Naturalistic epistemology is an approach to the theory of knowledge that emphasizes the application of methods, results, and theories from the empirical sciences. It contrasts with approaches that emphasize a priori conceptual analysis or insist on a theory of knowledge that is independent of the particular scientific details of how mind-brains work.
Varieties of naturalistic epistemology differ in terms of how they conceive the relationship between empirical science and epistemology, how much they rely on empirical science in theorizing about knowledge, and which sciences they take to be particularly relevant to epistemological questions. Naturalistic epistemologists such as W.V. Quine regard epistemology as part of psychology while others such as Alvin Goldman think it merely needs aid from the empirical sciences. On the other hand, Thomas Kuhn thinks that the social sciences should be applied to epistemology. Regardless, the importance of the sciences to epistemology is undisputed among naturalistic epistemologists.
Among the topics within this discipline, the debate on the internal and external theories for the justification of beliefs is one of the main issues. Donald Davidson and John Pollock are major naturalistic epistemologists that support internalism. Alvin Goldman, on the other hand, supports externalism. The issue of a priori knowledge and the problem of induction are also topics for debate within naturalistic epistemology.
Lastly, naturalistic epistemology is not without criticism. Among the problems for naturalistic epistemology are the circularity problem and the problem of normativity. With regard to the aims of unifying science and philosophy, solutions to these problems are of crucial importance for naturalistic epistemologists.
W. V. Quine usually gets credit for initiating the contemporary wave of naturalistic epistemology with his essay, “Epistemology Naturalized.” In that essay, he argues for conceiving epistemology as a “chapter of psychology,” and for seeing epistemology and empirical science as containing and constraining one another.
Quine’s argument depends on three potentially controversial assumptions. First is confirmation holism – the view that only substantial bodies of theory, rather than individual claims, are empirically testable. Second, Quine assumes epistemology’s main problem is to explain the relationship between theories and their observational evidence. Third, he assumes there are only two ways to approach that problem. One is the psychological study of how people produce theoretical “output” from sensory “input,” and the other is the logical reconstruction of our theoretical vocabulary in sensory terms. In Quine’s view, the second approach cannot succeed, and so we are left with psychology.
The idea behind reconstructing theoretical vocabulary in sensory terms is to model epistemology on studies in the foundations of mathematics. Such studies show how to translate mathematical statements into the language of logic and set theory, and they show how to deduce suitably translated mathematical theorems from logical truths and set theoretic axioms. This allows us to judge the strength of our justification in believing mathematical claims: we are as justified in believing them as we are in believing the logical truths and set-theoretic axioms.
Logical Empiricists such as Rudolf Carnap sought a similar account of our justification for believing scientific theories. Given a translation of theoretical claims into observational vocabulary, we might be able to show how our theories could be derived logically from observation sentences, logical truths, and set theory.
Such a project could not be a complete success. For one thing (as Carnap was well aware), our theories cannot be derived logically from observations – the theories include generalizations covering unobserved cases. Nevertheless, such philosophers as Carnap thought the translation of theory into observational terms would be useful. It would allow us to see just how far our theories outstrip their observational evidence.
Quine emphasizes a second reason why the reconstructive approach must fail: Theoretical statements cannot, in general, be translated into purely observational vocabulary. To effect such translations, we would need to identify the observational conditions of verification (or disconfirmation) for individual theoretical statements. But, as Quine argues in his other most famous essay, “Two Dogmas of Empiricism,” individual theoretical statements do not have unique conditions of verification (or disconfirmation). Rather, we must test theoretical statements in groups large enough to have observational consequences, and the results confirm or disconfirm the groups as wholes. When the observations a theory predicts do not pan out, there is typically a wide range of adjustments we could make in response. We might, for example, give up the claim that this liquid is an acid, or the claim that this is a piece of litmus paper, or the claim we are not hallucinating, and so forth.
