism in Tibet and East Asia where Nagarjuna’s anti-metaphysical and anti-cognitivist approaches gained sympathy. There was no doubt however that among his Vedic opponents and later Madhyamika commentators, Nagarjuna’s “refutation-only” strategy was highly provocative and sparked continued controversy. But, in his own estimation, only by employing Brahminical method against Brahminical practice could one show up Vedic society and religion for what he believed they were, authoritarian legitimations of caste society which used the myths of God, divine revelation and the soul as rationalizations, and not the justified reasons which they were purported to be.
Against Buddhist substantialism, Nagarjuna revived the Buddha’s own “four error” (catuskoti) denial, but gave to it a more definitively logical edge than the earlier practical employment of Suddhartha Gautama. Up to this point in the Indian Buddhist tradition, there had been two skeptics of note, one of them the Buddha himself and the other a third century sage named Moggaliputta-tissa, who had won several pivotal debates against a number of traditional sectarian groups at the request of the Mauryan emperor Asoka and had as a result written the first great debate manual of the tradition. While the Buddha had provided the “four error” method to discourage the advocacy of traditional metaphysical and religious positions, Moggaliputta-tissa constructed a discussion format which examined various doctrinal disputes in early Buddhism, which, in his finding, represented positions which were equally logically invalid, and therefore should not be asserted (no ca vattabhe). Perhaps inspired by this logically sharpened skeptical approach, Nagarjuna refined the “four errors” method from the strictly illocutionary and pragmatic tool it had been in early Buddhism into a logic machine that dissolved Buddhist metaphysical positions which had been growing in influence. The major schools of Buddhism had accepted by Nagarjuna’s time that things in the world must be constituted by metaphysically fundamental elements which had their own fixed essence (svabhava), for otherwise there would be no way to account for persons, natural phenomena, or the causal and karmic process which determined both. Without assuming, for instance, that people had fundamentally fixed natures, one could not say that any particular individual was undergoing suffering, and neither could one say that any particular monk who had perfected his discipline and wisdom underwent enlightenment and release from rebirth in nirvana. Without some notion of essence that is, thought Nagarjuna’s contemporaries, Buddhist claims could not make sense, and Buddhist practice could do no good, could effect no real change of the human character.
Nagarjuna’s response was to “catch” this metaphysical position of Buddhist practice in the coils of the “four errors,” demonstrating that the change Buddhism was after was only really possible if people did not have fixed essences. For if one really examines change, one finds that, according to the catuskoti, change cannot produce itself, nor can it be introduced by an extrinsic influence, nor can it result from both itself and an extrinsic influence, nor from no influence at all. All the logical alternatives of a given position are tested and flunked by the “four error” method. There are basic logical reasons why all these positions fail. It would first of all be incoherent (no papadyate) to assume that anything with a fixed nature or essence (svabhava) could change, for that change would violate its fixed nature and so destroy the original premise. In addition, we do not experience anything empirically which does not change, and so never know of (na vidyate) fixed essences in the world about us. Once again, the proponent’s method has been taken up in an ingenious way to undermine his conclusions. The rules of the philosophical game have been observed, but not in this case for earning victory, but for the purpose of showing all the players that the game had all along had been just that, merely a game which had no tenable real-life consequences.
And so, Nagarjuna has rightly merited the label of skeptic, for he undertakes the dismantling of theoretical positions wherever he finds them, and does so in a methodically logical manner. Like the skeptics of the classical Greek tradition, who thought that resolved doubt about dogmatic assertions in both philosophy and social life could lead the individual to peace of mind, however, it is not the case that for Nagarjuna skepticism leads nowhere. On the contrary, it is the very key to insight. For in the process of dismantling all metaphysical and epistemological positions, one is led to the only viable conclusion for Nagarjuna, namely that all things, concepts and persons lack a fixed essence, and this lack of a fixed essence is precisely why and how they can be amenable to change, transformation and evolution. Change is precisely why people live, die, are reborn, suffer and can be enlightened and liberated. And change is only possible if entities and the way in which we conceptualize them are void or empty (sunya) of any eternal, fixed and immutable essence. Indeed, Nagarjuna even on occasion refers to his special use of the “four error” approach as the “refuting and explaining with the method of emptying” (vigraheca vyakhyane krte sunyataya vadet) concepts and things of essence. And like all properly Buddhist methods, once this logical foil has served its purpose, it can be discarded, traded in as it were for the wisdom it has conferred. Pretense of knowledge leads to ruin, while genuine skepsis can lead human being to ultimate knowledge. Only the method of skepticism has to conform to the rules of conventional knowing, for as Nagarjuna famously asserts: “Without depending on convention, the ultimate truth cannot be taught, and if the ultimate truth is not attained, nirvana will not be attained.”
