A large part of our exploration of the world consists in categorizing or classifying the objects and processes we encounter, both in scientific and everyday contexts. There are various, perhaps innumerable, ways to sort objects into different kinds or categories, but it is commonly assumed that, among the countless possible types of classifications, one group is privileged. Philosophy refers to such categories as natural kinds. Standard examples of such kinds include fundamental physical particles, chemical elements, and biological species. The term natural does not imply that natural kinds ought to categorize only naturally occurring stuff or objects. Candidates for natural kinds can include man-made substances, such as synthetic elements, that can be created in a laboratory. The naturalness in question is not the naturalness of the entities being classified, but that of the groupings themselves. Groupings that are artificial or arbitrary are not natural; they are invented or imposed on nature. Natural kinds, on the other hand, are not invented, and many assume that scientific investigations should discover them.
To say that a kind is natural, rather than artificial or arbitrary, means, minimally, that it reflects some relevant aspects of the world and not only the interests of, or facts about, the classifiers. The expression “footwear under $100,” for instance, describes an artificial kind reflecting some categorizer’s interest—their budget—and not some relevant feature of the classified objects.
Another feature of natural kinds is that they allow many important inferences about the entities grouped within them. Take gold: All entities classified as gold share a property—their atomic structure—that uniquely identifies a chemical element. This property also accounts for gold’s other observed properties, such as its color, malleability, and so forth. Identifying something as gold warrants many inferences and generalizations, such as that it dissolves in mercury at room temperature and is unaffected by most acids, that will apply to all samples of gold.
More problematic, but still debated as possible instances of natural kinds, are categories in higher-level sciences: psychological categories, such as emotion; psychiatric conditions, such as depression; and social categories, such as money. We might not be able to identify anything like the atomic structure of a chemical element for depression. However, one might still wonder whether people suffering from it share properties that account for their behaviors and help us explain the condition’s causes and how it might be treated. Few people, perhaps, will consider most higher-level categories, such as psychiatric conditions, to be candidates for natural kinds. Nonetheless, what makes depression a legitimate scientific category, unlike hysteria, remains to be examined.
This article describes the three most prominent accounts of natural kinds: essentialism, cluster kinds, and promiscuous realism. It spells out some of the features standardly associated with natural kinds and then examines the three views on natural kinds via specific examples of candidates for natural kinds in chemistry, biology and psychiatry. The final section discusses the metaphysics of natural kinds and offers a systematization of the possible views.
Table of Contents
- What Makes a Kind Natural?
- Three Views on Natural Kinds: Essentialism, Cluster Kinds, and Promiscuous Realism
- Metaphysics of Natural Kinds
- References and Further Reading
The philosophical tradition has long demanded that we ought to search for natural classifications in our investigation of the world. The nature of this demand can be difficult to spell out. This idea is often illustrated with Plato’s famous metaphor about “carving nature at its joints.” In Phaedrus, he says that we should “divide into forms, following the objective articulation; we are not to attempt to hack off parts like a clumsy butcher” (Plato 1952, 265e). The underlying intuition here is that the natural world is divisible into objective categories and that we should strive to discover such divisions. That is, our exploration of the world should model itself on the practice of a competent butcher who, when cutting the meat, follows its natural divisions and does not clumsily hack parts off.
Questions arise as to how we identify suitable candidates for such “natural openings” and where we should draw divisions between objects in the world. One good place to look for them would be in the discipline of particle physics because it appears that, if there are some objective divisions in nature, they will surely be found at the level of fundamental entities that comprise all existing things: protons, neutrons, electrons, or even smaller particles like quarks. That kind of reasoning was already present in ancient Greece, where attempts were made at discovering the true nature of all things, whether it was elements that everything else is composed of, like water or fire, or whether it required finding the smallest indivisible building blocks of matter, like atoms. In this respect, contemporary scientific research might be seen as a continuation of the same project.
Alternatively, one might argue that the approach of finding the most basic constituents of matter is too restrictive and that there are many other objective categories to be discovered. In geology, for instance, different rocks can be divided according to their qualities—mineral and chemical composition, permeability, texture of the constituent particles, particle size—and these can be taken as objective parameters for classification. Moreover, some authors make a case that there are natural kinds in the higher-level or special sciences such as biology, psychology, or linguistics (Fodor 1974). It could be argued, for example, that certain basic emotions, such as fear and anger, are identified and recognized across different cultures, which makes them suitable candidates for natural kinds. Similar reasoning might be applied to nonnatural or artificial entities, including cultural artifacts, such as language. The fact that certain linguistic patterns occur systematically across all natural languages may indicate that groupings of such patterns represent objective linguistic categories.
Cross-cultural convergence in classification, as in the example above of common linguistic patterns, can be interpreted in two ways. One is to say that it indicates the existence of objective categories that rational investigators will eventually discover. The other is the notion that we group things in such a way because our cognitive makeup makes those groupings especially salient to us. In this case, the grouping would not only reflect the objective structure of the world, but also our cognitive dispositions. This issue is examined in the section entitled “Metaphysics of Natural Kinds.”
In many cases, however, the classification systems are not shared, but rather vary cross-culturally, or across different scientific disciplines. Facing such situations, one might wonder whether there is one correct system or whether different ones can be equally valid. Going back to Plato’s metaphor, if different butchering traditions produced meat that is carved up differently, so that there are no T-bone steaks in England and no roasts in the US, would it mean that one of those traditions is doing it wrong, or that there are different ways to carve the meat at its joints? On this issue, we can distinguish between the position of the monists and that of the pluralists.
Natural kind monists hold that there is only one correct way of dividing the world into natural kinds, of carving nature at its joints. In such a view, no crosscutting classifications should be considered natural kinds. In case there is any overlap between different kinds, one must be a sub-kind of the other. This claim is known as the hierarchy thesis regarding natural kinds (Khalidi 2013). The isotopes of hydrogen, for instance—protium, deuterium, and tritium—can be said to constitute a sub-kind of the kind hydrogen. That is, they have the same atomic number, but different numbers of neutrons in the nucleus. Accordingly, a monist either claims that there is one natural categorization of entities in the world, and it must apply only to the lowest possible level of classification, or, if there are higher-level natural kinds, they should form a hierarchy that bottoms out at the lowest level. From this we can see that monists do not necessarily need to endorse the hierarchy thesis.
Natural kind pluralists, on the other hand, countenance different ways of classifying entities into natural kinds. In their view, entities can be cross-classified in different ways, depending on the purposes that these classifications serve. We can classify biological organisms, for instance, into species if we are interested in their ancestry or breeding patterns. But we can also classify them into ecological groupings, for instance, that of detrivores, which refers to organisms that consume decomposing organic matter and encompasses a wide array of organisms, from fungi and worms to some bacteria. In the pluralist view, we cannot claim that one of these classifications is superior and ought to be endorsed at the expense of the other. Rather, both can be useful and equally valid depending on the purposes and contexts of scientific investigation. Pluralists are not typically associated with endorsing the abovementioned hierarchy thesis, since they have no problem allowing crosscutting classifications. But a pluralist can hold the view that different classification systems, responding to diverse scientific interests, still have to be hierarchically ordered. Even if the hierarchy thesis is normally associated with a monistic approach, therefore, the monism-versus-pluralism question and the idea of a strict hierarchy of natural kinds are conceptually distinct.
b. How to Identify Natural Kinds: Their Role in Inductive Generalizations, Scientific Laws, and Explanations
So far, we have been dealing with very general questions concerning whether the world can be divided into certain privileged groupings. If indeed there are such groupings, that is, natural kinds, then it is worthwhile to establish the criteria for something to be a natural kind. Different accounts of natural kinds ascribe different features to them, but all of them, at a minimum, presuppose the following: The entities classified into a kind should share a set of common properties by which they are grouped together. This grouping of common properties ought not to be accidental. To illustrate this, we can think about cases in which we group entities together based on observable properties and then establish that there is a common cause that accounts for those properties. We note, for instance, that sunflowers (Helianthus annuus) share common observable properties—a large, usually yellow, flower head, a tall, erect stem, broad and rough leaves, and so on—and conclude that there must be an underlying explanation for such a clustering of properties. This explanation draws on the fact that all sunflower plants belong to the same species, which points to a common cause for the common properties. Regarding species in general, this common element might stem from shared ancestry or an ecological niche, exchanging genetic material through interbreeding with other species members, and so on.