So, Quine’s assumption of confirmation holism undermines the possibility of reconstructing theoretical vocabulary in observational terms. Consequently, the reconstructionist approach cannot succeed. Given Quine’s other assumptions, then, the only method left for epistemology is the psychological method: to study empirically how people transform sensory input into theoretical output.
Knowledge thus approached is a natural phenomenon, the outcome of a natural process whereby sensory stimulation leads to theories about the world. To understand the connection between the stimulation and the theories – and to understand how far beyond the stimulation our theories go – we study the process scientifically. The point is not to “reconstruct” the transition, but to understand it as it actually occurs.
Quinian naturalistic epistemology is thus “contained” in psychology as a subdiscipline. Quine also notes, however, that there is a sense in which naturalistic epistemology “contains” the rest of science. Our theories and beliefs about the world, which constitute our science, are part of epistemology’s subject matter. Because they “contain” one another, epistemology and the rest of science can be mutually constraining. Not only should our scientific theories pass epistemic muster, but our epistemological theories must fit appropriately with the rest of our scientific worldview. This conception of the relationship between science and epistemology contrasts vividly with the traditional view of epistemology as “queen of the sciences.” It is probably the most influential aspect of Quine’s naturalism.
Unlike Quine, Alvin Goldman is concerned with such traditional epistemological problems as developing an adequate theoretical understanding of knowledge and justified believing. Also in contrast to Quine, he does not see epistemology as part of science. Instead, Goldman thinks that answering traditional epistemological questions requires both a priori philosophy and the application of scientific results. As he often puts it, Goldman’s naturalism is the view that epistemology “needs help” from science.
Goldman’s theory of knowledge is a form of causal reliabilism. On such a view, a justified true belief counts as knowledge only if it is caused in a suitably reliable way. To be “suitably reliable,” a belief-forming process must have a propensity to produce more true beliefs than false ones, and the process’s own causal ancestry must have a greater propensity to produce reliable processes than unreliable ones. Though Goldman argues for this view of knowledge on primarily a priori grounds – for example, by considering how well it captures our intuitive classifications of beliefs as cases of knowledge or not – the theory itself gives empirical science an important place in our understanding of knowledge.
The most obvious place where psychology matters in this theory of knowledge is in the identification and evaluation of belief-forming processes. It is psychology that tells us what processes cause our beliefs, and it is psychology that enables us to judge their reliability. Consequently, the determination whether a particular belief is a case of knowledge will turn on both philosophical and psychological considerations. Philosophically, we can say that the belief (if justified and true) is knowledge if it was caused in a suitably reliable way. The question whether it was caused in such a way, however, is a question for empirical science.
A related role for psychology is in addressing skeptical problems. If true, causal reliabilism shows only that knowledge is logically possible. (It is logically possible for a person to have justified, true beliefs caused by suitably reliable processes.) The question whether knowledge is humanly possible, and the question whether anyone actually knows anything, are both questions whose answers depend on which cognitive processes are available to humans, and on how reliable those processes are.
Goldman’s approach to epistemic justification is also reliabilist and grounded in science. The core of his view is that justification is at least partly a matter of beliefs’ being produced by reliable cognitive processes. Goldman has made numerous modifications to this view, and he has worked out its details in various ways at different times.
The account of justification Goldman now favors has two components. First, he thinks it is an important task of epistemology to clarify and describe our “epistemic folkways,” the set of our commonsense epistemological concepts and principles, including the concept of justified belief. The second component is a theory of what justified believing is, based on the principles underlying our commonsense judgments but perhaps departing from those judgments in certain cases.
To study our epistemic folkways, Goldman thinks it is necessary to examine empirically the ways in which we apply and acquire our epistemic concepts, in hopes of determining those concepts’ structures. He hypothesizes that we apply epistemic concepts to individual cases in much the same way we apply most of our concepts: by judging how similar or different a particular case is to stereotypical instances of the concept. In the case of epistemic justification, he thinks we compare the process whereby a person has come to believe something with what we take to be typical justification-conferring processes, such as perception or deduction. He contends that we take such processes to confer justification because we take them to be reliable.