By Nagarjuna’s lifetime, scholastic Buddhism had become much more than merely an institution which charged itself with the handing on of received scripture, tradition and council-established orthodoxy; it had grown into a highly variegated, inwardly and outwardly engaged set of philosophical positions. These schools took it upon themselves not merely to represent Buddhist teaching or make the benefits of its practice available, but also to explain Buddhism, to make it not only a reasonable philosophical discourse, but the most supremely reasonable of them all. The ultimate goal of life, liberation from rebirth, though in general shared by all soteriologies in Brahmanism, Jainism and Buddhism, was represented uniquely by Buddhists as the pacification of all psychological attachments through the extinguishing (nirvana) of desires, which would lead to a consequent extinguishing of karma and the prevention of rebirth. One particularly unique doctrine of Buddhism in its attempt to thematize these issues was the theory of no-self or no-soul (anatman) and what implications it carried. In the empirical sense, the idea of no-self meant that not only persons, but also what are normally considered the stable substances of nature are not in fact fixed and continuous, that everything from one’s sense of personal identity to the forms of objects could be analyzed away, as it were, into the atomic parts which were their bases. In the ultimate metaphysical sense, it meant that no one, upon release from rebirth, will live eternally as a spiritual, self-conscious entity (atman), but that the series of births caused by inherited karma will simply terminate, reducing, as its cash-value, the total amount of suffering in the world. These theories prompted sharp and deep questions and criticisms, such as, “if the things and persons of the world are nothing more than atoms in constant flux, how can a person have an orderly experience of a world of apparent substances?”, “if there is no enduring identity or self, who is it that practices Buddhism and is liberated?”, and “how should we account for the differences between enlightened beings like the Buddha and unenlightened ones, like ourselves?” Answering such questions intelligibly for the inquiring minds of the philosophical community were a number of distinct schools which came collectively to be known as schools involved with the “analysis of elements” (abhidharma). Nagarjuna received his philosophical training in the texts, vocabulary and debates of the Abhidharmikas.
The two most prevalent schools of Abhidharma were the school of “Universal Existence” (Sarvastivada) and the “True Doctrine” school (Sautrantika). These schools held in common a theory of substantialism which served as an explanation to both worldly and ultimate metaphysical questions. This theory of substantialism, formulated in slightly different ways by each school, had two fundamental linchpins. The first was a theory of causality, or the strict necessity of one event following from another event. The theory of causal necessity was essential for all Buddhist thought, for Gautama Siddhartha himself had firmly asserted that all suffering or psychological pain had a distinct cause, namely attachment or desire (tanha), and the key to removing suffering from one’s life and attaining the “tranquility of mind” or contentment (upeksa) of nirvana was to cut out its causal condition. Suffering was brought about by a definite cause, but that cause is contingent upon the human behaviors and practices of any given individual, and if attachment could be exorcized from these behaviors and practices, then the individual could live a life which would no longer experience impermanence and loss as painful, but accept the world for what it in fact is. Buddhist theory and practice had always been based on the notion that, not just psychological attachment, but all phenomena are causally interdependent, that all things and events which come to pass in the world arise out of a causal chain (pratityasamutpada). Buddhism is inconceivable without this causal theory, for it opens the door to the diagnosis and removal of suffering. For the Universal Existence and True Doctrine schools however, the second linchpin was a theory of fundamental elements, a theory which had to follow from any coherent causal theory. Causes, their philosophical exponents figured, are not merely arbitrary, but are regular and predictable, and their regularity must be due to the fact the things or phenomena have fixed natures of their own (svabhava), which determine and limit the kinds of causal powers they can and cannot exert on other things. Water, for example, can quench thirst and fire can burn other things, but water cannot cause a fire, just as fire cannot quench thirst. The pattern and limits of particular causal powers and their effects are therefore rooted in what kind of a thing a thing happens to be; its nature defines what it can and can’t do to other things. Now in their theoretical models, causal efficacy was contained not in any whole, unified object, but rather in the parts, qualities and atomic elements of which any object happened to be constituted, so in their formulation, it was not fire which burnt but the heat produced by its fire molecules, and it was not water which quenched thirst but the correspondence of its molecules to the receptivity of molecules in the body. Indeed, fire in these systems was only fire because of its molecular qualities, and the same with water. But these qualities, molecules and elements had fixed natures, and thus could emit or receive certain causal powers and not others.