The properties shared by members of a natural kind need not be directly observable. In many accounts, chemical elements are considered to be standard examples of natural kinds for which important properties shared by members of the kind are not directly observable. Take carbon, for instance. It is well known that different structures of carbon atoms constitute materials of extremely different properties, such as diamonds and graphite. Nevertheless, both diamonds and graphite are taken to be composed of the same element because they share a deep property, namely, the microstructure.
These features of natural kinds can help us see why it is useful to classify the world into such categories and indicate why natural kinds are commonly taken to play an important role in inductive inferences, scientific laws, and explanations. Let us briefly examine how the debate on natural kinds is entangled with these key issues in the philosophy of science. Classifying things into kinds according to their shared properties is theoretically and practically significant because it normally countenances inductive inferences about the members of kinds. Our previous encounters with sunflowers, for instance, allow us to infer some properties and behaviors related to this species, such as that they grow best when exposed to plenty of sun, in fertile, moist and well-drained soil; that they can be used to extract some toxic ingredients from the soil, such as arsenic or lead, and so on. Establishing the existence of stable, clustered properties associated with sunflowers thus underpins the inductive inference that future observed instances of this kind will also share some or all of those properties. This enables us to formulate relatively precise instructions for plant cultivation.
Natural kinds also play an important role in laws of nature or scientific laws. How this role is characterized and explained depends on the exact account of scientific laws one endorses (see the article on Laws of Nature). Consider copper as a candidate for a natural kind. All instances of copper share some common properties: They are soft, malleable, and ductile, with a reddish-orange color. These observable features can be accounted for by the atomic structure of copper, namely that it has a nucleus containing 29 protons and 34 to 36 neutrons and it is surrounded by 29 electrons localized in 4 shells. Like other metals, it consists of a lattice of atoms and has a single electron in the outer shell that does not remain connected to particular atoms but forms an electron cloud spreading through the lattice. This cloud, containing many dissociable electrons, makes the conduction of electric currents possible. These facts about the atomic structure of copper allow us not only to infer that a subsequently observed instance of copper will conduct electricity, but also to establish it as a scientific law of the following form: “All pure copper conducts electricity.”
The plausibility of this assumption about natural kinds depends on how stringently we construe natural laws. For instance, it is often taken that laws are necessary, exceptionless, and universal. Specifically, natural kind essentialists, as further explained in section 4.a, hold that there ought to be some common properties, that is, essences, shared by all and only members of a kind. The existence of these unique properties would, in turn, ground the idea that laws of nature necessarily hold with respect to members of natural kinds. In this view, it also follows that natural kinds ought to be categorically distinct; that is, there can be no continuum or smooth transition between different kinds. Rather, there should be some natural boundaries between them. Many authors argue, however, that essentialism is not the best account of natural kinds because it excludes many scientific categories such as those in biology, psychology, and other special sciences that do not fulfill its demanding criteria (Dupré 1981, Khalidi 2013).
The assumption that natural kinds play an important role in inductive inferences and scientific laws explains the widespread belief that natural kinds are important for scientific explanations. We saw how the atomic structure of copper explains its observable properties, such as electric conductivity. Establishing a common cause or mechanism that accounts for the grouping of properties in nature also provides an explanation for the behavior of entities thus classified. It must be noted, however, that the role natural kinds play in scientific explanations also depends on the notion of scientific explanation that one endorses (see the article on Theories of Explanation).
Thus far, the assumption has been that natural kinds are characterized by shared common properties, which in turn account for their role in inductive generalizations, scientific laws, and explanations. However, if we start with the assumption that natural kinds are those categories that play important roles in scientific inferences and theories, we ought to address the question of whether functional kinds, which are important in many scientific disciplines, are natural kinds. This issue is addressed in the next subsection.
Functional kinds are defined as groups of entities united by a common function—that is, by their activities and causal roles. Common examples include biological kinds, such as predator and prey; psychological kinds, such as pain; and artifact kinds, such as knives. What connects all these examples is that the entities in question are grouped together because of something they do, and not because they share similar underlying properties. Very different species of animals can belong to the predator category, such as jaguar, human, rattlesnake, or stork. Similarly, very different kinds of things can be used as a knife, from a piece of a sharp stone or glass to steel blades specifically manufactured for cutting food. This phenomenon is referred to as multiple realizability of functional types or kinds (see the article Mind and Multiple Realizability), and it has been a widely discussed topic in the philosophy of mind with regard to mental kinds, like pain.
On the one hand, one might argue that mental kinds, such as pain, cannot be taken to be natural kinds because they cannot be reduced to paradigmatic physical kinds. It is plausible that very different types of creatures can feel pain. For instance, it is plausible that humans, squids, and snakes can experience pain, although they have very different types of neurophysiological architectures. If pain can be realized by different physical states, however, then it seems that pain could only be a “widely disjunctive” and disunified kind, in the sense that in humans it is realized by one set of neuropsychological states, in squids by another, in snakes by still another set, and so on and so forth for different species. Some authors have concluded on these grounds that it is impossible to unify or reduce categories of special sciences to the more basic categories that we find in the physical sciences, which provide paradigmatic examples of natural kinds (Fodor 1974).
On the other hand, functional kinds, such as pain, play important roles in scientific explanations in various disciplines of special sciences, psychology being the most prominent example. Thus, if they play such an important role in the special sciences, it is worthwhile to examine them as candidates for natural kinds in such disciplines. Some see the fact that functional kinds play such an important role in scientific explanations as a reason to assume that they are not really multiply realizable and thus widely disjunctive, and that the properties important for realizing a function need to be shared by the entities grouped together. Alternatively, other authors argue that natural kinds can be multiply realizable and that functional kinds can be considered instances of natural kinds (Ereshefsky and Reydon 2015).
The topic of natural kinds gained momentum in the second half of the twentieth century in relation to two philosophical debates: the debate on paradoxes of confirmation and inductive inferences in the philosophy of science and the debate on theories of reference in the philosophy of language. Let us start with the first issue, since it relates to the aforementioned role that natural kinds play in inductive inferences.
Views of natural kinds that emphasize their role in inductive inferences face Goodman’s new riddle of induction (see the article on Confirmation and Induction). Nelson Goodman (1983) argued that there are innumerable ways to draw inductive inferences from a given data set. For instance, from the same data set consisting of green emeralds, we can infer either that all emeralds are green or that all emeralds are “grue,” a word Goodman invented for the purpose of this argument. “Grue” is a predicate that is defined relative to some fixed time: Something is grue if it was observed prior to the year 2050, and is green, or it is observed after the year 2050 and is blue. Drawing the inductive inference that all observed instances of grue emeralds allow us to conclude that all emeralds are grue, which leads to a paradoxical situation in which observing instances of green emeralds in the past can serve as an inductive basis for inferring that in the future, blue emeralds will be observed. We consider the induction based on the concept “green” to be acceptable and reject the induction based on “grue.” This indicates that the choice of kind concepts matters for preferring certain inductive inferences. The question arises as to how, or on what basis, we can draw the line between concepts that are suitable for inductive generalizations and those that are not.
Willard van Orman Quine (1969) introduced natural kinds as a solution to Goodman’s grue paradox and argued that what makes concepts projectable and suitable for inductive generalizations is the fact that they refer to kinds. Natural kinds are sets whose members share similar properties. This does not entirely solve Goodman’s problem, however, since, according to Quine, natural kinds rest on an even more problematic notion of similarity. That is, to know how to classify objects into kinds, we already need to have an account of what makes properties similar in relevant aspects. In his view, our standards for judging similarity are preset, that is, they are a part of our cognitive setup, and are needed for any learning to occur. The main question is why we should assume that our similarity standards track some real groupings in nature. Quine’s answer is that we are successful in making inductions because our similarity spaces have evolved through natural selection, by a process of trial and error. Goodman’s solution to the problem he articulated is, simply, that certain concepts, for example, “green,” are better entrenched in our usage and language than others, such as “grue.” This means that we have used them more and have been successful in doing so. Thus, groupings that have proven to be inductively successful have become entrenched in our language.
A natural kind essentialist answers this problem by claiming that concepts suitable for inductive generalizations are those that correspond to the real, mind-independent groupings in nature and are characterized by shared essences. Non-essentialists, however, cannot endorse this answer because they contend that we do not have access to mind-independent divisions, even if they exist. They do not think that we can identify certain properties that all and only members of a kind share and in virtue of which they belong to natural kinds.
A different route to the topic of natural kinds was the debates on theories of reference, specifically, Saul Kripke’s (1972) and Hilary Putnam’s (1975) essentialist views on natural kinds. These views were inspired by the problems of the semantics of natural kind terms. Both Kripke and Putnam argue against descriptivist theories of meaning of natural kind terms (see the article on Gottlob Frege) that identify the meaning of a term with the description of properties associated with that term. In the case of the term “water,” for instance, the description that it is a clear, odorless, colorless, and drinkable liquid fixes its meaning. Kripke and Putnam argue, instead, that even if all the descriptions we associate with a natural kind term are false, we can still refer to that kind.
In Putnam’s Twin Earth thought experiment (see the article on Internalism and Externalism in the Philosophy of Mind and Language), he asks us to imagine a situation in which there is Twin Earth, a planet that is exactly like Earth except for one difference: Instead of water, there is superficially the same liquid, but with a different chemical composition. That is, instead of H2O, it consists of XYZ. People on Twin Earth also refer to this liquid as “water.” But if we ask whether people on Earth and people on Twin Earth refer to the same stuff when they say “water,” the answer seems to be no. This means that there is more to reference than the description associated with a kind term. Putnam shows that something external to the user, namely the objective causal relations with the referent, are relevant for fixing the meaning of natural kind terms. What characterizes all instances of a kind is the fact that they bear some relation to other members of a kind; in the case of water, this is the relation of being the same liquid, that is, having the same chemical microstructure with other samples of water.
Kripke and Putnam advanced and popularized an essentialist view of natural kinds that many considered to be acceptable because it did not construe kind essences as elusive properties, but as something discoverable by scientific inquiry. This view, however, provoked reactions from philosophers dealing with special sciences, such as biology, psychology, psychiatry, and so forth, where scientific classifications do not fulfill the essentialist criteria (for an exhaustive overview and criticism of Kripke-Putnam’s version of essentialism, see LaPorte 2003). This has led to accounts of natural kinds that aim to loosen the criteria that determine which categories can constitute them, the most popular being the clustering accounts of kinds that take natural kinds to pick out clusters of properties, where members of a kind do not need to share unique essences, but rather, a certain amount of common properties where these properties are shared for nonarbitrary reasons. Section 3.b further discusses clustering accounts.
Other, more metaphysically minded philosophers, inspired by the work of Kripke and Putnam, started to develop an approach that has been termed scientific essentialism (Bird 2007, Ellis 2001). This view claims that the fundamental laws of nature hold because of essential properties of natural kinds. Thus, given that natural laws are grounded in the natural kind structure of the world, it is their essences that explain why the laws of nature are, in fact, metaphysically necessary. Roughly put, entities in the world must behave the way they do because of their natures. Scientific essentialists are usually concerned with fundamental kinds such as electrons, whose essential properties, like electric charge and mass, cause all their lawful behaviors.
The abovementioned contrasting reactions to essentialist views on natural kinds reflect a more general juxtaposition on how to approach the natural kinds debate. On the one side, there are authors, such as the scientific essentialists, who are more interested in the metaphysical problems and conceive of natural kinds as the most fundamental groupings of entities in the world. They tend to endorse very rigorous views on what it takes for a kind to be natural. Certain interpretations of essentialism are compatible with such an approach. On the other side, there are authors who are mainly oriented toward actual scientific practice and tend to assume that successful scientific classifications can be used as paradigmatic cases of natural kinds, and that the job of the philosophical accounts of natural kinds is to track the main features of such classifications and offer an account of natural kinds that will be able to encompass the scientific practice (Kendig 2015).
The next section provides an overview of the three most prominent accounts of natural kinds, starting with essentialism. The overview follows this general tendency to start with a strict philosophical account of natural kinds, and then to offer more relaxed criteria that take into consideration the data coming from the practice of scientific classification. Even essentialism, as the most demanding view, has been interpreted in different ways with the aim of capturing existing scientific categories. After essentialism, two more encompassing views are presented: cluster kinds, a view that emphasizes the clustering of properties specific to members of a kind without requiring the possession of unique kind essences, and, finally, the category of promiscuous kinds, which is the most liberal, allowing for members of a kind to have a small number of shared properties if they serve certain explanatory purposes.
The three main views on natural kinds—essentialism, cluster kinds, and promiscuous kinds—are illustrated using specific examples from different scientific disciplines. The chemical elements are used to exemplify essentialism, since they are the most commonly used example of essentialist categories. The cluster kind view has been advanced as a reaction to the inadequacy of essentialism to capture many scientific classifications; biological species, being the most prominent among them, will be used to illustrate this account. Lastly, promiscuous realism, the most relaxed account of natural kinds, will be illustrated by invoking the example of psychiatric categories, which many consider to be highly disputable candidates for natural kinds. Since promiscuous realism allows even folk categories to count as natural kinds and allows for a vast range of interests to play an important role in establishing what constitutes a natural kind, psychiatric categories represent an interesting case study in which both scientific and practical concerns may be taken for establishing which classifications ought to be taken as relevant. It needs to be emphasized that the decision to illustrate the main accounts of natural kinds with these specific examples does not imply that these accounts are suitable only for those categories or those disciplines. Often, even though not necessarily so, authors proposing an account of natural kinds assume that it can be applied to all instances of natural kinds, regardless of the scientific discipline in question.
According to essentialism, natural kinds are groupings of entities that share a common essence—intrinsic properties or structure(s) uniquely possessed by all and only members of a kind. An intrinsic property is a property that an entity has independently of any other things, while an extrinsic property is the one that a thing has in virtue of some relations or interactions with other entities. The basic idea is that the essence causes and explains all other observable shared properties of the members of a kind and allows us to draw inductive inferences and formulate scientific laws about them. Chemical elements are used as standard examples of paradigmatic candidates for essentialist natural kinds. Their intrinsic properties—that is, the structures of their atoms—determine their observable properties. Take the case of hydrogen: Its atoms consist of a single proton in the nucleus and a single electron in the atomic shell. The structure of hydrogen atoms determines the bonds it can form with other entities and compounds, such as the molecular structure of the chemical compound H2. These molecular forms then determine other properties of hydrogen, such as its colorlessness, odorlessness, tastelessness, and high combustibility at normal temperatures. They also account for its prevalence in molecular forms, such as water and organic compounds, because it has a disposition to form covalent bonds with nonmetallic elements. This makes the atomic structure of hydrogen its essence, a property that is shared by all hydrogen atoms and not shared by atoms of any other element.
Many essentialists think of the periodic table of elements as a perfect illustration of how things in the world are divided into natural kinds. In our exploration of nature, we can find different substances with a range of properties, but a further examination shows that they all belong to some basic categories clearly distinct from one another. Upon further examination, we find that this distinctiveness is a consequence of their intrinsic properties. The fact that chemical elements form natural kinds in virtue of their shared essences accounts for the fact that they ground scientific laws and inductive generalizations. For instance, knowing that something is a hydrogen gas allows us to infer that it will spontaneously react with chlorine and fluorine at room temperatures, thus forming potentially hazardous acids.
Essentialism requires natural kinds to be discrete or categorically distinct. Alternatively, if there were smooth or continuous transitions from one kind to another, this would mean that we should decide, perhaps arbitrarily so, where to draw the line of demarcation between them. The essentialist holds that essences are supposed to provide us with an objective criterion for where to draw such lines. Exactly the requirement that members of each kind ought to share a unique essence excludes vague or unclear cases when we cannot clearly determine to which kind an entity belongs. Brian Ellis (1999), for instance, takes the discreteness of chemical categories as scientific evidence that the world is structured into essentialist kinds. He contends that if there were a smooth transition between different kinds, then the demarcation between them would not be drawn by nature; rather, we would have to decide where to draw the line.
Essentialists are typically, but not necessarily, monists. They typically hold that there is a single correct way of dividing the world into natural kinds. In this view, it might seem that categories are natural only if they constitute a unique way of organizing phenomena under investigation. In that case, there could be no crosscutting categories in the domain under investigation. Humans and dogs, for example, are classified into the category mammals, but dogs and crocodiles (which are not mammals) can be classified into the category quadruped. In such cases, a monist ought to claim that one of these categories is not a natural kind, that is, for instance, that dogs and crocodiles are natural kinds, while quadrupeds are not. It appears though, that monists can accept overlapping classifications if they are hierarchically ordered, which means that in cases in which there is overlap between two different kinds, one must be a sub-kind of the other. Linnaean taxonomy is an example of a hierarchically ordered classification with seven different ranks of classification, starting with species at the lowest level, and ending up with kingdom at the top as the widest category, encompassing all the others. Humans are thus classified into the species Homo sapiens, but also into the class mammals and the kingdom animals, but species is a subcategory of a class, and a class is a subcategory of kingdom.
Nonetheless, the idea of crosscutting categories is not necessarily incompatible with essentialism. In nuclear physics, if we focus on patterns of radioactive decay and the stability of elements undergoing decay, then chemical elements can be classified in a way that crosscuts standard classification as captured by the periodic table. Radionuclides, for instance, are unstable atoms with excess nuclear energy that undergo radioactive decay. They can occur naturally or artificially. Examples include tritium, a radionuclide and an isotope of hydrogen, and carbon-14, a radioactive isotope of carbon. If we were to build a classification system that is based on the stability of radioactive atoms, it would be different from the standard chemical classification into elements, but one can still argue that it would track certain essences or essential properties.
In the philosophy of chemistry, microstructuralism is the essentialist view according to which chemical kinds ought to be individuated solely according to their microstructural properties (Hendry 2006), like the nuclear structure represented by the atomic number for chemical elements. While higher-level, observable properties can be used to identify what kind some entity belongs to, the microstructure has explanatory priority, and is the real arbiter of whether something belongs to a kind, because it is responsible for all the other properties and relations into which the entity can enter. The problem that microstructuralists face, however, is whether they can demonstrate that microstructural properties really have this potential and specify what the relevant microstructural similarities are. In addition, they need to explain why, in general, we should privilege groupings based on microstructure, as opposed to some other way of classifying things.
Let us grant, for example, that the essence of water is its H2O molecular structure. If we take an individual molecule of water, it will not have the observable properties we commonly associate with water. Moreover, water is more accurately described as containing H2O, OH-, H3O+ and some other less common ions. The problem is not that we do not know what the microstructure of water is; the problem is that there is no one microstructure responsible for the observed properties. In fact, the observed properties are a result of very complex and ever-changing interactions. It is correct to say that the average ratio of atoms of H and O is 2:1 but the observable properties of water do not depend upon this ratio. Rather, they depend upon the interactions between the dissociated ions.
It is far from straightforward to specify what exactly structural similarity amounts to, since this appears to be a matter of degree. It is unclear how much microstructural similarity is enough to individuate a natural kind. If we are focusing on the nuclear properties of atoms, we can target nuclear charge, where the atomic number—that is, the number of protons in the nucleus—is relevant for establishing a kind, in this case the kind chemical element. Alternatively, we can target nuclear mass, and reach a classification into isotopes. Isotopes have the same nuclear charge and undergo the same reactions at different rates, but the differences between them can be significant. Take the example of isotopes of uranium, uranium-235 and uranium-238. Different numbers of neutrons give these isotopes very different properties; one is stable and the other radioactive. Furthermore, take the example of chiral molecules, which have a similar structure but different dispositions due to their components being differently geometrically configured, one being a mirror image of the other. The question can be posed as to whether enantiomers—molecules that are mirror images of chiral molecules—form a separate kind according to microstructuralism.
When we go to the classification of macromolecules such as proteins, we reach a problem of justifying classification based on microstructural properties, since they are standardly individuated by their functions. This has led some authors to propose a pluralism about macromolecular classification (Slater 2009). Microstructuralists can accept a form of pluralism as long as the kind essences are microstructural properties. Introducing functional properties of the macromolecules, however, goes beyond the scope of microstructuralism. Essentialists, more generally, as was already noted, can accept such pluralistic positions and allow, for instance, that the classification of chemical elements based on their atomic number stems from an interest in explaining particular material transformations and that chemical classifications might have been very different if we had started out with different interests (Hendry 2010). Thus, if we are interested in the behavior of biological macromolecules, we can classify them according to function rather than structural properties.
Such pluralist forms of essentialism can encompass a much wider range of scientifically interesting categories, but at a cost of reducing the importance of the role played by essences in causing and explaining all other properties typically associated with kind members. If we allow that a diverse range of interests tracks different essences, and we group the same entities into many crosscutting classifications, then essences would not play as important a role as has been assumed. The basic essentialist idea is that when we know which natural kind an entity belongs to, we can infer many important properties of that kind, exactly because the essence is responsible for all those shared properties. If, on the other hand, there are many different essences that we can track, and that, accordingly, enable the grouping of the same entities into different, crosscutting categories, then knowing the essence and which category an entity belongs to would not give us full information about the entity we are investigating. Rather, it would give us only partial information, depending on specific interests that lead us to investigate some group of entities.
Perhaps the most powerful objection leveled against essentialism is that it is inapplicable to kinds in many non-fundamental sciences. Biological species, for instance, which were taken as standard examples of natural kinds, do not fulfill essentialist requirements. Moreover, essentialism seems to be incompatible with the Darwinian theory of evolution. There are no properties of species that all and only members of a species share. But even if we were to find some, we would expect that they could easily be changed by evolutionary mechanisms, such as mutation, recombination, and random drift. These considerations have led many authors to conclude that essentialism is not a satisfactory view of natural kinds (see, for instance, Sober 1994, Wilson, Barker and Brigandt 2007) and to declare “the death of essentialism” (Ereshefsky 2016).
The essentialists respond by restricting natural kinds to the more fundamental sciences, such as physics and possibly chemistry (see, for instance, Ellis 2008). The idea is that natural kinds refer to the groupings discovered by those sciences and the scientific classifications of higher-level sciences do not refer to natural kinds. Other philosophers reconceptualized essentialism to countenance essences as extrinsic or relational properties and not only as intrinsic ones. The property of being a descendant of a certain ancestor, for example, might be essential for belonging to a species. Acceptance of such a view, however, represents a significant departure from standard essentialism. Even though being a descendant of a Canis lupus familiaris might be a necessary and sufficient condition for belonging to the kind dog, this relation does not seem to play the role standardly associated with kind essences. The main motivation for essentialism is that possessing an essence accounts for the similarity of members of a kind. If we have a case where we can point to some common essence, but this essence does not guarantee that members of a kind will share important properties, then the essence does not play the role it was supposed to play. The fact that members of some species share a certain ancestor can cause many similarities between them, but there might also be many significant differences between them. Different breeds of dog, for instance, share a common ancestor, which makes them similar in certain respects, but they are also dissimilar in salient respects. For example, Siberian Huskies, with their double layered coats, are adapted for cold environments, while Border Collies are well equipped to withstand heat. Thus, sharing a common ancestor does not in any way guarantee that members of a kind will share a certain set of properties and thereby does not play the role that essence is supposed to play.
The problems that arise when we try to apply an essentialist account to many categories in the special or higher-level sciences, most notably, to the category of species in biology, have prompted relaxing the constraints proposed by essentialist views. The most established of such reactions is the proposal that natural kinds should be identified with clustered properties and not essential ones. In the next section, the cluster approaches to natural kinds are presented through the example of biological species, one of the main examples used to illustrate the adequacy of cluster approaches, especially in opposition to essentialism.
Cluster kind approaches offer a less strict view of natural kinds. In accordance with these views, to belong to a kind, its members need not to share a set of necessary and sufficient properties; it is enough that they share some subset of properties that tend to cluster together due to some underlying common causes. The main idea is that nature is structured in such a way that properties are not randomly distributed across space-time; rather, they are systematically “sociable” (Chakravartty 2007), in the sense that families of properties form stable clusters. Natural kinds are categories that pick out such clusters of properties. This is a much more encompassing view than essentialism because none of the properties are necessary for kind membership, it is sufficient that some of them are shared, and there is no requirement for a clear-cut division between members of a kind and nonmembers.
Many philosophers of biology recognized the inadequacy of essentialism to account for species (Hull 1965, Sober 1994). It is hard to find traits that are uniquely shared by all and only members of a single species. According to evolutionary theory, any common trait can easily be changed through mutation, drift, or recombination. Since selection acts upon differences between traits, variation, rather than similarity, is the rule in the biological world and the fuel of evolution. Thus, practicing biologists do not classify organisms by identifying something like an essence that species members share; they do it by tracing phylogenetic relations (that is, ancestor-descendent relations or the evolutionary history of species members), interbreeding patterns, ecological niches, and so forth.
These considerations prompted a view that species are individuals, rather than biological kinds (Ghiselin 1974, Hull 1978). Similarly to functioning organisms, individuals are ontologically characterized by having spatiotemporally restricted and causally interconnected parts. In this view, to belong to a species does not mean that its members share some common properties but, rather, that they belong to an evolving lineage whose parts causally interact.
Richard Boyd (1991, 1999) introduced the Homeostatic Property Cluster (HPC) theory as an alternative view that can accommodate the idea that species are natural kinds. HPC characterizes natural kinds as clusters of co-occurring properties underpinned by homeostatic mechanisms that cause and sustain the property clusters. According to Boyd, biological kinds are good candidates for a natural kind cluster; species members share many, but not necessarily all, properties that are caused by various mechanisms, such as sharing a common ancestor, sharing an ecological niche, gene exchange, or common developmental mechanisms. This view allows for the possibility that there are many variations and differences between members of a species, while acknowledging that traits and properties of members of the same biological species are clustered due to the aforementioned mechanisms.
A problem for the HPC view is that, in some cases, properties of members of a kind need not be products of underlying homeostatic mechanisms. Since members of species vary in traits, for example, they might also vary in the underlying mechanisms that cause them. Consequently, we can have different underlying mechanisms distributed across a species that cause different traits in species members, such as human blood types, which are caused by different underlying genetic mechanisms. Unless we have a criterion for which of the traits and their underlying mechanisms are somehow more important or essential, it is up to us whether we will focus on the shared mechanisms that cause similarities between species members, or on the ones that are heterogeneous and case differences between species members.
In addition, it has been claimed that the focus on underlying mechanisms is too restrictive and diverts attention from what really needs to be explained, that is, is the stability and cohesiveness of properties that occur together. Thus, even less restrictive accounts have been offered, such as the Stable Property Cluster (SPC) view (Slater 2014). In this view, a grouping is considered a natural kind if it consists of clusters of stable properties and this stability is due to the instantiation of some of the properties that warrant a probabilistically reliable inference that other properties are instantiated as well. For this inference, it is not necessary to trace the underlying causes of such stability.
The main advantage of HPC and related clustering views—that they are much more permissive than essentialism—can also prompt worries. Unless one is very strict on how to individuate clusters of properties and/or their underlying causes, these accounts have the problem of determining how many clustered properties are enough to consider something a natural kind. A potential worry is that these accounts are overly liberal and that any clustering of properties might comprise a natural kind. This would go against the commonsense intuition that natural kinds pick out groupings that are in some sense privileged.
There are authors, nonetheless, who do not see this as a problem and who defend a view that natural kinds should not be considered some privileged subset of categories (Dupré 1981). According to such views, there are many sameness relations in the world that we pick out depending on our interests, and they all can qualify as natural kinds. The next section reviews such account, promiscuous realism. As its name suggests, this account allows that many diverse interests can play a role in determining which grouping should count as a natural kind, thereby substantially expanding the set of categories considered natural kinds. Promiscuous realism is illustrated through psychiatric classifications. Many consider psychiatric categories to be problematic because there is often much heterogeneity among category members and there are many possible interests and relevant criteria for picking out psychiatric groupings. However, one cannot deny that those categories are scientifically useful and play an important role, both in scientific research and in practical contexts, which makes it interesting to examine whether there is a suitable philosophical account that might capture such categories, and promiscuous realism appears to be a fitting candidate.
According to promiscuous realism, depending on our interests and aims, there are many ways of classifying entities into kinds. This position was introduced by John Dupré (1981) and a similar view was also proposed, under the name of pluralistic realism, by Philip Kitcher (1984). Dupré holds that there are many sameness relations that can be used to distinguish different natural kinds and that none of those relations are privileged. That is, different entities can share some similarities with members of one group and some with members of another group, and which group we pick out as relevant will depend on our interests. This view is realist because it involves the criterion that something counts as a natural kind if its members share at least some similarities, even if minimal. Those similarities need to be some objective features of the world and not facts about us. For example, the fact that we group some things together would not count as a common property that can serve as a basis for classification. This view therefore excludes as nonnatural classifications of entities which do not share any common properties. Different aims and interests will tend to produce different classifications, and those classifications can be taken as natural kinds if the members share at least some common properties that cause those entities to be categorized together in the first place.
While the cluster kind approaches have the problem of specifying where, exactly, to draw the line between clusters of properties that correspond to natural kinds and those that do not, promiscuous realism sidesteps this issue. If divisions between kinds come on a continuum and there are no clear cutoff points, promiscuous realism allows us to regard as natural kinds all classifications that group together entities that have at least some objective properties in common. This does not mean that all classifications are on equal footing. We can still consider some to better serve our purposes than others or to be better used in different contexts, but all of them can be considered natural in this minimal sense. This is a much more sweeping account of natural kinds because it countenances a wider range of categories as natural.
Dupré introduced this view by offering the example of different crosscutting categorizations into species, depending on which species concept is used in various biological subdisciplines, and classification practices outside biology. One of the hallmarks of promiscuous realism is that it does not prioritize scientific classifications over folk categories. Dupré (1981) provides examples of cases in which folk classifications do not correspond to biological classifications. For instance, our classification into butterflies and moths cross-classifies with the biological one. In fact, in many cases our classifications will be coarser-grained or finer-grained depending on our interests. What we call lilies, for instance, belong to the numerous genera of the lily family (Liliaceae), but our folk naming practice does not include the entire family, since we exclude onions and garlics that also belong to the same family. Dupré’s argument is that we should not try to change our folk categorizations to correspond to scientific ones because they often serve different purposes. We sort some plants of the lily family together because of their aesthetic properties, while we exclude garlics and onions because they serve culinary or other purposes. All these classifications can be considered natural and we can use one or the other depending on our interests and aims.
The promiscuous kind account has also been recognized as suitable for psychiatric classifications. It might seem that a psychiatric classification normally picks out a homogenous group of symptoms whose underlying cause(s) can be discovered and consequently treated, as described by the cluster kind accounts. This, however, is not what we often find in the actual practice of psychiatric classification. In this context, it seems even harder than in biology to find a stable cluster of common properties like symptoms or behaviors that are underpinned by a joint causal mechanism (Cooper 2012). Derek Bolton (2012) argues that the standard approach of classifying psychiatric conditions, starting with surface characteristics and then looking for their etiology to ensure reliability, is not as fruitful as it was initially assumed and that we should stop hoping that the etiology of psychiatric conditions will deliver one optimal classification scheme. Depending on our interests and pragmatic considerations, different types or subtypes of psychiatric categories will be taken as relevant. Thus, we might start using different sets of criteria to identify schizophrenia depending on our research interests. Those who are interested in treatment might parse out the symptoms and other criteria differently than those searching for the genetic causes of the condition. For this reason, it seems that promiscuous kinds can better account for classifications in psychiatry.
The fruitfulness of this approach can be illustrated by the introduction of biomarkers for marking biological correlates of different psychiatric conditions. The idea is to identify a biological causal chain or its correlates—for example, specific brain activation patterns—that underlie psychological and social characteristics associated with a psychiatric condition. The paradigmatic success story of this approach is the case of neurosyphilis, a disease that is characterized by psychiatric symptoms that are caused by the bacterium spirochete Treponema pallidum. Another example is a large project aimed at collecting genetic, biochemical and imaging data for a population that has a high risk for Alzheimer’s disease. This has led to proposals for new classification schemes, based on biological features that measure the presence of a disease.
The problem with this type of approach is that it is not justified to expect that for every familiar psychiatric condition, normally identified by behavioral and psychological symptoms, we will find a common pathway that underpins those psychiatric symptoms, as in the case of neurosyphilis. In fact, not many have been found (Buckholtz and Meyer-Lindenberg 2012). More often, we find a diversity of symptoms with diverse etiologies constituting one psychiatric condition. While for some this might constitute a reason to discard psychiatric conditions, or most of them, as candidates for psychiatric natural kinds (for a discussion, see Murphy 2017), promiscuous realists would allow that even a minimum of shared properties is enough to consider something a natural kind, if the classification serves some purpose.
While promiscuous realism has the advantage of encompassing many classifications that would not be considered natural on the cluster accounts, it can be objected that it is too liberal in doing so. All categorizations that are at least minimally grounded in the causal structure of the world can be considered natural kinds. This might seem odd; since one of the starting points of the debate was the intuition that the objective structure of the world allows us to pick out some privileged groupings, ordinarily it is taken that those are the ones discovered through scientific inquiry, and that such groupings are superior to our everyday folk categories. In the promiscuous realist view, we can still privilege certain groupings, like the scientific categories, as being more explanatory or predictive, but it is not so that these groupings are natural and that the folk ones, for example, are not. All those categories can be considered natural kinds, and to prioritize some over others will have to be justified by invoking our interests.
This does not necessarily present a problem since, in some contexts, we do not need scientific classifications. When cooking, for example, we might have more use for “The Scoville Heat Scale,” a measure of the hotness of chili peppers according to the concentration of capsaicin, a chemical compound that produces heat sensation, than for the botanical classification of chili pepper plants. In the context of scientific research, however, we could use some further guidance for favoring classifications that are better grounded. Thus, it seems desirable to have a further requirement that goes beyond some minimum of shared properties that can serve some or other purpose or interest. Promiscuous realists can respond by stating that the relevant properties and interests ought to be related in systematic ways. Additionally, we can refine the demands on scientific classifications by adding constraints on the purposes that classifications serve. While the classification of people into right-handed and left-handed, for example, is based on a property that members of these groups share, and it can serve some minimal purposes like informing us what kind of scissors to produce, it is not a very useful category because it is minimally informative. Thus, we can add that we should favor those scientific categories that are information rich and that can accommodate many of our interests.
To go back to psychiatric conditions, while, for some purposes, it might be useful to group together shy people or anxious people, these groups are commonly considered to be too heterogeneous to be considered natural kinds. The introduction of constraints on classifications that are focused on our interests and aims, and not only on the amount or importance of shared properties, brings us to the question of whether we ought to consider natural kinds to be groupings that exist independently of mind and can be discovered by us, or whether which kinds we consider natural is always related to us, the investigators. The first thesis is associated with a realist understanding of natural kinds, and the second one with an antirealist understanding, but one should be very careful in formulating what exactly it means to be a realist or antirealist about natural kinds. The next section further examines this issue and provides a taxonomy of the various realist and antirealist positions. The section also problematizes the reason the three main accounts of natural kinds presented in this section are commonly taken as realist views and discusses how to differentiate different antirealist views according to the way they demarcate which interests are taken as relevant for establishing what constitutes a natural kind.
Realism about some entity or domain P states that P exists, and that it exists independently of us, the cognizers, that is, independently of our classificatory practices, conceptual schemas, beliefs, values, and so on. One can be a realist about everyday objects, for instance, such as chairs, rocks, buildings, and trees—but also about intangible entities like numbers or moral value. Those who are antirealists about everyday objects, numbers or moral value generally do not claim that such things do not exist tout court. Rather, they hold that such entities depend on us and would not exist were there no creatures who can respond to them. Accordingly, natural kinds realists are committed to the view that natural kinds exist independently of mind. When we talk about entities belonging to a kind, it seems straightforward to establish what it would mean that they exist independently of mind. For instance, on one hand, mental states are necessarily mind dependent. On the other hand, most people will agree that rocks and mountains exist independently of mind, that is, they would exist even if there were no one to perceive them or think about them. When we talk about groupings of such entities into kinds, however, there are at least two possible interpretations of the claim that groupings themselves are mind independent.
In one interpretation, to say that natural kinds exist independently of mind means that they exist as separate entities. Usually, this claim is taken to imply that natural kinds are universals, a special type of repeatable entity that can be instantiated with many particular objects (see the article on Universals). Realism about natural kinds as universals has been called strong realism (Bird and Tobin 2015). There are alternative views, however. For instance, kinds might exist as particulars or as some special sui generis entities (Hawley and Bird 2011). This debate relates to the more general question regarding the metaphysics of properties and is not discussed further in this article. Here, the focus is on debates on natural kinds in the philosophy of science.
In the second interpretation, natural kinds exist independently of mind in the sense that there are divisions in nature that obtain independently of our classificatory practices. The assumption is that the world is structured in such a way that certain ways of classifying it, or carving it up, are correct solely in virtue of that structure. This view has been called weak realism about natural kinds, or naturalism (Bird and Tobin 2015). Weak realism or naturalism seems to be consistent with natural kinds nominalism. Even though weak realists hold that there is a metaphysical difference between natural and nonnatural classifications, it does not automatically follow that this difference needs to be spelled out in terms of a special ontological category of natural kinds. In what follows, the term natural kinds realism refers to weak realism or naturalism.
This approach to natural kinds has recently been called a zooming-in model (Reydon 2016) because it assumes that a careful examination of nature—“zooming in” to it—will lead to the discovery of mind-independent groupings. In this view, natural kinds are found in nature and not created by us. The next section starts by examining the difference between scientific realism and natural kinds realism. It then looks at how the three most prominent accounts of natural kinds discussed in the previous section can be interpreted as realist views of kinds. The analysis starts with essentialism as the strongest and most typical realist view. It then reviews cluster kinds and promiscuous kinds. These are commonly considered realist views, but, as this discussion shows, can potentially be interpreted in the antirealist vein. After that, the section offers a taxonomy of antirealist views, starting with strong versions and continuing with more moderate ones, where the difference between realism and antirealism is much subtler.
To say that entities that are being classified by our scientific theories exist independently of us and our classificatory practices is one formulation of the thesis of scientific realism (see the article on Scientific Realism and Antirealism). An interesting question in the debate on natural kinds realism is how to formulate this idea and what its relation to scientific realism is. Some authors presuppose that scientific realism and natural kinds realism amount to the same thesis. Stathis Psillos, for example, states that the metaphysical thesis of scientific realism is committed to the claim that the “world has a definite and mind-independent natural-kind structure” (Psillos 1999, xvii). Bird and Tobin similarly claim that “it is a corollary of scientific realism that when all goes well the classifications and taxonomies employed by science correspond to the real kinds in nature” (Bird and Tobin 2008, introduction). Conceptually, however, it appears that scientific realism can be kept distinct from realism about natural kinds. The claims of the existence of certain entities, which are members of natural kinds—say, electrons—can be interpreted both as saying that there are mind-independent entities with certain properties, as described by the scientific theory, and as a stronger claim that there is an objective, mind-independent criterion for how to categorize those entities into the kind electron.
Scientific realism refers, at a minimum, to the idea that science investigates facts about entities, their properties, and the relations in which they stand that are objective or mind independent. Natural kinds realism can then be read as a further thesis, according to which, in addition to the existence of mind-independent entities and processes, certain structure(s) of kinds of entities and the criteria by which we group and individuate them are equally mind independent (Chakravartty 2011). That is, there are correct ways of categorizing the world that reflect this mind-independent natural kind structure.
Essentialism is a paradigmatically realist view because it holds that the sources of similarities between members of a kind are intrinsic and independent of circumstances or our cognitive practices or interests (Ellis 1999). Even if the essentialism in question is pluralistic and allows for many crosscutting categorizations, it is nonetheless the fact that entities grouped together share an essence that makes kinds natural. On the other hand, antirealist or conventionalist views hold that we do not have access to the supposed real divisions in nature, or real essences of kinds, and, hence, we decide where to draw the boundaries between different kinds according to our interests and aims. Invoking our interests and aims as relevant for establishing a category as a natural kind is thus more akin to antirealist views. Both cluster approaches and promiscuous realism are commonly considered to be realist views, however, though they do invoke our aims and interests as relevant.
There are at least two strategies for accommodating the idea that a theory that invokes our aims and interests as relevant for determining which kinds are natural can still be considered realist. They both rely on arguments that aim to show that classifications that serve our interests and aims are exactly those that capture preexisting mind-independent divisions in nature. A cluster kind realist can invoke a version of the no-miracles argument (see the article on Scientific Realism and Antirealism) and argue that the fact that certain categories are successful in inductive inferences, predictions, and explanations gives us reason to conclude that they reflect some objective divisions in nature. The argument is that it would be a miracle that our inductive practices work if they do not latch onto some categories—natural kinds—that are objective. An objection to this no-miracle argument could be that it does not prove the mind-independence of the categories that we use in inductive inferences because the success of those inferences is similarly measured relative to how well they satisfy our interests and aims.
To this objection, a cluster kind realist can reply that some clusters of properties will be identified no matter what interest and aims one starts with, and that such clusters represent natural kinds. Matthew Slater, for instance, indicates that “[p]erhaps there are some clusters of properties such that no matter how a discipline adjusted its norms and aims… the category that cluster described would be fit to play a robust epistemic role in the discipline” (Slater 2014, 406). In this strategy, the kinds we take to be natural do, in a sense, depend on our aims and interests because, were it not for those aims and interests, we would not reach those classifications. What justifies taking such classifications to be natural kinds, however, is the fact that other people, starting with different aims and interests, would also reach similar classifications. The main problem with this kind of defense of natural kinds realism is that it might end up with a very small set of categorizations that qualify as natural kinds, since there seem to be many categorizations that would not be recognized by people starting with very different interests and aims. Our interest in accounting for certain material transformations brought us, for example, to classification by chemical elements according to atomic structure. But if we are interested in patterns of radioactive decay, we will arrive at different classifications, and if, hypothetically, we were interested only in the behavior of materials in centrifuges, we would arrive at classifications based on density (Franklin-Hall 2015).
Another, less demanding strategy is to treat natural kinds as domain dependent. P.D. Magnus (2012) has explicitly defended this view, but Boyd (1991) and Khalidi (2013) also seem to endorse it. The idea here is not that any rational inquirer with any type of interest will, or ought to, reach the same classifications, but rather that the realism in question amounts to the claim that classifications are natural relative to the domain of inquiry. That is, what is required is that inquirers with the same interests and aims arrive at the same classifications. This, from the viewpoint of many natural kind realists, ensures that our categorizations track the causal structure of the world. There is no disinterested point of view that will discover the real natural kinds. Rather, there are many different points of view, and what makes a grouping natural is that, when we fix what we are interested in, we also fix the correct ways to classify a domain of investigation according to those interests. Thus, even though our interests play an important role in identifying natural kinds, once we have fixed them, there are still correct and incorrect ways to classify the domain in question, and what determines this are the features of the entities being classified.
Promiscuous realism, as the name suggests, is a realist view because it takes as natural those classifications whose members share at least some (or one) common property, which is an objective and mind-independent fact. This view, even though it is extremely permissive and allows a vast range of classifications to be considered natural kinds, excludes at least some classifications. The fact that the excluded ones are not natural kinds is true by virtue of mind-independent facts; that is, in virtue of the fact that they do not share any common properties. This is a very weak version of realism because it merely captures the fact that we cannot group together entirely arbitrary collections of objects. It does not, however, offer any further realist criteria for privileging certain classifications over others. Further refinements of the promiscuous realist view seem to rely on invoking antirealist criteria, for example, by putting constraints on relevant interests and aims in scientific classifications.
Antirealism, or conventionalism, as it has been called, encompasses a wide range of views. All of them have in common the claim that what determines which kinds are natural are not only mind-independent facts about the world, but also facts about “us,” the cognizers or researchers. It is important to emphasize that antirealism, on this reading, is not committed to the further thesis that the identity of natural kinds, or the criterion for what makes a kind natural, is fully mind dependent. That view, according to which natural kinds are fully mind dependent and the world does not constrain our classifications, would then represent the most extreme variety of antirealism, which has been called strong conventionalism (Bird and Tobin 2015).
According to strong conventionalism, not only are there no mind-independent facts about which groupings are natural, but, also, all the differences and similarities between different entities are entirely dependent on us. Thus, any common properties among members of a kind that we identify as the basis for grouping them together are products of our classificatory practices and do not exist independently of mind. This view might go hand in hand with the more general antirealist view regarding the existence of a mind-independent world. This view sees natural kinds as exclusively those categorizations that we use in our classificatory practice. Since there is nothing about the world that would sanction some groupings as opposed to others, natural kinds would depend on our explicit beliefs about what kinds exist (see Franklin-Hall 2015). In this view, therefore, kinds are entirely subjective. But this view has counterintuitive consequences: It would make categories such as witches or hysteria equally as legitimate as scientific categories that include electrons or species, depending on the circumstances in which they are used.
Another antirealist view claims that our ignorance or lack of access to the natural principles of classification, if they exist, leads us to conclude that our grouping of objects into a natural kind will depend, at least partly, on our interests, aims, and cognitive capacities. This view can take at least two possible forms. One is that we do not have access to the real essences of kinds—there are natural principles of classification, but they are inaccessible to us. Another is the argument that there are no clear divisions in nature, or no discoverable natural principles of classification. Rather, there are only continuous gradations between different kinds of things, so it is partly up to us where to draw the line. This implies that our epistemic aims, cognitive capacities, and practical interests might play a role in deciding where to draw such lines and what classifications to endorse. This type of view has been called weak conventionalism (Bird and Tobin 2015). It is characterized by the claim that both the causal structure of the world—mind-independent facts—and facts about us jointly determine which categorizations we will consider to be natural.
The main thesis of weak conventionalism is nicely illustrated by Reydon’s (2016) co-creation model of natural kinds. In this model, kinds are taken to be co-determined by both states of affairs in nature and the background assumptions and decisions of investigators in specific scientific contexts. It can encompass a broad set of views. Depending on how exactly one thinks of cognitive capacities, epistemic or practical aims, and what kinds of interests are taken as legitimate, different antirealist views can be developed.
A simple pragmatist approach to natural kinds, as defined by Laura Franklin-Hall (2015), holds that natural kinds correspond to categories that fulfill some of our epistemic and/or practical aims. This is a very broad understanding of natural kinds that allows a wide range of categories to be considered natural kinds. It does, however, exclude entirely arbitrary categories. It excludes them because they cannot serve any useful purpose. On the other hand, it allows categories such as proteins, gluten-free food, or introverts to be natural kinds, since they fulfill some of our interests. While in the practical sense this account would deem as natural most, if not all, of the same groupings as promiscuous realism, it is important to notice that the reason these accounts hold that certain groupings are natural is different. While the realist stresses that the reason the grouping is useful is in the fact that certain objective properties are shared, the antirealist does not care about that. The antirealist focuses instead on whether the grouping is useful and serves some purpose, regardless of whether it is based on some objective property. A simple pragmatist view countenances as natural all the groupings that are in some way relevant to us.
One problem with this view arises when we start thinking about the possibility of our interests being somewhat different than they are. This commits the view to a potentially awkward consequence, in which any change in our interests entails the existence of different natural kinds. To resist this consequence, a pragmatist can offer a way to refine which interests can be taken as relevant for judging whether a kind is natural. For instance, one can restrict the possible range of interests by considering what interests some idealized and fully informed agent or inquirer would have or would endorse.
Another potentially problematic consequence of the simple pragmatist view is that practical issues can outweigh factual ones when it comes to deciding which classifications to adopt. The psychiatric classification antisocial personality disorder, for example, most likely groups together a very heterogeneous class of people whose only common feature is that they engage in some sort of criminal behavior (Brazil, et al. 2016). From the point of view of scientific research, we should strive to find classifications that are better grounded in commonalities that their members share. From a practical point of view, however, it might be enough to know only that people belonging to this group have committed crimes and that it is likely that they will do so again in the future (Brzović et al. 2018; Malatesti and McMillan 2014).
A more common variation on the weak conventionalist view focuses on our epistemic interests and has been called the simple epistemic view (Franklin-Hall 2015). In this approach, natural kinds correspond to categories that fulfill some of our epistemic aims. It differs from the simple pragmatist view by excluding practical interests as relevant for circumscribing natural kinds. Cluster kinds, for instance, can have realist and antirealist readings, depending on what one focuses on. The realist would say that what makes such kinds natural is the fact that they track real clusters of properties in the world, while the simple epistemic antirealist would argue that what makes them natural is their success in fulfilling our epistemic aims, such as being predictive and explanatory. We therefore do not start by looking for clustered properties, but by looking for categories that successfully fulfill our epistemic aims. In many cases, categories based on clustered properties will accomplish this aim. In this reading, the aim of our scientific endeavors is to develop the most accurate descriptions of the world we live in, and the categories that best serve this purpose ought to be considered natural kinds. Such views have been characterized as epistemology-oriented approaches to natural kinds (Reydon 2009).
The main difficulty with these approaches is to explain how to circumscribe the set of epistemic aims that we take to be relevant in establishing which groupings correspond to natural kinds. If we take our present aims as relevant, this has the welcome consequence that our present successful scientific categories come out as natural kinds. However, we might exclude some classifications that we might reach if our interests were to change or if our knowledge expanded or got revised. To solve this type of problem, Franklin-Hall (2015) offers a more elaborate antirealist approach, the categorical bottleneck view. She identifies natural kinds with categories that fulfill the interests that we and a wider range of epistemic agents with different interests and cognitive capacities have in common. Here, however, the relevant interests are limited to what we and our “neighboring agents” would recognize as scientifically relevant classifications. That is, we do not consider any possible epistemic agents apart from those that are relatively like us. Neighboring agents are those that only somewhat differ from actual agents in their epistemic aims and interests. This restriction of possible interests is meant to ensure more objectivity for natural kind categories by eliminating those that might be contingent on some of our cognitive capacities or limitations in knowledge.
Thinking about the synchronic and diachronic ways of considering naturalness illustrates the problem that antirealist views face—that classifications based on our interests can seem to lack objectivity (Chang 2016). The synchronic aspect looks at a specific moment of scientific development, usually the one that is of immediate interest, and examines whether the scientific categories that are in use can be considered natural kinds. Examples include whether they play an important role in scientific explanations, whether they are predictive, whether they figure in scientific laws or lawlike generalizations, or even whether they fulfill certain practical purposes. If we only focus on the present moment, we might be tempted to conclude that natural kinds are those categories that fulfill our present epistemic interests and aims. If we concentrate on the diachronic aspect of naturalness and investigate what it means that a category is a natural kind throughout different periods of scientific development, then it might turn out not to be beneficial to focus on our present interests and aims, since there is always the possibility that they might change as new information comes in and new scientific theories are accepted.
Thinking about the question of what makes a kind natural across different stages of scientific development can be used to illustrate the way different antirealist positions can reach different conclusions. One reading of the simple epistemic view claims that, throughout the development of science, different categories have served our interests, and, for this reason, we can consider them to be natural kinds in the contexts in which they were used. The consequence of this view is that natural kinds are relative to the context of scientific investigation. In this view, categorizations such as phlogiston or hysteria, for example, were natural kinds in one historical period but not in others.
A different reading of the simple epistemic view argues that only our present categories correspond to natural kinds, while the ones that served our interests in previous stages of scientific development were not natural kinds if they differed from the present ones. This has the problematic consequence, however, that in the future we might develop different epistemic aims and interests, and that other categories would therefore come to be considered scientifically grounded. We thus could not consider them natural kinds, since the notion of natural kinds is tied to our present interests. One option for the simple epistemic view is to argue that our interests and aims do not change to a large degree, but rather it is our factual knowledge regarding how to fulfill our aims that changes. The claim that natural kinds are categories that best serve our epistemic aims and interests thus presupposes that they are best served when we have all the required information regarding matters of fact. Thus, while it might appear that our aims change substantively with the development of science, what actually changes is our access to information on how to fulfil them. Another option for the antirealist is to abandon the simple epistemic view and embrace something more akin to the categorical bottleneck view, which ensures more objectivity for natural kinds by introducing a wider range of epistemic agents with different interests and cognitive capacities.
Domain-dependent realism, which is closest to antirealist views in the sense that it makes natural kinds relative to different domains of inquiry, solves this problem by construing natural kinds as categories that we would adopt if starting with the same interests. The idea here is not merely that any category that is useful in certain contexts is a natural kind, but rather that, once we start with certain fixed interests, there is a correct way to classify the domain of inquiry. Thus, it is not enough that certain classifications fulfill our interests, because even the categorizations we now take to be flawed still fulfill our interests to a certain extent. Rather, we should aim at finding the correct ones within our domain of interest. Consequently, there is a possibility that our current classifications are not natural kinds, because it might turn out that there are better, or more refined ones, which will more perfectly fulfill our interests. That is, we can always assume that further scientific developments and new data will lead us to reconsider our current classifications. This is a feature of realist views in general, that we cannot be certain that our current knowledge reflects the real states of affairs or, in this case, that our classifications reflect natural kinds.
These problems nicely illustrate the main benefits and drawbacks of realist and antirealist views. We start out with the intuition that natural kinds pick out some objective features of the world and that what kinds are natural is not supposed to change across different contexts. Realism easily accounts for this objectivity by arguing that natural kinds represent the way the world is structured independently of us. Thus, kinds are out there to be discovered, and they cannot change across different scientific contexts or vary with different researchers’ interests. The problem for the realist, then, is to demonstrate how it is possible to access such natural groupings, to locate nature’s joints. The realist has to offer something like essences or very clearly delineated clusters of properties and to try to convince skeptics that these really are the natural ways to divide the entities in the world. Realist positions are characterized by their openness to the possibility that our current categories do not actually capture natural kinds. Even domain-dependent realists can always question whether—if there is a convergence on a certain classification by everyone sharing the same interest, that is, working in the same discipline—we might, with future scientific developments, discover new facts that will lead us to reexamine those classifications.
Antirealism, on the other hand, gives weight to the researchers’ contribution to scientific classification, but at the cost of sacrificing the objectivity of kinds. In this account, natural kinds can be seen as relative to the specific contexts of investigation. This has the consequence that the kinds that are deemed natural will change as the scientific research advances. Thus, while hysteria, to take an example cited previously, was at one point a natural kind, that is no longer the case. To avoid this consequence, the antirealist can offer a way to sanction possible interests and aims to arrive at a more objective view of natural kinds. Such sanctioning, however, naturally lead us to postulate objective features of the world that our classifications ought to identify. These realist intuitions again lead us away from the starting ambition to encompass actual scientific classifications.
The growth of interest in natural kinds among philosophers of science stems from two sources. One relates to debates on scientific confirmation and inductive reasoning; the other has emerged from debates regarding the reference of scientific terms. With the further development of the philosophies of specific scientific disciplines such as biology, chemistry, psychology, psychiatry, and so on, theorizing about natural kinds moved more in the direction of examining successful scientific classifications and offering philosophical accounts that should capture those classifications. In this regard, we can identify two main approaches to the natural kinds debate and the corresponding roles they are supposed to play: on the one hand, a traditional, more prescriptive one; on the other, a descriptive one that aims to stay close to scientific practice.
This move is transparent in the three major approaches to natural kinds presented in this article. On one hand, essentialism, with its strict search for clearly demarcated kinds, has been criticized as being too restrictive, because it leaves out many important scientific categorizations. On the other, the cluster kind and promiscuous realism approaches have been worked out with the aim of providing a framework that will capture classifications in actual scientific practice. This tendency is effective insofar as it brings philosophical accounts closer to science. However, it risks minimizing the prescriptive role that natural kinds should play in scientific research, because philosophers using this approach tend to equate current scientific classifications with natural kinds. In the debate on the metaphysics of natural kinds, the dichotomy between these two approaches is reflected in a tension between attempts to ensure the objectivity of natural kinds and attempts to stay close to scientific practice by emphasizing that natural kinds ought to fulfill our current interests.
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