Our commonsense understanding of what processes people use to arrive at their beliefs, and our commonsense assessments of their reliability, are apt to be quite different from the psychological truth of the matter. So, in Goldman’s view, it is necessary also to construct a theory of what epistemic justification really is, as opposed to how common sense takes it to be. That theory will be grounded in our psychological understanding of how beliefs are formed, and it will include assessments of those processes in terms of reliability (as well as problem-solving power and speed, though Goldman thinks those assessments are only loosely connected to justification, if at all).
Much naturalistic epistemology looks to psychology and, in certain cases, the natural sciences to develop an understanding of knowledge. Especially in the philosophy of science, however, Thomas Kuhn’s work has inspired a naturalistic approach that applies the social sciences to epistemological questions. Kuhn-inspired naturalism is not incompatible with the naturalism that draws on psychology and the natural sciences. Such naturalistic epistemologists as Alvin Goldman and Philip Kitcher have fruitfully applied insights from both the natural and the social sciences in the attempt to understand knowledge as a simultaneously cognitive and social phenomenon.
In his highly influential book, The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, Kuhn carefully examines the process of theory change in science. Unlike earlier approaches, which might, in Carnapian style, have tried to reconstruct theory changes as driven entirely by evidence, Kuhn emphasizes how rare it is that scientists reject old theories in favor of new ones on the basis of data alone. Especially in the case of “revolutionary” changes – such as the transition from Ptolemaic to Copernican astronomy – the data available to scientists can be highly ambiguous, and the data often fail to establish determinately what theoretical framework should win out.
On Kuhn’s view, scientific practice is guided by paradigms – theories, methodologies, and conceptual frameworks that give scientists examples of “good science” and shape their understanding not only of the world, but of what science itself is supposed to be like. As paradigms age, however, they build up not only a record of explanatory and predictive success, but also a record of failures and unsolved problems. Revolutions occur when scientists come to see some of the unsolved problems as both very important and unsolvable from within the reigning paradigms. New paradigms emerge, and debates rage about whether to adopt them or to stick to the old way of doing things, in hopes of eventually solving the threatening problems.
Debates about whether to give up on an old paradigm, Kuhn emphasizes, cannot be settled by the available data. One reason for this is that paradigms help scientists to decide what will and what will not count as data, and they help to determine scientists’ judgments about the import or interpretation of data. Furthermore, it is at most only rarely that a newly proposed paradigm is incremental in the sense that it provides solutions to all or most of the problems solved by the old paradigm, as well as the new problems that have raised questions about the old paradigm. For example, Kuhn attacks the common view that Newtonian mechanics is a limiting case of Relativistic mechanics. Relativity, on his view, does not solve all the Newtonian problems and others besides. Rather, it replaces the old problems with new ones it can solve. Adopting a new paradigm, in such cases, is more like changing the subject than being compelled by the rational force of evidence.
Kuhn attempts to trace the social and political factors behind theory changes in science. The available data do not unequivocally favor one paradigm over others, and scientists do not choose paradigms on the basis of data. Instead, Kuhn believes social and political forces guide paradigm changes. Thus, an adequate explanation of scientific revolutions will be an application of social, political, and historical analysis, not the logical analysis of the relationship between theories and evidence. To understand science in Kuhnian fashion, it is at least as important to understand scientists and what they do as it is to understand the theories they offer and the experiments they conduct.
Kuhn’s dual emphases on socio-political factors in theory choice and understanding science by studying the practices of scientists have led to several different strands of Kuhn-inspired naturalistic philosophy of science.
The most radical strand is the so-called “sociology of scientific knowledge,” often identified with the “strong programme” of David Bloor. At the heart of this program is a “symmetry principle,” to the effect that true and false, rational and irrational scientific beliefs are to be explained in the same way. The explanation of scientific beliefs is thus to be indifferent to the actual truth of those beliefs. This agnosticism about the truth of scientific theories leads strong programme advocates to attempt to explain almost everything scientists do and say in sociological terms, specifically avoiding any appeals to how the extra-social world is in explaining scientists’ behavior. The official agnosticism also sometimes appears to transform itself into a form of constructivism, the view that scientists and others make the world be as it is by adopting theories, instead of the world determining (at least partly) what theories scientists will or should adopt.