The basic difference between the Universal Existence and True Doctrine schools in their advocacy of both Buddhist causal and fundamental elements theories were their respective descriptions of how such causes operated. For the Universal Existence school, the effect of a cause was already inherent in the nature of the cause (satkaryavada). My thirst is quenched not by any fundamental change in my condition, but because the water that I drank had the power to quench my thirst, and this power does not rest in me, but in what I am trying to drink; this is why fire cannot quench thirst. Change here is only an apparent transformation already potential in the actors who are interrelating. For the True Doctrine school, on the other hand, any effect by definition must be a change in the condition of the receptor of the causal power, and as such, causal potential only becomes actual where it can effect a real change in something else (asatkaryavada). Again, using water as an illustration, the properties of water effect a change in the properties of my body, transforming my condition from a condition of thirst to one of having my thirst quenched. Change is change of what is effected, otherwise it would be silly to speak of change.
This seemingly abstract or inconsequential difference turns out in these two opposed systems however to be quite relevant, for the substantialist ideas of fixed nature and essence provide the basis not only for conceptualizing the material, empirical world, but also for conceiving the knowledge and attainment of ultimate reality. For just as only metaphysical analysis could distinguish between phenomena and their ultimate causal constituents, such analysis was also the only reliable guide for purifying experience of attachments. Those causes which lead to enmeshment in the worldly cycle of rebirth (samsara) cannot be the same as those which lead to peace (nirvana). These states of existence are just as different as fire and water, samsara will quench thirst just as little as nirvana will lead to the fires of passion. And so, it is the Buddha’s words, for those who advocated the theory of the effect as pre-existent in the cause, which had the potential to purify consciousness, as opposed to the words of any unorthodox teacher; it was the practices of Buddhists, for those who championed the notion of external causal efficacy, which could liberate one from rebirth, and not the practices of those who perpetuated the ambitions of the everyday, workaday world. These schools were, each in their uniquely Buddhist turns, true exemplars of the age-old assumptions of the karma worldview in which a person is what he or she does, and what one does proceeds from what type of fundamental makeup one has inherited from previous lives of deeds, a worldview that is which intimately marries essence, existence and ethics. To be a Buddhist means precisely to distinguish between Buddhist and non-Buddhist acts, between ignorance and enlightenment, between the suffering world of samsara and the purified attainment of nirvana.
In his revolutionary tract of The Fundamental Verses on the Middle Way, Nagarjuna abjectly throws this elementary distinction between samsara and nirvana out the door, and does so in the very name of the Buddha. “There is not the slightest distinction,” he declares in the work, “between samsara and nirvana. The limit of the one is the limit of the other.” Now how can such a thing be posited, that is, the identity of samsara and nirvana, without totally undermining the theoretical basis and practical goals of Buddhism as such? For if there is no difference between the world of suffering and the attainment of peace, then what sort of work is a Buddhist to do as one who seeks to end suffering? Nagarjuna counters by reminding the Buddhist philosophers that, just as Gautama Sakyamuni had rejected both metaphysical and empirical substantialism through the teaching of “no-soul” (anatman) and causal interdependence (pratityasamputpada), so Scholastic Buddhism had to remain faithful to this non-substantialist stance through a rejection of the causal theories which necessitated notions of fixed nature (svabhava), theories which metaphysically reified the difference between samsara and nirvana. This later rejection could be based on Nagarjuna’s newly coined notion of the “emptiness,” “zeroness” or “voidness” (sunyata) of all things.
Recapitulating a logical analysis of the causal theories of the Universal Existence and True Doctrine schools, Nagarjuna rejects the premises of their theories. The basic claim these schools shared was that causal efficacy could only be accounted for through the fundamental nature of an object; fire caused the burning of objects because fire was made of fire elements and not water elements, the regularity and predictability of its causal powers consistent with its essential material basis. Reviving and logically sharpening the early Buddhist “four errors” (catuskoti) method, Nagarjuna attempts to dismantle this trenchant philosophical assumption. Contrary to the Scholastic Buddhist views, Nagarjuna finds that, were objects to have a stable, fixed essence, the changes brought about by causes would not be logically intelligible or materially possible. Let us say, along with the school of Universal Existence, that the effect pre-exists in the cause, or for example, that the burning of fire and the thirst-quenching of water are inherent in the kinds of substances fire and water are. But if the effects already exist in the cause, then it would be nonsensical to speak of effects in the first place, because in their interaction with other phenomena the pre-existent causes would not produce anything new, they would merely be manifesting the potential powers already exhibited. That is, if the potential to burn is conceived to exist within fire and the potential to quench thirst already inhered in water, then, Nagarjuna thinks, burning and thirst-quenching would be but appearances of the causal powers of fire and water substances, and this would make the notion of an effect, the production of a novel change, meaningless. If, on the other hand, we side with the True Doctrine school in supposing that the effect does not pre-exist in the cause, but is a novel change in the world, then the category of substance breaks down. Why? Because if fire and water are stable substances which possess fixed natures or essences, then what sort of relation could they bear to other objects which have entirely different fixed natures? How could fire be thought to effect a human being when the latter possesses a nature and thus takes on a form that is entirely dissimilar to fire? For the person to be effected by fire, his nature would have to change, would have to be destructible, and this vitiates the supposition that the person’s nature is fixed. Stable, fixed essences (svabhava) which are conceived to be entirely heterogeneous could have no way of relating without their initially supposed fixed essences being compromised. The conclusion is that neither of these two proffered substantialist Buddhist explanations of causal efficacy can survive logical examination.
We may be tempted, faced with these failures, to adopt alternative theories of causality advocated outside the Buddhist tradition in order to save the intelligibility of substance. We may suppose, along with Jaina philosophers, the effects somehow proceed both from inherent powers of substances as well as the vulnerabilities of objects with which these substances interact. This obviously will not do for Nagarjuna the logician, for it would be tantamount to suggesting that things and events arise or come about due both to their own causal powers and as effected by other things, that event A, such as burning or thirst-quenching is caused both by itself and by other things. This violates the law of excluded middle outright, since a thing cannot be characterized by both A and not-A, and so will not serve as an explanation. Exhausted by the search for a viable substantialist principle of causality, we may wish to opt for the completely anti-metaphysical stance of the Indian Materialist school, which denies both that events are brought about through the inherent causal powers of their relata and are caused by extraneous powers. This thorough denial would have us believe that no cause-and-effect relationship exists between phenomena, and Buddhists may not resort to this conclusion because it militates against the basic teachings of the Buddha that all empirical phenomena arise out of interdependence. This was the teaching of the Buddha himself, and so no Buddhist can allow that events are not caused.
What are we to draw from all this abstract logical critique? Are we to infer that Nagarjuna’s philosophy boils down to some strange paradoxical mysticism in which there is some ambiguous sense in which things should be considered causally interdependent but interdependent in some utterly unexplainable and inscrutable way? Not at all! Nagarjuna has not refuted all available theories of cause and effect, he has only rejected all substantialist theories of cause and effect. He thinks he has shown that, if we maintain the philosophical assumption that things in the world derive from some unique material and essential basis, then we shall come away empty-handed in a search to explain how things could possibly relate to one another, and so would have no way of describing how changes happen. But since both our eminently common sense and the words of the Buddha affirm unremittingly that changes do indeed happen, and happen constantly, we must assume that they happen somehow, through some other fact or circumstance of existence. For his own part, Nagarjuna concludes that, since things do not arise because phenomena relate through fixed essences, then they must arise because phenomena lack fixed essences. Phenomena are malleable, they are susceptible to alteration, addition and destruction. This lack of fixed nature (nihsvabhava), this alterability of things then means that their physical and empirical forms are built not upon essence, as both the Universal Existence and True Doctrine schools posit, but upon the fact that nothing (sunya) ever defines and characterizes them eternally and unconditionally. It is not that things are in themselves nothing, nor that things possess a positive absence (abhava) of essence. Change is possible because a radical indeterminancy (sunyata) permeates all forms. Burning happens because conditions can arise where temperatures become incindiary and singe flesh, just as thirst can be quenched when the process of ingestion transforms water into body. Beings relate to one another not because of their heterogeneous forms, but because their interaction makes them susceptible to ongoing transformation.
The Fundamental Verses on the Middle Way is a tour de force through the entire categorical system of the Buddhist metaphysical analysis (abhidharma) which had given birth to its scholastic movements. Nagarjuna attacks all the concepts of these traditions which were thematized according to substantialist, essentialist metaphysics, using at every turn the logically revised “four errors” method. But perhaps most revolutionary was Nagarjuna’s extension of this doctrine of the “emptiness” of all phenomena to the discussion of the relationship between the Buddha and the world, between the cycle of pain-inflicted rebirth (samsara) and contented, desire-less freedom (nirvana). The Buddha, colloquially known as “the one who came and went” (Tathagata), cannot properly be thought of for Nagarjuna in the way the Buddhist scholastics have, that is, as the eternally pure seed of the true teachings of peace which puts to rest the delusions of the otherwise defiled world. The name and person of “Buddha” should not serve as the theoretical basis and justification of distinguishing between the ordinary, ignorant world and perfected enlightenment. After all, Nagarjuna reminds his readers, all change in the world, including the transformations which lead to enlightenment, are only possible because of interdependent causality (pratityasamutpada), and interdependent causality in turn is only possible because things, phenomena, lack any fixed nature and so are open (sunya) to being transformed. The Buddha himself was only transformed because of interdependence and emptiness, and so, Nagarjuna infers, “the nature of Tathagata is the very nature of the world/” It stands to reason then that no essential delimitations can be made between the world of suffering and the practices which can lead to peace, for both are merely alternative outcomes in the nexus of worldly interdependence. The words and labels which attach to both the world and the experience of nirvana are not the means of separating the wheat of life from its chaff, nor true cultivators of the soil of experience from the over-ambitious “everyday” rabble. Rather, samsara and nirvana signify nothing but the lack of guarantees in a life of desire and the possibility of change and hope. “We assert,” Nagarjuna proffers to say on behalf of the Buddhists, “that whatever arises dependently is as such empty. This manner of designating things is exactly the middle path.” A Buddhist oath to avoid suffering cannot be taken as a denunciation of the world, but only as a commitment to harness the possibilities which already are entailed within it for peace. Talk about the Buddha and practices inspired by the Buddha are not tantamount to the raising of a religious or ideological flag which marks off one country from another; rather, the world of suffering and the world of peace have the same extension and boundary, and talk about suffering and the Buddha is only there to make us aware of the possibilities of the world, and how our realization of these possibilities depends precisely on what we do and how we interact.
The apparently anti-theoretical stance occupied by Nagarjuna did not win him many philosophical friends either among his contemporary Buddhist readers or the circles of Brahminical thought. While it was certainly the case that, over the next seven centuries of Buddhist scholastic thought, the concept of emptiness was more forcefully articlulated, it was also hermeneutically appropriated into other systems in ways of which Nagarjuna would not necessarily have approved. Sunyata was soon made to carry theoretical meanings unrelated to causal theory in various Buddhists sects, serving as the support of a philosophy of consciousness for the later illustrious Vijnanavada or Cognition School and as the explication of the nature of both epistemology and ontology in the precise school of Buddhist Logic (Yogacara-Sautrantika). These schools, deriding Nagarjuna’s skepticism, retained their commitment to a style of philosophizing in India which allowed intellectual stands to be taken only on the basis of commitments to thesis, counter-thesis, rules of argument and standards of proof, that is, schools which equated philosophical reflection with competing doctrines of knowledge and metaphysics. This is all the more ironic given the overt attempt Nagarjuna made to head off the possibility that the idea of emptiness would be refuted or co-opted by this style of philosophizing, an attempt still preserved in the pages of his work The End of Disputes (Vigrahavyavartani).
The End of Disputes was in large measure a reactionary work, written only when philosophical objections were brought against Nagarjuna’s non-essentialist, anti-metaphysical approach to philosophy. The work was addressed to a relatively new school of Brahminical thought, the school of Logic (Nyaya) Philosophical debate, conducted in formalized fashions in generally court settings, had persisted in India for perhaps as much as eight hundred years before the time of the first literary systematizer of the school of logic, Gautama Aksapada. Several attempts had been made by Buddhist and Jaina schools before Nyaya to compose handbooks for formal debate. But Nyaya brought to the Indian philosophical scene a full-blown doctrine not only of the rules and etiquette of the debate process, but also an entire system of inference which distinguished between logically acceptable and unacceptable forms of argument. Finally, undergirding all forms of valid argument was a system of epistemology, a theory of proof (pramanasastra), which distinguished between various kinds of mental events which could be considered truth-revealing, or corresponding to real states of affairs and those which could not be relied upon as mediators of objective reality. Direct sensory perception, valid logical argument, tenable analogy and authoritative testimony were held by the Logicians to be the only kinds of cognitions which could correspond to real things or events in the world. They could serve as proofs to the claims we make to know. With some modifications, the approach of Nyaya came to be accepted as philosophical “first principles” by almost all the other schools of thought in India for centuries, both Vedic and non-Vedic. Indeed, in many philosophical quarters, before entering into the subtleties and agonism of advanced philosophical debate, a student was expected to pass through the prerequisites of studying Sanskrit grammar and logic. All thought, and so all positive sciences, from agriculture to Vedic study to statecraft, were at times even said to be fundamentally based on and entirely specious without basic training in “critical analysis” (anviksiki), which, according to Gautama Aksapada, was precisely what Nyaya was.
The Logicians, upon becoming aware very early of Nagarjuna’s thought, brought against his position of emptiness (sunyata) a sharp criticism. Certainly no claim, they insisted, should compel us to give it assent unless it can be known to be true. Now Nagarjuna has told us that emptiness is the lack of a fixed, essential nature which all things exhibit. But if all things are empty of a fixed nature, then that would include, would it not, Nagarjuna’s own claim that all things are empty? For one to say that all things lack a fixed nature would be also to say that no assertion, no thesis like Nagarjuna’s that all things are empty, could claim hold on a fixed reference. And if such a basic and all-encompassing thesis must admit of having itself neither a fixed meaning nor reference, then why should we believe it? Does not rather the thesis “all things lack a fixed essence, and are thus empty,” since it is a universal quantifier and so covers all things including theses, refute itself? The Logicians are not so much making the claim here that skepticism necessarily opts out of its own position, as when a person in saying “I know nothing” witnesses unwittingly to at least a knowledge of two things, namely how to use language and his own ignorance, as in the cases of the Socratic Irony and the Liar’s Paradox. It is more the direct charge that a philosophy which refuses to admit universal essences must be flatly self-contradictory, since a universal denial must itself be essentially true of all things. Should we not consider Nagarjuna as a person who, setting out on what would otherwise be an ingenious and promising philosophical journey, in a bit too much of a rush, tripped over his own feet on his way out the front door?
Nagarjuna, in The End of Disputes, responds in two ways. The first is an attempt to show the haughty Logicians that, if they really critically examine this fundamental concept of proof which grounds their theory of knowledge, they will find themselves in no better position than they claim Nagarjuna is in. How, Nagarjuna asks in an extended argument, can anything be proven to a fixed certainty in the way the Naiyayikas posit? When you get right down to it, a putative fact can be proven in only two ways; it is either self-evident or it is shown to be true by something else, by some other fact or piece of knowledge already assumed to be true. But if we assent to the very rules of logic and valid argument the Vedic Logicians espouse, we shall find, Nagarjuna thinks, that both of these suppositions are flawed. Let us take the claim that something can be proven to be true on the basis of other facts known to be true. Suppose, to use a favorite example from the Logician Gautama, I want to know how much an object weighs. I put it on a scale to measure its weight. The scale gives me a result, and for a moment that satisfies me; I can rely on the measurement because scales can measure weight. But hold on, Nagarjuna flags, your reliance on the trustworthiness of the scale is itself an assumption, not a piece of knowledge. Shouldn’t the scale be tested too? I measure the object on a second scale to test the accuracy of the first scale, and the measurement agrees with the first scale. But how can I just assume, once again, that the second scale is accurate? Both scales might be wrong. And the exercise goes on, there is nothing in principle which would justify me in assuming that any one test I use to verify a piece of knowledge is itself reliable beyond doubt. So, Nagarjuna concludes, the supposition that something can be proven through reference to some other putative fact runs into the problem that the series of proofs will never reach an end, and leaves us with an infinite regress. Should we commit ourselves to the opposite justification and propound that we know things to be true which are self-evident, then Nagarjuna would counter that we would be making a vacuous claim. The whole point of epistemology is to discover reliable methods of knowing, which implies that on the side of the world there are facts and on the side of the knower there are proofs which make those facts transparent to human consciousness. Were things just self-evident, proof would be superfluous, we should just know straightaway whether something is such and such or not. The claim of self-evidence destroys, in an ironic fashion which always pleased Nagarjuna, the very need for a theory of knowledge!
Having tested both criteria of evidence and come up short, the Logician might, and in fact historically did, try an alternative theory of mutual corroboration. We may not know for certain that a block of stone weighs too much to fit into a temple I am building, and we may not be certain that the scale being used to measure the stones is one hundred percent accurate, but if as a result of testing the stones with the scale I put the stones in the building and find that they work well, I have reason to rely on the knowledge I gain through the mutual corroborations of measurement and practical success. This process, for Nagarjuna, however, should not pass for an epistemologist who claims to be as strict as the Brahminical Logicians. In fact, this process should not even be considered mutual corroboration; it is actually circular. I assume stones have a certain measurable mass, so I design an instrument to confirm my assumption, and I assume scales measure weight so I assess objects by them, but in terms of strict logic, I am only assuming that this corroborative process proves my suppositions, but it in fact does nothing more than feed my preconceived assumptions rather than give me information about the nature of objects. We may say that a certain person is a son because he has a father, Nagarjuna quips, and we may say another person is a father because he has a son, but apart from this mutual definition, how do we know which particular person is which? By extension, Nagarjuna claims, this is the problem with the project of building a theory of knowledge as such. Epistemology and ontology are parasitic on one another. Epistemologies are conveniently formulated to justify preferred views of the world, and ontologies are presumed to be justified through systematic theories of proof, but apart from these projects being mutually theoretically necessary, we really have no honest way of knowing whether they in fact lend credence to our beliefs. Again, Nagarjuna has used tools from the bag of the logician, in this case, standard argumentational fallacies, to show that it is Brahminical Logic, and not his philosophy of emptiness, which has tripped itself up before having a chance to make a run in the world.
This, as said above, was Nagarjuna’s first response to the Logicians’ accusation that a philosophy of emptiness is fundamentally incoherent. There is however, Nagarjuna famously asserts, another pettito principii in the Nyaya charge that the thesis “all things are empty and lack a fixed nature” is incoherent. The statement “all things are empty” is actually, Nagarjuna says, not a formal philosophical thesis in the first place! According to the Nyaya rules of viable logical argument, the first step in proving an assertion true is the declared statement of the putative fact as a thesis in the argument (pratijna). Now in order for something to qualify as a formal philosophical thesis, a statement must be a fact about a particular object or state of knowable affairs in the world, and it is a matter of doctrine for Nyaya that all particular objects or states of affairs are classifiable into their categories of substances, qualities, and activities. Nagarjuna however does not buy into this set of ontological categories in the first place, and so the Logician is being disingenuous in trying to covertly pull him into the ontological game with this charge that the idea of emptiness is metaphysically unintelligible. The Brahminical Logician is insisting that no person can engage in a philosophical discussion without buying, at least minimally, into a theory of essences and issues surrounding how to categorize essences. It is exactly this very point, Nagarjuna demurs, that is eminently debatable! But since the Logician will not pay Nagarjuna the courtesy of discussion on Nagarjuna’s terms, the Buddhist replies to them on their terms: “If my statement (about emptiness) were a philosophical thesis, then it would indeed be flawed; but I assert no thesis, and so the flaw is not mine.”
With the exception of his two major commentators four centuries later, this stance of Nagarjuna satisfied no one in the Indian philosophical tradition, neither Brahmanas nor fellow Buddhists. It was the stance of the kind of debater who styled himself a vaitandika, a person who refutes rival philosophical positions while advocating no thesis themselves. Despite all their other disagreements, Brahmanas and Buddhists in following centuries did not consider such a stance to be truly philosophical, for while a person who occupied it may be able to expose dubious theories, one could never hope to learn the truth about the world and life from them. Such a person, it was suspected is more likely a charlatan than a sage. Despite the title of his work then, Nagarjuna’s attempt to call into “first question” theories of proof fell far short of ending all disputes. However, Nagarjuna closes this controversial and much-discussed work by reminding his readers of who he is. Paying reverence to the Buddha, the teacher, he says, of interdependent causality and emptiness, Nagarjuna tells his audience that “nothing will prevail for those in whom emptiness will not prevail, while everything will prevail for whom emptiness prevails.” This is a reiteration of Nagarjuna’s commitment that theory and praxis are not a partnership in which only through the former’s justification is the latter redeemed. The goal of practice is after all transformation, not fixity, and so if one insists on marrying philosophy to practice, philosophical reflection cannot be beholden to the unchanging, eternal essences of customary epistemology and metaphysics
There may be some extent to which the age-old debate as to whether Nagarjuna was a devotee of the traditional Theravada or Classical Buddhism or the Mahayana (Great Vehicle) sect turns on the authorship of the two letters attributed to him. Very little can be gleaned from the other works in Nagarjuna’s philosophical corpus that would lend much support to the supposition that the second-century scholar was even much aware of Great Vehicle doctrines or personages, even though the ground-breaking notion of emptiness was the one which Mahayana fixed on as its central idea. The two “ethical epistles” addressed to the historical Satvahana liege Gautamiputra Satkarni (r. ca. 166-196) would certainly give Nagarjuna a plausible historical locus. With their abundant references to the supremacy of the Great Vehicle teachings, they would also depict Nagarjuna as unequivocally within this movement. However, the non-existence of original Sanskrit versions of the Suhrllekha (To a Good Friend) and Ratnavali (Precious Garland), as well as their obviously heavy redactions in the Tibetan and Chinese editions, make any definitely reliable attribution of them to Nagarjuna practically impossible.
The familiar distinctions between the Classical and Great Vehicles are well-worn; the conservative scriptural and historical literalism of the former pitted against the mythological revisionism of the latter, the idealization of the reclusive ascetic pursuing his own perfection in the former as opposed to the angelic and socially engaged bodhisattva of the latter. Nagarjuna’s other works are filled with honorific passages dedicated only to the Buddha himself, while the two epistles abound in praise of the virtues of angelic bodhisattva-hood, though even these are found amidst passages extolling the perfections of the eightfold path and the nobility of the four truths. Whatever Nagarjuna’s precise sectarian identification, he never loses sight of the understanding that the practice of Buddhism is a new sort of human vehicle, a vehicle meant not to carry people from one realm to another realm, but a vehicle which could make people anew in the only realm where they have always lived.
Nagarjuna’s letters to the war-mongering Gautamiputra are somewhat conspicuous for the relative paucity of advice on the actual art of statecraft. Long sermons in To a Good Friend on the correct interpretation of subtle Mahayana teachings are intermingled with catechism-like presentations of the excellence of monastic virtues, and these are so numerous that even the author concedes toward the end of the correspondence that the king should keep as many of the enumerated precepts as he can, since keeping all of them would tax the fortitude of the most seasoned monk. But with all of these somewhat disconnected sections of the letter which even internally are wont to jump from one topic to another, a motif emerges which does seem to cohere with the more thematic approaches to the idea of emptiness in the other works, and that motif is the primacy of virtuous conduct and practice, which takes on even a higher and more relevant role than the achievements of wisdom.
This motif is surely significant, given the fact that the Classical and Great Vehicles, while both submitting that ultimate wisdom (prajna) and compassion (karuna) were the two paramount virtues, argued over which one was highest, the Theravada opting for wisdom and Mahayana for compassion. In these epistles, while Nagarjuna warns that the intentions behind moral acts must be informed by wisdom lest the benefits of the deed be spoiled, he stresses repeatedly the importance of steadfastly ethical conduct. Dharma or behavior upright in the eyes of the Buddha’s law of existence has two aspects, one which is characterized by meditative non-action and the other through positive action, and the road to Buddhahood, he says, passes through the positive action of the bodhisattva. For even though dharma is subtle and hard to comprehend, particularly where the notion of emptiness is involved and so easily misunderstood, its practice through the cultivation of moral intentions and attitudes will lead unerringly through the tangle of doctrinal debates. Beyond this general advice, which would apply to any monk or nun, counsel is given to the king that dharma as positive ethical conduct is also “the best policy,” for when one socially promotes adherence to ethical conduct, justice will prevail in the kingdom and benefits will accrue to all, benefits which rivals will envy beyond any transient material wealth and false senses of power.
In the worlds of the present and the future, it is after all only actions which matter. It is indeed the very physicality of deeds which leads to the accumulation of either meritorious or detrimental karma, and so one’s fate lies squarely in ones own hands. But through acts performed in the field of samsara, all conceivable changes are possible. A prince can become a pauper, either willingly, like the Buddha, or unwillingly. Young men become old, beauty morphs into decrepitude, friendship descends into enmity. It is this piercing contingency of samsara which is so often experienced with such anguish. But, Nagarjuna quickly reminds his readers, all these transformations can just as easily go in the opposite direction, with material poverty blossoming into spiritual riches, fathers reborn as sons and mothers as young wives, and the wounds of conflict sutured with the threads of reconciliation. Interdependent causality and the emptiness which change depends on mean that things can always go either way, and so which way they in fact go depends intimately on one’s own deeds. And this leads one to grasp that the proper site of practice for the Buddhist cannot be just the monastery, removed as it tries to be from the machinations of state, economy, social class and the other tumultuous and sundry affairs of suffering beings. As there is no difference between samsara and nirvana owing to the emptiness and constantly changing nature of both, so the change which a Buddhist effects upon herself and those around her is a change in the world, and this constant and purposeful change is the rightful mission of Buddhism. With his own peculiar and visionary interpretation of the concept of the emptiness of all things then, Nagarjuna has woven an anti-metaphysical and epistemological stance together with an ethics of action which was, true to its own implications, to transform the self-understanding of the Buddhist tradition for millennia to come.
Nagarjuna’s Works Addressed to Buddhists
Nagarjuna’s Works Addressed to Brahminical Systems
Nagarjuna’s Ethical Epistles
Southern Illinois University
U. S. A.
Last updated: May 4, 2005 | Originally published: