Jean-Luc Nancy (1940—)

nancyThe French philosopher Jean-Luc Nancy  has written more than twenty books and hundreds of texts or contributions to volumes, catalogues and journals. His philosophical scope is very broad: from On Kawara to Heidegger, from the sense of the world and the deconstruction of Christianity to the Jena-romantics of the Schlegel-brothers.

Nancy is influenced by philosophers like Jacques Derrida, Georges Bataille and Martin Heidegger. He became famous with La communauté désoeuvrée (translated as The Inoperative Community in 1991), at the same time a work on the question of community and a comment on Bataille. He has also published books on Heidegger, Kant, Hegel and Descartes. One of the main themes in his work is the question of our being together in contemporary society. In Être singulier pluriel (translated as Being Singular Plural in 2000) Nancy deals with the question how we can still speak of a ‘we’ or of a plurality, without transforming this ‘we’ into a substantial and exclusive identity. What are the conditions to speak of a ‘we’ today?

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Lacan
  3. Deconstruction
  4. Community
    1. Immanentism
    2. Heidegger and being-with
  5. Ontology
    1. Globalization
    2. Deconstructing Christianity
  6. Sovereignty
  7. Art and Culture
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Jean-Luc Nancy was born on the 26th of July 1940 in Caudéran, near Bordeaux in France. When exactly the philosopher Nancy emerged is difficult to ascertain, but it is clear that his first philosophical interests began to arise during his youth in the catholic environment of Bergerac. Shortly after he obtained his graduate in philosophy in 1962 in Paris, Nancy began to write explicitly philosophical texts. He published on authors like Karl Marx, Immanuel Kant, Friedrich Nietzsche and André Breton. This engagement with various different types of thinkers also came to be characteristic of his later work, which is renowned for its versatility.

After his aggregate in philosophy in Paris and a short period as a teacher in Colmar, in 1968 Nancy became an a assistant at the Institut de Philosophie in Strasbourg – he presently still lives and works in Strasbourg. In 1973, he obtained his Phd under the supervision of Paul Ricoeur, via a dissertation on Kant. Soon after, he became the ‘maître de conférences’ at the Université des Sciences Humaines in Strasbourg, the institute to which he is still attached. In 1987, Nancy was elected docteur d’état (doctor of state) in Toulouse with the congratulations of the jury. His dissertation handled the topic of freedom in the work of Kant, Schelling and Heidegger, and was published as L’expérience de la liberté (translated as The Experience of Freedom) in 1988. His supervisor was Gérard Granel and members of the jury included Jacques Derrida and Jean-François Lyotard.

However, Nancy didn’t wait until 1987 to extend his academic career. In the seventies and eighties he was a guest professor at the most diverse universities, from the Freie Universität in Berlin to the University of California. As a professor in philosophy, he was also involved in many cultural delegations of the French ministry of external affairs, particularly in relation to Eastern Europe, Great-Britain and the United States of America. Together with his ever-growing publication list, this began to procure Nancy an international reputation. The quick translation of his work into several languages enhanced his fame (Nancy mastered, besides his mother tongue, also German, Italian and English).

This hyperactivity suddenly came to an end when he became gravely ill at the end of the eighties. He was forced to undergo a heart transplant (which Derrida talks about in his recently released book on Nancy, Le Toucher) and his recovery from this was inhibited by a long-term fight with cancer. These diseases marked his career fundamentally. Out of sheer necessity, he put an end to all of his courses at the beginning of the nineties and quit his membership of almost all of the committees that he participated in. He has recently restarted most of his activities, but it is surprising that during these troubles Nancy never stopped writing and publishing. A lot of his main works, most of which are related to social and political philosophical topics, were published in the nineties and he even wrote a text on his disease. It was published as a book in 2000 with the title L’intrus: the intruder. For the moment, now over sixty, he is a very active philosopher. He travels around the world as a popular speaker and thinker on many philosophical congresses and writes one text after another. Nancy is more alive than ever, both as a man and as a philosopher.

2. Lacan

Nancy’s first book appears in 1973: Le titre de la lettre (The Title of the Letter). He wrote it with his philosophical partner Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe. Up until now, it has frequently been described as a critical study on the work of the French psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan. Without working this through here, it is worth mentioning that Nancy quite consistently refers to Lacan, or to psychoanalysis in general, and most of the time in quite a critical way. In The Sense of the World he describes the Lacanian notion of the ‘Other’ as a ‘theological excrement’. That, in a nutshell, is what he had already said in The Title of the Letter: Nancy argues that Lacan questions the metaphysical subject, but does this in a metaphysical way. Since then, Nancy has continued to formulate his reservations against psychoanalytic concepts like Law, Father, Other, Subject, etc. While he contends that psychoanalytic jargon still bears some theological remnants, Nancy also thinks that a lot of its concepts are worth thinking through.

3. Deconstruction

Nevertheless, Lacan is not the author that Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe explicitly study or look up to. It is the other Jacques, Jacques Derrida, who makes an enormous impression on both of them. With Derrida, Nancy affirms in several interviews, he had the impression that, after Sartre, something new and very contemporary was born in philosophy. Derrida’s work inspired both Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe to such a degree that they organise the famous conference in 1980, Les fins de l’homme, in Cerisy-la-Salle on Derrida and politics. This conference helped to consolidate Derrida’s solid place at the pinnacle of contemporary philosophy.

For Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe, this conference on Derrida and politics served as the starting point to deal with more politics. In the same year, they set up a philosophical platform to investigate the political. The ‘Centre de recherches philosophiques sur le politique’ (The Centre of Philosophical Research of the Political) started from the demand to rethink the political and not to rest on the blinding rhetoric of our current democracy. Over several years, philosophers such as Claude Lefort and Jean-François Lyotard give lectures on this topic, and out of this two books sprang up: Rejouer le politique (1981) and Le retrait du politique (translated as Retreating the Political in 1997).

In 1984, Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe put an end to the activities of the Centre, because, according to them, its role as a place of encounter ‘had become almost completely dissociated from that as a place of research and questioning’. The Centre had too often been the mere successive reception of speakers, rather than a common space with common concerns. Despite the closing down of the Centre in 1984, Nancy’s concern with the question of the political, and that of community, has never disappeared.

Nancy is, of course, much more than a pupil of Derrida. His work is from the beginning marked by lots of diverse influences, from Georges Bataille and Maurice Blanchot to Descartes, Hegel, Kant, Nietzsche and Heidegger. These authors are already evident in the very first books that Nancy published: Le discours de la syncope (1976) and L’impératif catégorique (1983) on Kant, La remarque spéculative (translated as The Speculative Remark, 2001) on Hegel, Ego sum (1979) on Descartes and Le partage des voix (1982) on Heidegger.

The book that Nancy became famous with is La communauté désoeuvrée (1982), a comment on the work of Bataille. This text led Maurice Blanchot to discuss the question of community, and also to consider Nancy’s comments on Bataille, in his La communauté inavouable (translated as The Unavowable Community in 1988). Later on, a compilation of essays centring around the theme of community, La communauté désoeuvrée, is also published as a book. Besides offering an excellent analysis of the problem of community, this volume is an interesting introduction to the author Nancy. One can learn to read Nancy in it, and this is not always an easy job because he starts mostly from a commentary on the work of other authors and develops his own thesis out of this commentary. This strategy of reading and thinking is named deconstruction and Nancy continues Derrida’s work with it. This is one reason why one can call La communauté désoeuvrée a key text in Nancy’s work.

Besides revealing his strategy of thinking, in this text one can also discover the main philosophical themes that Nancy is concerned with in his later work. These often circle around social and political philosophical problems, like the question how to develop our modern society with the twentieth century knowledge that political projects that start by trying to build society according to a well-defined shape or plan have frequently led to political terror and social violence. In this respect, Nancy is obviously thinking of the former socialist states, as well as the nazi and fascist states of the twentieth century.

When Nancy, in the footsteps of Derrida, deconstructs texts of an author, he researches in the most meticulous way what the author writes, but also and especially, what he or she doesn’t write, where his or her thinking halts or recoils to think a problem through. He looks for the place where thinking stumbles. Out of this slip, Nancy tries to make clear the next step the author wanted to take/should have taken in order to think his or her problem but nevertheless didn’t.

4. Community

In La communauté désoeuvrée, Nancy applies this deconstruction to the cry for the restoration of a transparent, small-scale community, a ‘Gemeinschaft’ that might liberate us from the ‘alienation’ in modern society, the ‘Gesellschaft’. Nancy’s thesis is that at the core of western political thinking, there is a longing for an ‘original community’. It is the longing for an immediate being-together, out of the idea that we once lived in a harmonious and intimate community, but that this harmony has declined throughout history. The modern society, the Gesellschaft, stands for the opposite of the warm and cosy pre-modern community, the Gemeinschaft. According to this line of thinking, we live now in an anonymous society full of selfish individuals and the close communal ties are no more than memories. This leads not only to the disintegration of society, but also to violence, the decline of norms and values, and so forth. The only solution to fight disintegration is to turn back to the period where the communal ties were present, or to strive for a future community where the former ties are restored.

This historic-philosophical scheme is not only used by a large number of philosophers or social and political thinkers, it is also a central theme within western society and culture in general. According to Nancy:

The lost or broken community can be exemplified in all kinds of ways and by all kinds of paradigms: the natural family, the Athenian city, the Roman Republic, the first Christian community, corporations, communes, or brotherhoods- always it is a matter of a lost age in which community was tight and bound to harmonious bonds in which above all it played back to itself, through its institutions, its rituals, and its symbols, the representation, indeed the living offering, of its own immanent unity, intimacy and autonomy’ (The Inoperative Community, p. 9).

Nancy is thinking largely of the period of the German romantics, of Jean-Jacques Rousseau who left us a mythical natural community as a counterpoint to modern society, but the target of his analysis is also of contemporary communitarianisms, like Alasdair MacIntyre, who speak of the need for a return to pre-modern communities. The nostalgic thought that the past or the old days were better, that we have lost something that was present in the past, is a recognizable paradigm within our everyday life. This nostalgia is not only present in the programs of conservative political parties. A quick look at the commercials from various mediums (especially television) shows us that a lot of products are pretending to give us back a ‘natural’ biological condition of hair colour, for example. Also, in everyday life, people consistently voice their frustrations with the ‘lawless and wild youths’ who have alienated themselves from the community that they were born in.

It is, of course, remarkable that every generation seems to go back to the same criticism again and again. Therefore, Nancy says, the longing for an original community is not a reference to a real period in our history. It is rather a mythical thought, an imaginary picture of our past. As such, this nostalgic imagination is innocent, but when it becomes the starting point for a politics of community, the innocence disappears. We should become suspicious, Nancy says, of the retrospective consciousness of the lost community and its identity:

‘whether this consciousness conceives of itself as effectively retrospective or whether, disregarding the realities of the past, it constructs images of this past for the sake of an ideal or prospective vision. We should be suspicious of this consciousness first of all because it seems to have accompanied the Western world from its very beginnings: at every moment in history, the Occident has rendered itself to the nostalgia for a more archaic community that has disappeared, and to deploring a loss of familiarity, fraternity and conviviality. Our history begins with the departure of Ulysses and with the onset of rivalry, dissension, and conspiracy in his palace. Around Penelope, who reweaves the fabric of intimacy without ever managing to complete it, pretenders set up the warring and political scene of society – pure exteriority’ (The Inoperative Community, p. 10).

Let us take a contemporary example. The harmonic community of which MacIntyre speaks, is a community of common norms and values, shared by people with the same identity and background, otherwise the community wouldn’t be harmonic anymore. If we take this moral inclination for a community of people with the same identity as a political longing, one is not that far removed from the logic of many nationalisms that are still present in Western Europe today. Of course, the intentions are manifestly different but the international political scene shows that the longing for a pure social identity can still lead to violent conflicts. The Balkan wars of the nineties, which erupted one by one, are a sad example of that. Whatever the motives of these wars, the belonging to an ethnic group has been the criterion in making the difference between good and evil, between us and them, between authentic Serbs or real Croats and others. What was sought after was a pure and undivided social identity, no longer soiled by the stains of other blood.

In other and fortunately less violent contexts, it is a certain culture of shared values and norms which delivers the foundations for social identity. Flemish people are defined as different from Dutch people, although they are neighbours, speak the same language and have almost everything in common. Another example is the current ‘migration problem’: there is often a suspicion on behalf of citizens around the world that the values of groups of immigrants might threaten the identity of a region and thereby affect the social solidarity. The fear in Western Europe, and elsewhere, seems to be that any influx of foreigners might change public life so dramatically that our ‘own’ former identity would be in danger. Symbols like the headscarf of Muslim females, for example, play an important role in that debate and are at the basis of hot political discussions on the identity and the values of many European nations.

a. Immanentism

Nancy summarises the communal desire for a closed and undivided social identity with his concept of immanentism. The French word ‘immanence’ means to be fully present with oneself, to be closed upon oneself. In La communauté désoeuvrée, immanentism is the concept by which Nancy describes the horizon of our attitudes towards identity and community. He points at two examples. On the one hand, he is thinking of the way that communities, nations or ethnics try to protect their identity from the influences of others, so that they are united around their undivided selfhood, culture or values. On the other hand, immanentism is also present in the way that the former socialist regimes in Eastern Europe understood the communist form of constitution as the final destination of humanity. There too, you can discover a desire for the annihilation of social alienation and for an immediate and transparent being-together. The ultimate goal of human acting is to reach the transparent communist way of life. Once that goal has been realised, the idea is that all alienation of the capitalist way of life would disappear and society would finally be harmoniously present with itself.

With its detailed articulation of this political and philosophical paradigm of thinking, intertwined with a commentary on Bataille, Nancy’s La communauté désoeuvrée obtained international fame. Nevertheless, he never elaborated a theory of community, just like he has not done so with the other main themes from his work. Far more often, he launches a few theses, offers fragments and traces of thinking, which he then develops further in later texts. This fragmentary character of his work sometimes makes it difficult to come to grips with, but on the other hand, you get in every book or text a lot of new perspectives and stimulating insights on contemporary political, philosophical and ontological problems.

b. Heidegger and being-with

Besides his enduring preoccupation with the work of classic philosophers like Kant, Hegel and Nietzsche, Nancy’s thought concentrates primarily on a reorientation of the work of Martin Heidegger, especially since his ‘doctorat d’état’ in 1987. Not that Nancy’s work is just a comment on Heidegger. In The Experience of Freedom for example, Nancy’s study of the notion of freedom within Heidegger’s work, is not only a discussion of Heidegger, but also of Kant, Schelling and Sartre. Nancy is looking for a sort of ‘non-subjective’ freedom, a concept of freedom that tries to think the existential ground from which every freedom (thought as a property of the individual or a collectivity) starts from. Freedom, instead of being seen as the classical ‘liberum arbitrium’ or the subjectivistic free-will, lies in the being thrown into the world, and into existence. As Heidegger does, Nancy accentuates the fact that freedom in Kant’s work is a sort of unconditional causality. In ‘the second analogy of the experience’ of the Kritik der reinen Vernunft (The Critique of Pure Reason), Kant argues that the specific form of causality that human freedom is – the subject acts ‘spontaneously’ – means that the subject must withdraw itself out of time, to not be determined by empirical causality. Therefore, as in Heidegger’s Vom Wesen der menschlichen Freiheit, Nancy determines Kantian freedom as a autopositional freedom, the freedom of a subject who ‘forgets’ that it is always already thrown into existence, even before it can decide to be free. So, one has to think freedom from its existential ground, its finite being. As long as one thinks freedom as the property of an ‘infinite’ subject, every form of finite being will appear a kind of heteronomy, as a restraint of my freedom’. My freedom, says Nancy, does not end where that of the other starts, but the existence of the other is the necessary condition to be free. There is no freedom without the presupposition of our being-in-the-world, and of our being-thrown into the existence. That is why Heidegger’s work is interesting, because he was the first to think the existential condition, the being of the freedom through.

Nancy’s interest in Heidegger’s work also has something to do with the question of community, the question of being-with (Mitsein) in Heidegger’s words. Especially in his book Être singulier pluriel (Being Singular Plural), written in 1996, Nancy focuses upon that. This book, together with Une pensée finie from 1990 and Le sens du monde from 1993, is one of the most important texts in Nancy’s work during the nineties and of his work in general.

In Être singulier pluriel, Nancy deals with the question how we can still speak of a ‘we’ or of a plurality, without transforming this ‘we’ into a substantial and exclusive identity. What are the conditions to speak of a ‘we’ today? From Heidegger, Nancy learnt that our being in the world with others determines us, before we can speak of a division between and individual and a community. We are always already thrown into the world, but this contingent positioning can never be the basis to speak of a natural or original community. Contrary to Aristotle or Plato, we can no longer fall back on a fixed metaphysical or natural (phusis) ground. Neither is the world an entity created by God, wherein we occupy a well-defined place. The modern philosophical order, especially since Nietzsche, has finished with there ‘truths’. Once community or being-together is no longer a ‘natural’ fact wherein I’m originally dwelling, community becomes a capital question for modern political philosophy. Also, in our time the problem of community is confronted with the further question: how to understand community when it is no longer given to us as a gift of God, or as a harmonic being-together and identification with our ‘own’ people?

To Nancy, Heidegger is the philosopher who handles this question in a quite ambiguous way and that makes him controversial, still today. Everyone who drops the name Heidegger in philosophical circles, knows of the controversy he still evokes. More than is the case with, for example, Maurice Blanchot, Heidegger’s extreme right sympathies are still the cause of hot polemics, certainly when one, as Nancy does explicitly, touches the ethical and political terrains. Nancy does not deny this ambiguity. On the contrary, he takes it as the starting point of his reorientation of Heidegger. On the one hand, Nancy argues that Heidegger makes it clear, in the most radical way, that every human being (Dasein as he calls it) is always being opened unto a world. Being in the world is being with others, and this being-with is an essential trait – if one can still speak of essence; rather it is the unsubstantial essence, the being of every being-there. So, being there is being-with, to exist is to coexist.

According to Nancy, there is no more radicalised point of view to think community in a modern, contingent way. We are always being-with, but this being-with is no longer a substantial being-together out of a shared trait, identity of race. On the other hand, he realises very well that Heidegger is the author who at a certain moment speaks of a true German community and leaves behind the openness and radical point of view he himself had postulated. Only this community, so Heidegger says in his famous rectoral speech, can lead to a proper existence. Heidegger was convinced the national-socialist movement would guarantee a collective escape from an improper existence. How this had to happen in a concrete way, Heidegger seemingly didn’t know when he wrote Being and Time. He left his readers in a state of uncertainty, but this uncertainty didn’t stop him from partaking in a horrible political regime, from connecting his thought to the national-socialist movement and from identifying himself with one of the most murderous political regimes ever.

It seems quite preposterous that an author like Nancy who announces the end of every immanent community, appeals to a philosopher who puts forward a true German community. How can Nancy, who explicitly writes against all nostalgia for provincialism, refer to Heidegger who withdrew into his hut in Todtnauberg?

As already said, Nancy’s attitude towards Heidegger is twofold, and he also makes this clear in his text ‘La decision d’existence’ (published in Une pensée finie). On the one hand, he is inspired by Heidegger’s articulation of being-with. On the other hand, he wants to question fundamentally every claim that Heidegger makes regarding a proper or original community. Out of Nancy’s analysis in Être singulier pluriel it becomes clear that this is exactly the obstacle in Heidegger’s philosophical reflection on being-with, and in the contemporary philosophical and ethical complaint of a lost community (although one cannot compare the two in many points). In this respect, think again of the important role that the communitarians are playing nowadays, with very influential authors like Charles Taylor, Michael Sandel and Alasdair MacIntyre.

In his interest in Heidegger, Nancy is touching the problem of community at its deepest core. Heidegger’s ambiguity is a signal for him to develop the ‘with’, the constitutive relationality of being-there, and to radicalise it in what he calls an analysis of the coexistential. This is a fundamental analysis of the way that we stand to each other and to the world and how this can be the basis for a thinking of community. This, and the attempt to think community in a radical way as being-with, gets its start in Heidegger’s Being and Time but is, according to Nancy, largely insufficient.

5. Ontology

a. Globalization

The theme of community is one of the main and most interesting threads throughout Nancy’s work, but there are numerous other themes and questions in his work. Nancy is not only very familiar with a large part of the history of philosophy (see his books on Kant, Descartes, Hegel, and so forth), but he also discusses in his work political themes like justice, sovereignty and freedom, and how they may apply in our increasingly global world. He always maintains a very singular voice and perspective. Take for example the contemporary debate on globalization. In 1993, Nancy wrote his book Le sens du monde in which he searched for what we mean when we say that we are living in a world, or in one world; about what we mean when we say that the sense of the world is no longer situated above but within the world. The world, the existence, that is our radical responsibility he says, but by this doesn’t mean that we are always responsible for everything and everyone. He wants to make clear that the political, juridical or moral responsibility in concrete situations is based on a preceding ontological responsibility. From the moment that the measure for our responsibility is no longer given by a metaphysical or divine order, we are living in a world where we are exposed to a naked existence, without the possibility to fall back upon a preceding fundamental cause of the world. For Nancy, the contingency of our naked existence is not in the first place a moral problem. It is an ontological question. Whereas in a feudal world the meaning and destination of life was clear and fixed, contemporary existence can no longer refer to a general metaphysical framework. Nothing other than this contingency is the challenge for our global existence today, says Nancy. It is indeed the case that today we are confronted with a lot of uncertainties and that we are thrown into many complex situations, but it is not certain at all whether that is something we should complain about.

For Nancy, becoming-worldly means, in the first place, responding to the demands of our time. He asks what it means when we think today that we are living in a world. Becoming-worldwide is in a radical way being exposed to sense, to the world as such. The ‘sense of the world’ is in no way still given by a creator. What is left as a horizon is that the world, and only the world, is there. Sense is not so much something that we, as secularised successors to God, ascribe to the world. This would only confirm the idea that the world stands for a lack of sense, or for an ‘object’ to which sense is given from outside by a ‘subject’. Thus Nancy says we have to think ‘world’ as beings who are always already in the world. There is nothing new about that and yet, he does not stop telling us. It seems so evident, almost banal, and this banality is what counts today. There’s nothing hidden anymore behind the question of the world. We have to confront ourselves with this nothing, with this ex nihilo of the world. This ontology, this logic of the ontos, is what Nancy wants us to deal with, as he makes clear in one of his most recent books La création du monde ou la mondialisation.

b. Deconstructing Christianity

Thinking through the problem of globalisation means for Nancy at the same time deconstructing Christianity. Of course, a deconstruction of Christianity is different from a mere criticism of Christianity. It is the question of whether atheism is the antipode of religion, or if religion has a sort of auto-critical gesture towards itself. We ‘moderns’ love to say that we are no longer Christians, but maybe the Christian aspects of our existence are so evident that we are no longer conscious of them. Take for example the question whether our existence has a meaning. The thought that existence has indeed a meaning and that this meaning is attached to existence by some self constituting thing – whether it is a God or a subject – is present in atheism as much as in Christianity. Also the nihilistic claim that existence is meaningless starts from this idea.

Nancy therefore tries to think ‘the sense of the world’ out of the transcendental conditions of our existence. An atheist’s world is a world in which sense is no longer attached to the world, but where it is the condition of our being-in-the-world as such. The world does not have sense, it is sense, and this naked existence means that we have to exist in the sense that we are, and can no longer hide behind some or another presupposed meaning of life. We are exposed to the world and to ourselves, and that is the sense of existence.

At first sight, Nancy seems to limit himself to a sort of affirmation of the status quo of the world as it is, and it seems that he affirms the common idea that since the collapse of the former socialist states we would live in an accomplished humanity. It seems, especially, that we cannot disagree on the ‘good’ of some matters: there are human rights, individual liberties and humanitarian missions of the UN to keep guard over this moral world order, and so forth. Nancy’s thesis is nothing but the questioning of that very idea, and it seems to me that the work of Nancy in general becomes interesting when it is used as a hyperbolic questioning of that sort of philosophical or political correctness.

6. Sovereignty

As much as in his earlier work like L’oubli de la philosophie in 1986 as in many other texts like Changement de monde in 1998, Nancy questions in a very singular way the evidences and rhetorics of our time. That certainly does not mean that he is only a social or political philosopher. If philosophy has to be engaged today, he says, it has in the first place the task to philosophize. Let’s take one example to make that clear.

One sees that with an ever growing number of missions the UN continually tries, with or without success, to quench potential hotspots here and there, and thus to maintain the order in and of the world. By means of humanitarian interventions one wants to apply international law in places where it is violated. These interventions seem to indicate that there is no longer any sovereignty. There is no longer a declaration of war from one sovereign to another, but an application of international law in the name of humanity in general. There are nevertheless, Nancy analyses, a number of signs or symptoms that seem to show that sovereignty is still playing a part in contemporary politics, albeit in a subdued, private manner. This reluctance to talk about sovereignty on the one hand, and the full use of its symbolic values on the other, were the motivations for Nancy to write a text about the Gulf War. In it, he examined what part sovereignty can still play in contemporary political and social thinking. The waning role of sovereignty in the West, and its subdued return in the Gulf War, is a given which he consciously wants to confront rather than forget. For his analysis, Nancy was inspired by what Carl Schmitt made clear with the slogan: one who says humanity, wants to cheat. Even if a state pretends to make war in the name of humanity, it takes over a universal concept to use it polemically against its opponent, its enemy. A world which is becoming worldwide tends to, explains Schmitt, criminalize its enemies. It no longer suffices to put the enemy back behind his borders. One goes looking for him in his own national territory and disqualifies him in a moral way. He becomes literally inhuman: he falls out of the moral human order, he is an illegal combatant, as the U.S. government called the Taliban prisoners.

7. Art and Culture

Finally I want to point to the fact that Nancy is also a very influential philosopher of art and culture. Already in 1978 he published with Lacoue-Labarthe a book on the Jena-romantics of the Schlegel brothers. The book is called L’absolu littéraire (translated as The Literary Absolute in 1987) and sets up a large discussion of the Jena-romantiek, the German ‘Frühromantik’: the place and the group of the brothers August-Wilhelm and Friedrich Schlegel (and partially also Novalis and Schelling). This study focuses on the review Athenaeum published by the brothers Schlegel at Jena, who thereafter founded a literary circle. Lacoue-Labarthe and Nancy focus on the question of literature realising and fulfilling itself as a work, an œuvre as it is called in the French language: the writer produces himself in the literary work he writes so that he, as the subject, the support of this work, becomes himself an œuvre, a self-productive individual. L’absolu littéraire points at the fact that a lot of these romantic themes still play a substantial role in our modern society.

Besides his interest for literature, film, theatre and poetry, Nancy also writes many contributions in art catalogues, especially in relation to contemporary art. At various different times, Nancy also exhibited some of his own work together with the French artist François Martin, and he has also written a few poems and theatre texts. One can read his philosophical reflections on the statute of art in general, in the book Les Muses, published in 1994 (translated as The Muses in 1996). In it, Hegel’s thesis of the death of art takes a central place. There is also a text from a lecture from 1992 at the Louvre museum in Paris on the painting ‘The death of the virgin’ by the Italian painter Caravaggio. This text was already published in 1993, in a number of Paragraph, fully dedicated to Nancy’s work. From Caravaggio’s painting, Nancy is looking for another conception of painting. The painting is not a representation of the empirical world – understood in the platonic, metaphysical way – but a presentation of world, of sense, of existence:

‘From the inside of (the)painting to the outside of (the) painting, there is nothing, no passage. There is painting, there is us, indistinctly, distinctly. Here, (the) painting is our access to the fact that we do not accede – either to the inside or to the outside of ourselves. Thus we exist. This [Caravaggio's] painting paints the threshold of existence. In these conditions, to paint does not mean to represent, but simply to pose the ground, the texture, and the pigment of the threshold’ (in Kamuf P. (ed.), Paragraph, 1993, p. 115)

In 2001, Nancy published The Evidence of Film, a book on the Iranian filmmaker Abbas Kiarostami. In it, he writes that:

‘Cinema presents – that is to say shares (communicates) – the intensity of a look upon a world of which it is itself part and parcel (a film properly speaking and as video, as television, but also as photography and as music: these motives will come up again). It is part of it precisely in the sense that it has contributed to its structure as it is now: as a world where looking at what is real is resolutely substituting for every kind of visionary seeing, foreseeing and clairvoyant gazing. […] Clearly, films turn out (with photography, of course, and starting with it: Kiarostami never forgets this, and this will have to be discussed) to be something very different from a relatively new support for received ways of experience (stories or feelings, myth or dream, etc.). Well beyond the medium that it also is, cinema adds up an element: the element of looking and of what is real insofar as it is looked at. All in one, film is ubiquitous, it can take in everything, from one far end of the earth to the other …’ (The Evidence of Film, p. 20).

Nancy also wrote numerous texts on art in several international journals. Texts on Baudelaire, the relation between image and violence, the problem of representation in art, the statute of literature, on Hölderlin, on contemporary artists On Kawara and Soun-gui and even on techno-music. It seems that nothing is unfamiliar with the philosopher Nancy.

8. References and Further Reading

Major works of Nancy:

  • La Remarque spéculative (Un bon mot de Hegel), Paris, Galilée, 1973.
  • La titre de la lettre, Paris, Galilée, 1973 (with Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe)
  • Le Discours de la syncope. I. Logodaedalus, Paris, Flammarion, 1975.
  • L’absolu littéraire. Théorie de la littérature du romantisme allemand, Paris, Seuil, 1978 (with Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe).
  • Ego sum, Paris, Flammarion, 1979.
  • Le partage des voix, Paris, Galilée, 1982.
  • La communauté désoeuvrée, Paris, Christian Bourgois, 1983.
  • L’Impératif catégorique, Paris, Flammarion, 1983.
  • L’oubli de la philosophie, Paris, Galilée, 1986.
  • Des lieux divins, Mauvezin, T.E.R, 1987.
  • L’expérience de la liberté, Paris, Galilée, 1988.
  • Une Pensée Finie, Paris, Galilée, 1990.
  • Le poids d’une pensée, Québec, Le griffon d’argile, 1991.
  • Le mythe nazi, La tour d’Aigues, L’Aube, 1991 (with Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe)
  • La comparution (politique à venir), Paris, Bourgois, 1991 (with Jean-Chrisophe Bailly).
  • Corpus, Paris, Métailié, 1992.
  • The birth to presence, Stanford, Stanford University Press, 1993.
  • Les Muses, Paris, Galilée, 1994.
  • Être singulier pluriel, Paris, Galilée, 1996.
  • Hegel. L’inquiétude du négatif, Paris, Hachette, 1997.
  • L’Intrus, Paris, Galilée, 2000.
  • Le regard du portrait, Paris, Galilée, 2000.
  • La pensée dérobée. Paris, Galilée, 2001.
  • The evidence of film. Bruxelles, Yves Gevaert, 2001.
  • La création du monde ou la mondialisation. Paris, Galilée, 2002.

English translations: almost all of Nancy’s major works are translated into English:

  • The Inoperative Community (1991). Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • The Birth to Presence (1993): Stanford University Press.
  • The Experience of Freedom (1993). Stanford University Press.
  • The Gravity of Thought (1997). New Jersey: Humanities Press.
  • Retreating the Political (1997). With Lacoue-Labarthe (edited by Simon Sparks). London: Routledge.
  • The Sense of the World (1998). Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Being Singular Plural (2000). Stanford University Press

Secondary bibliography

  • Bernasconi R., On deconstructing nostalgia for community within the West: the debate between Nancy and Blanchot, Research in Phenomenology, 23, 3-21, 1993.
  • Derrida J., Le Toucher, Jean-Luc Nancy, Paris, Galilée, 2000.
  • Devisch I., A trembling voice in the desert. Jean-Luc Nancy’s re-thinking of the space of the political, Cultural Values, 4(2), 239-255, 2000.
  • Devisch I, La «Négativité Sans Emploi». SymposiumIV(2):167-87, 2000.
  • Devisch I, ‘Wij. Jean-Luc Nancy en het vraagstuk van de gemeenschap’ (Uitgeverij Peeters, Leuven, 2003, forthcoming)
  • Dow K., Ex-posing identity: Derrida and Nancy on the (im) possibility. Philosophy and Social Criticism, 19 (3-4), 261-271, 1993.
  • Kamuf P.(ed.), Paragraph. On the Work of Jean-Luc Nancy, 16(2), 1993.
  • May T., The community’s absence in Lyotard, Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe. Philosophy Today, 275-284, 1993.
  • May T., Reconsidering difference. Nancy, Derrida, Levinas, and Deleuze. Pennsylvania, The Pennsylvania State University Press, 1997.
  • Sheppard D. e.a., On Jean-Luc Nancy. The sense of philosophy, London, Routledge, 1997.
  • Studies in Practical Philosophy 1(1), 1999 (fully dedicated to the work of Nancy).

Author Information

Ignaas Devisch
Free University Brussels