A much less radical strand of Kuhn-inspired philosophy of science (which also owes a debt to Quine) is to be found in the work of Larry Laudan. He offers a “reticulated model” of science, in which issues concerning scientific theories, scientific methods, and scientific aims interact with one another. On this model, theories are not adopted independently of methodological and axiological commitments, but neither are those commitments undertaken independently of theoretical commitments. As one would expect from a naturalist, much of Laudan’s case turns on details concerning the actual unfolding of the history of science.
In a somewhat similar spirit, such philosophers as Philip Kitcher and Alvin Goldman have advocated a “social epistemology” partly inspired by Kuhn. A psychological fact about the conduct of science is that it is not the mere construction of theories in the face of evidence. Rather, it is the construction of theories both in the face of evidence and from within a social context. Scientists’ theory choices thus depend on what evidence they gather and also on social and political factors, including the organization of the social structures in which they pursue knowledge. To understand how science happens, then, one must understand those social structures. As Kitcher and Goldman emphasize, however, those structures themselves can be evaluated in reliabilist terms; we can ask (and try to find out) how well a given social structure promotes the aim of producing true theories rather than false ones. Kitcher and Goldman have attempted to answer such questions, and to describe what kinds of social structures would be most conducive to the promotion of our epistemic and scientific goals.
Because naturalistic epistemologies can differ from one another so much, there is rarely a single or standard “naturalistic” approach to an issue in epistemology. Instead, different naturalists will take different approaches, depending on their precise views of the relationship between science and epistemology. This section describes some naturalistic approaches to three current issues in epistemology: the internalism/externalism debate, the problem of a priori knowledge, and the problem of induction.
The debate between internalists and externalists concerns whether anything besides mental states helps to constitute the justification of beliefs. Internalists hold that a belief is justified only if it is appropriately related to other mental states, and externalists hold that justification comes at least partly from elsewhere, for example from the reliability of the process that generated a belief.
Naturalistic epistemology is not committed to either internalism or externalism. Many, perhaps most, naturalistic epistemologists endorse reliabilist theories of justification or knowledge, and so they are externalists. Goldman in particular has been a standard-bearer for externalism.
Among naturalistic epistemologists who endorse internalism are Donald Davidson and John Pollock. Davidson’s naturalism is fairly weak, in the sense that Davidson does not directly apply much hard science to epistemological problems. Nevertheless, he does take seriously Quine’s admonition that epistemology is just one part of our going theory of the world, and he feels free to take for granted such things as the existence of the external world when it comes to explaining how we could have knowledge concerning the external world. He also holds that only another belief can justify a belief, and he thus sees justification as arising from the relationships among one’s beliefs.
Pollock endorses a view he calls “norm internalism.” He holds that beliefs are justified when formed in accord with certain internalized rules concerning the correct ways to form beliefs. Those internalized rules are, in his term, “psychologically real,” contingent features of our cognitive architecture. Nevertheless, he also thinks that experimental studies of reasoning will not be very helpful in determining the contents of the internalized rules. Rather, he thinks the best way to learn their contents is by examining our intuitions about what counts as knowledge or justified belief and what does not.
A priori knowledge, if there is any, is knowledge obtained independently of experience. Quine denies there is a priori knowledge. To know something a priori, he thinks, it would have to be analytic (that is, true in virtue of the meanings of the concepts involved), but there is no analyticity. This rejection of the a priori and analyticity is part of the package that includes Quine’s confirmation holism. In fact, Quine claims in “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” that his anti-reductionism (that is, his confirmation holism) is really the same thing as his rejection of analytic truth and a priori knowledge. It is unsurprising, then, that one might take naturalistic epistemology to be radically empiricistic and committed to the non-existence of a priori knowledge.
Recent work in naturalistic epistemology has been far more sympathetic to the a priori than Quine’s. Philip Kitcher has defended a naturalistic account of a priori knowledge that turns on the characteristics of the process that produces a belief. Roughly, he claims that one’s knowledge that p is a priori if and only if it comes from the operation of a process that would have produced knowledge that p no matter what particular experiences one might have had. It is important to note here that we cannot simply reflect on the content of a proposition to determine whether it is knowable a priori in this sense. Rather, we have to take into account the actual facts about how our minds work and see whether there is any process that would produce knowledge of that proposition regardless of one’s particular experiences. It is also doubtful that this sort of a priori knowledge could play the foundational role rationalists have typically assigned to the a priori.
Alvin Goldman has outlined a similar account of a priori knowledge. His account is based on two assumptions. First is his reliabilist account of epistemic justification. Second is the general idea that a priori knowledge is knowledge based on processes of “pure thought,” which operate independently of experience or perception. If we are able to discover that human beings have reliable innate mechanisms of ratiocination and calculation – and there is some evidence that we do – then those mechanisms are reasonably counted as conferring a priori justification on beliefs. In particular, beliefs derived from the operations of those mechanisms, without any reliance on perception, are strong candidates for a priori knowledge.
There is no standard naturalistic solution to the problem of induction, but naturalism does provide a general strategy for dealing with the problem. In broad strokes, the approach is to look at the ways in which people actually do perform inductive inferences and to evaluate those inductive methods along such dimensions as reliability.
One kind of inductive inference involves the projection of properties. For example, one might believe that robins and sparrows have Factor X in their blood, and one might then infer that cardinals also have Factor X in their blood. Hilary Kornblith advocates a naturalistic but metaphysical explanation for why such patterns of reasoning tend to be reliable. The causal structure of the world, in his view, leads to a “clustering” of properties in natural kinds. So, if bird is a natural kind, then there will be a number of properties birds have in common, and it is the causal structure of the world that “binds” those properties together. Furthermore, claims Kornblith, our best understanding of human inference points to the view that our minds are natively equipped with mechanisms tuned to the world’s causal structure and to the clustering of properties in natural kinds. In short, we are hard wired to project properties typically in cases where the projections will work, owing to the world’s causal structure.
Another kind of inductive inference, however, is probabilistic inference. For example, we might infer that the next card dealt from the deck probably will not be a heart, since only one card in four is a heart. A great deal of work has been done to study how people make probabilistic inferences, much of it initiated by Daniel Kahneman and Amos Tversky. The news here has not all been good. Our probabilistic inferences are often guided by heuristics and biases that lead us to wrong answers. This could be a case in which investigation of commonly used cognitive processes shows that they are not reliable or do not produce justified beliefs. However, some recent work on so-called “fast and frugal heuristics” aims to show that processes implementing inference patterns that are formally fallacious – that is, that violate the probability calculus – can be effective, fast, and reasonably reliable in the sorts of environments where those processes evolved.
Naturalistic epistemologies have it in common that they apply scientific methods, results, and theories to epistemological problems, though they differ in just which sciences they draw on and how central a place they give to those sciences. Despite this variation among naturalistic views, there are also some important objections to doing epistemology naturalistically at all. Two of those objections center on the Circularity Problem and the Problem of Normativity.
Many philosophers suppose one of epistemology’s most important tasks is to answer the Cartesian skeptic. Such a skeptic denies we could know most of the things we take ourselves to know, because we cannot rule out the logical possibility that we are massively deceived about the world. We might be victims of an evil demon, who is ultimately responsible for the nature of our experiences, or we might be brains in vats whose apparent experiences of an apparent external world come from a scientist armed with electrodes and chemicals.
Naturalistic epistemology seeks to explain knowledge by applying our best scientific understanding of the mind-brain. When the issue is skepticism, however, it might appear that using science would be viciously circular. Our scientific theories depend on our sensory experience, and so (says the skeptic or the anti-naturalist) we cannot legitimately appeal to those theories in explaining the possibility or actuality of perceptual knowledge (for example).
This line of objection to naturalistic epistemology is old, and Quine discusses it in “Epistemology Naturalized.” In general, advocates of naturalism have had two things to say about it.
First, they point out (as did Hume) that we simply cannot step outside our going view of the world and evaluate it with no empirical presuppositions. So, the skeptic’s demand for an external validation of science is misplaced. To understand what knowledge is and how it is possible, it is necessary to show how the phenomenon of knowledge fits into the rest of our understanding of things. The result will not be certainty that our scientific theories are correct, but we do not need that sort of certainty in order to get by.
Second, and perhaps more importantly, naturalistic epistemologists sometimes contend the circularity involved is not vicious because it does not beg the question. There is no guarantee our worldview will be self-supporting in the sense that our best scientific understanding of what knowledge is also shows that we do indeed have knowledge of the external world. It could turn out that, by their own lights, our scientific theories and our perceptual beliefs are not justified. Such a result would be disastrous, but naturalistic epistemology does not exclude it as a possibility. Even though we might not be able to validate our knowledge of the external world a priori, the fact that we can validate it at all is significant and non-trivial.
Another problem for naturalistic epistemology is explaining epistemic normativity. The ideas of knowledge and justified belief are normative in the sense that they include notions about what is right or wrong for a person to believe. Though science might be able to tell us about how people do come to believe as they do, critics of naturalistic epistemology often claim it cannot tell us about how people should come by their beliefs. This objection has been pressed by Jaegwon Kim, and it dates back at least to Wilfrid Sellars’ Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind.
Advocates of naturalistic epistemology have typically countered by emphasizing the role of our cognitive goals in normative epistemic evaluations. For example, Goldman points to true belief as one of our most important cognitive goals, and Quine discusses the “anticipation of sensory stimulation” as providing a normative checkpoint for science. Naturalistic epistemology can be normative, on this view, because it can explain and detect the causal connections between our belief-forming processes and our cognitive goals. So, one might claim, epistemic justification is a “good” property of beliefs because justified beliefs come from reliable processes, and reliable processes are those whose use tends to promote the valuable goal of believing what is true and not what is false.
Epistemic value, on this approach, is a form of instrumental value; it derives from the causal ties between cognitive means and valuable cognitive ends. Some critics of naturalistic epistemology, notably Harvey Siegel, have argued that there must be some form of non-instrumental epistemic value. In light of their criticisms, advocates of naturalistic epistemology need either to show how a scientific approach can accommodate non-instrumental value or to explain why there is no need to do so.
Naturalistic epistemologists seek an understanding of knowledge that is scientifically informed and integrated with the rest of our understanding of the world. Their methods and commitments differ, because they have varying views about the precise relationship between science and epistemology and even about which sciences are most important to understanding knowledge.
In addressing particular issues, naturalists often make one of two general sorts of moves. The first is to try to show the issue is empirical and then to apply scientific data, results, methods, and theories to it directly. This is what happens when naturalists offer accounts of a priori knowledge based on cognitive psychology, and even when they offer naturalized conceptual analyses that they take to be based on empirical information concerning how concepts are applied.
A second common naturalistic move is to undermine a problem’s motivation by showing it arises only on certain false, non-naturalistic assumptions. This is what happens when naturalists reject Cartesian skeptical problems, on the grounds those problems presuppose that our beliefs about the external world require external validation before they can be fully justified.
Despite its promise, naturalistic epistemology does face serious challenges from the problems of circularity and normativity. It is far from clear they are more serious than the challenges traditional, a priori epistemology faces, but naturalists certainly need solutions to the problems. Finding those solutions is one of the most important philosophical projects in this field that aims to unify science and philosophy.
Chase B. Wrenn
University of Alabama
U. S. A.
Last updated: May 4, 2005 | Originally published: