The term “natural law” is ambiguous. It refers to a type of moral theory, as well as to a type of legal theory, but the core claims of the two kinds of theory are logically independent. It does not refer to the laws of nature, the laws that science aims to describe. According to natural law moral theory, the moral standards that govern human behavior are, in some sense, objectively derived from the nature of human beings and the nature of the world. While being logically independent of natural law legal theory, the two theories intersect. However, the majority of the article will focus on natural law legal theory.
According to natural law legal theory, the authority of legal standards necessarily derives, at least in part, from considerations having to do with the moral merit of those standards. There are a number of different kinds of natural law legal theories, differing from each other with respect to the role that morality plays in determining the authority of legal norms. The conceptual jurisprudence of John Austin provides a set of necessary and sufficient conditions for the existence of law that distinguishes law from non-law in every possible world. Classical natural law theory such as the theory of Thomas Aquinas focuses on the overlap between natural law moral and legal theories. Similarly, the neo-naturalism of John Finnis is a development of classical natural law theory. In contrast, the procedural naturalism of Lon L. Fuller is a rejection of the conceptual naturalist idea that there are necessary substantive moral constraints on the content of law. Lastly, Ronald Dworkin’s theory is a response and critique of legal positivism. All of these theories subscribe to one or more basic tenets of natural law legal theory and are important to its development and influence.
At the outset, it is important to distinguish two kinds of theory that go by the name of natural law. The first is a theory of morality that is roughly characterized by the following theses. First, moral propositions have what is sometimes called objective standing in the sense that such propositions are the bearers of objective truth-value; that is, moral propositions can be objectively true or false. Though moral objectivism is sometimes equated with moral realism (see, e.g., Moore 1992, 190: “the truth of any moral proposition lies in its correspondence with a mind- and convention-independent moral reality”), the relationship between the two theories is controversial. Geoffrey Sayre-McCord (1988), for example, views moral objectivism as one species of moral realism, but not the only form; on Sayre-McCord’s view, moral subjectivism and moral intersubjectivism are also forms of moral realism. Strictly speaking, then, natural law moral theory is committed only to the objectivity of moral norms.
The second thesis constituting the core of natural law moral theory is the claim that standards of morality are in some sense derived from, or entailed by, the nature of the world and the nature of human beings. St. Thomas Aquinas, for example, identifies the rational nature of human beings as that which defines moral law: “the rule and measure of human acts is the reason, which is the first principle of human acts” (Aquinas, ST I-II, Q.90, A.I). On this common view, since human beings are by nature rational beings, it is morally appropriate that they should behave in a way that conforms to their rational nature. Thus, Aquinas derives the moral law from the nature of human beings (thus, “natural law”).
But there is another kind of natural law theory having to do with the relationship of morality to law. According to natural law theory of law, there is no clean division between the notion of law and the notion of morality. Though there are different versions of natural law theory, all subscribe to the thesis that there are at least some laws that depend for their “authority” not on some pre-existing human convention, but on the logical relationship in which they stand to moral standards. Otherwise put, some norms are authoritative in virtue of their moral content, even when there is no convention that makes moral merit a criterion of legal validity. The idea that the concepts of law and morality intersect in some way is called the Overlap Thesis.
As an empirical matter, many natural law moral theorists are also natural law legal theorists, but the two theories, strictly speaking, are logically independent. One can deny natural law theory of law but hold a natural law theory of morality. John Austin, the most influential of the early legal positivists, for example, denied the Overlap Thesis but held something that resembles a natural law ethical theory.
Indeed, Austin explicitly endorsed the view that it is not necessarily true that the legal validity of a norm depends on whether its content conforms to morality. But while Austin thus denied the Overlap Thesis, he accepted an objectivist moral theory; indeed, Austin inherited his utilitarianism almost wholesale from J.S. Mill and Jeremy Bentham. Here it is worth noting that utilitarians sometimes seem to suggest that they derive their utilitarianism from certain facts about human nature; as Bentham once wrote, “nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain and pleasure. It is for them alone to point out what we ought to do, as well as to determine what we shall do. On the one hand the standard of right and wrong, on the other the chain of causes and effects, are fastened to their throne” (Bentham 1948, 1). Thus, a commitment to natural law theory of morality is consistent with the denial of natural law theory of law.
Conversely, one could, though this would be unusual, accept a natural law theory of law without holding a natural law theory of morality. One could, for example, hold that the conceptual point of law is, in part, to reproduce the demands of morality, but also hold a form of ethical subjectivism (or relativism). On this peculiar view, the conceptual point of law would be to enforce those standards that are morally valid in virtue of cultural consensus. For this reason, natural law theory of law is logically independent of natural law theory of morality. The remainder of this essay will be exclusively concerned with natural law theories of law.
The principal objective of conceptual (or analytic) jurisprudence has traditionally been to provide an account of what distinguishes law as a system of norms from other systems of norms, such as ethical norms. As John Austin describes the project, conceptual jurisprudence seeks “the essence or nature which is common to all laws that are properly so called” (Austin 1995, 11). Accordingly, the task of conceptual jurisprudence is to provide a set of necessary and sufficient conditions for the existence of law that distinguishes law from non-law in every possible world.
While this task is usually interpreted as an attempt to analyze the concepts of law and legal system, there is some confusion as to both the value and character of conceptual analysis in philosophy of law. As Brian Leiter (1998) points out, philosophy of law is one of the few philosophical disciplines that takes conceptual analysis as its principal concern; most other areas in philosophy have taken a naturalistic turn, incorporating the tools and methods of the sciences. To clarify the role of conceptual analysis in law, Brian Bix (1995) distinguishes a number of different purposes that can be served by conceptual claims: (1) to track linguistic usage; (2) to stipulate meanings; (3) to explain what is important or essential about a class of objects; and (4) to establish an evaluative test for the concept-word. Bix takes conceptual analysis in law to be primarily concerned with (3) and (4).
In any event, conceptual analysis of law remains an important, if controversial, project in contemporary legal theory. Conceptual theories of law have traditionally been characterized in terms of their posture towards the Overlap Thesis. Thus, conceptual theories of law have traditionally been divided into two main categories: those like natural law legal theory that affirm there is a conceptual relation between law and morality and those like legal positivism that deny such a relation.
All forms of natural law theory subscribe to the Overlap Thesis, which asserts that there is some kind of non-conventional relation between law and morality. According to this view, then, the notion of law cannot be fully articulated without some reference to moral notions. Though the Overlap Thesis may seem unambiguous, there are a number of different ways in which it can be interpreted.
The strongest construction of the Overlap Thesis forms the foundation for the classical naturalism of Aquinas and Blackstone. Aquinas distinguishes four kinds of law: (1) eternal law; (2) natural law; (3) human law; and (4) divine law. Eternal law is comprised of those laws that govern the nature of an eternal universe; as Susan Dimock (1999, 22) puts it, one can “think of eternal law as comprising all those scientific (physical, chemical, biological, psychological, etc.) ‘laws’ by which the universe is ordered.” Divine law is concerned with those standards that must be satisfied by a human being to achieve eternal salvation. One cannot discover divine law by natural reason alone; the precepts of divine law are disclosed only through divine revelation.
The natural law is comprised of those precepts of the eternal law that govern the behavior of beings possessing reason and free will. The first precept of the natural law, according to Aquinas, is the somewhat vacuous imperative to do good and avoid evil. Here it is worth noting that Aquinas holds a natural law theory of morality: what is good and evil, according to Aquinas, is derived from the rational nature of human beings. Good and evil are thus both objective and universal.
But Aquinas is also a natural law legal theorist. On his view, a human law (that is, that which is promulgated by human beings) is valid only insofar as its content conforms to the content of the natural law; as Aquinas puts the point: “[E]very human law has just so much of the nature of law as is derived from the law of nature. But if in any point it deflects from the law of nature, it is no longer a law but a perversion of law” (ST I-II, Q.95, A.II). To paraphrase Augustine’s famous remark, an unjust law is really no law at all.
The idea that a norm that does not conform to the natural law cannot be legally valid is the defining thesis of conceptual naturalism. As William Blackstone describes the thesis, “This law of nature, being co-eval with mankind and dictated by God himself, is of course superior in obligation to any other. It is binding over all the globe, in all countries, and at all times: no human laws are of any validity, if contrary to this; and such of them as are valid derive all their force, and all their authority, mediately or immediately, from this original” (1979, 41). In this passage, Blackstone articulates the two claims that constitute the theoretical core of conceptual naturalism: 1) there can be no legally valid standards that conflict with the natural law; and 2) all valid laws derive what force and authority they have from the natural law.
It should be noted that classical naturalism is consistent with allowing a substantial role to human beings in the manufacture of law. While the classical naturalist seems committed to the claim that the law necessarily incorporates all moral principles, this claim does not imply that the law is exhausted by the set of moral principles. There will still be coordination problems (e.g., which side of the road to drive on) that can be resolved in any number of ways consistent with the set of moral principles. Thus, the classical naturalist does not deny that human beings have considerable discretion in creating natural law. Rather she claims only that such discretion is necessarily limited by moral norms: legal norms that are promulgated by human beings are valid only if they are consistent with morality.
Critics of conceptual naturalism have raised a number of objections to this view. First, it has often been pointed out that, contra Augustine, unjust laws are all-too- frequently enforced against persons. As Austin petulantly put the point:
Now, to say that human laws which conflict with the Divine law are not binding, that is to say, are not laws, is to talk stark nonsense. The most pernicious laws, and therefore those which are most opposed to the will of God, have been and are continually enforced as laws by judicial tribunals. Suppose an act innocuous, or positively beneficial, be prohibited by the sovereign under the penalty of death; if I commit this act, I shall be tried and condemned, and if I object to the sentence, that it is contrary to the law of God, who has commanded that human lawgivers shall not prohibit acts which have no evil consequences, the Court of Justice will demonstrate the inconclusiveness of my reasoning by hanging me up, in pursuance of the law of which I have impugned the validity (Austin 1995, 158).
Of course, as Brian Bix (1999) points out, the argument does little work for Austin because it is always possible for a court to enforce a law against a person that does not satisfy Austin’s own theory of legal validity.
Another frequently expressed worry is that conceptual naturalism undermines the possibility of moral criticism of the law; inasmuch as conformity with natural law is a necessary condition for legal validity, all valid law is, by definition, morally just. Thus, on this line of reasoning, the legal validity of a norm necessarily entails its moral justice. As Jules Coleman and Jeffrey Murphy (1990, 18) put the point:
The important things [conceptual naturalism] supposedly allows us to do (e.g., morally evaluate the law and determine our moral obligations with respect to the law) are actually rendered more difficult by its collapse of the distinction between morality and law. If we really want to think about the law from the moral point of view, it may obscure the task if we see law and morality as essentially linked in some way. Moral criticism and reform of law may be aided by an initial moral skepticism about the law.
There are a couple of problems with this line of objection. First, conceptual naturalism does not foreclose criticism of those norms that are being enforced by a society as law. Insofar as it can plausibly be claimed that the content of a norm being enforced by society as law does not conform to the natural law, this is a legitimate ground of moral criticism: given that the norm being enforced by law is unjust, it follows, according to conceptual naturalism, that it is not legally valid. Thus, the state commits wrong by enforcing that norm against private citizens.
Second, and more importantly, this line of objection seeks to criticize a conceptual theory of law by pointing to its practical implications ñ a strategy that seems to commit a category mistake. Conceptual jurisprudence assumes the existence of a core of social practices (constituting law) that requires a conceptual explanation. The project motivating conceptual jurisprudence, then, is to articulate the concept of law in a way that accounts for these pre-existing social practices. A conceptual theory of law can legitimately be criticized for its failure to adequately account for the pre-existing data, as it were; but it cannot legitimately be criticized for either its normative quality or its practical implications.
A more interesting line of argument has recently been taken up by Brian Bix (1996). Following John Finnis (1980), Bix rejects the interpretation of Aquinas and Blackstone as conceptual naturalists, arguing instead that the claim that an unjust law is not a law should not be taken literally:
A more reasonable interpretation of statements like “an unjust law is no law at all” is that unjust laws are not laws “in the fullest sense.” As we might say of some professional, who had the necessary degrees and credentials, but seemed nonetheless to lack the necessary ability or judgment: “she’s no lawyer” or “he’s no doctor.” This only indicates that we do not think that the title in this case carries with it all the implications it usually does. Similarly, to say that an unjust law is “not really law” may only be to point out that it does not carry the same moral force or offer the same reasons for action as laws consistent with “higher law” (Bix 1996, 226).
Thus, Bix construes Aquinas and Blackstone as having views more similar to the neo- naturalism of John Finnis discussed below in Section III. Nevertheless, while a plausible case can be made in favor of Bix’s view, the long history of construing Aquinas and Blackstone as conceptual naturalists, along with its pedagogical value in developing other theories of law, ensures that this practice is likely, for better or worse, to continue indefinitely.
John Finnis takes himself to be explicating and developing the views of Aquinas and Blackstone. Like Bix, Finnis believes that the naturalism of Aquinas and Blackstone should not be construed as a conceptual account of the existence conditions for law. According to Finnis, the classical naturalists were not concerned with giving a conceptual account of legal validity; rather they were concerned with explaining the moral force of law: “the principles of natural law explain the obligatory force (in the fullest sense of ‘obligation’) of positive laws, even when those laws cannot be deduced from those principles” (Finnis 1980, 23-24). On Finnis’s view of the Overlap Thesis, the essential function of law is to provide a justification for state coercion (a view he shares with Ronald Dworkin). Accordingly, an unjust law can be legally valid, but it cannot provide an adequate justification for use of the state coercive power and is hence not obligatory in the fullest sense; thus, an unjust law fails to realize the moral ideals implicit in the concept of law. An unjust law, on this view, is legally binding, but is not fully law.
Like classical naturalism, Finnis’s naturalism is both an ethical theory and a theory of law. Finnis distinguishes a number of equally valuable basic goods: life, health, knowledge, play, friendship, religion, and aesthetic experience. Each of these goods, according to Finnis, has intrinsic value in the sense that it should, given human nature, be valued for its own sake and not merely for the sake of some other good it can assist in bringing about. Moreover, each of these goods is universal in the sense that it governs all human cultures at all times. The point of moral principles, on this view, is to give ethical structure to the pursuit of these basic goods; moral principles enable us to select among competing goods and to define what a human being can permissibly do in pursuit of a basic good.
On Finnis’s view, the conceptual point of law is to facilitate the common good by providing authoritative rules that solve coordination problems that arise in connection with the common pursuit of these basic goods. Thus, Finnis sums up his theory of law as follows:
[T]he term ‘law’ … refer[s] primarily to rules made, in accordance with regulative legal rules, by a determinate and effective authority (itself identified and, standardly, constituted as an institution by legal rules) for a ‘complete’ community, and buttressed by sanctions in accordance with the rule-guided stipulations of adjudicative institutions, this ensemble of rules and institutions being directed to reasonably resolving any of the community’s co-ordination problems (and to ratifying, tolerating, regulating, or overriding co-ordination solutions from any other institutions or sources of norms) for the common good of that community (Finnis 1980, 276).
Again, it bears emphasizing that Finnis takes care to deny that there is any necessary moral test for legal validity: “one would simply be misunderstanding my conception of the nature and purpose of explanatory definitions of theoretical concepts if one supposed that my definition ‘ruled out as non-laws’ laws which failed to meet, or meet fully, one or other of the elements of the definition” (Finnis 1980, 278).
Nevertheless, Finnis believes that to the extent that a norm fails to satisfy these conditions, it likewise fails to fully manifest the nature of law and thereby fails to fully obligate the citizen-subject of the law. Unjust laws may obligate in a technical legal sense, on Finnis’s view, but they may fail to provide moral reasons for action of the sort that it is the point of legal authority to provide. Thus, Finnis argues that “a ruler’s use of authority is radically defective if he exploits his opportunities by making stipulations intended by him not for the common good but for his own or his friends’ or party’s or faction’s advantage, or out of malice against some person or group” (Finnis 1980, 352). For the ultimate basis of a ruler’s moral authority, on this view, “is the fact that he has the opportunity, and thus the responsibility, of furthering the common good by stipulating solutions to a community’s co- ordination problems” (Finnis 1980, 351).
Finnis’s theory is certainly more plausible as a theory of law than the traditional interpretation of classical naturalism, but such plausibility comes, for better or worse, at the expense of naturalism’s identity as a distinct theory of law. Indeed, it appears that Finnis’s natural law theory is compatible with naturalism’s historical adversary, legal positivism, inasmuch as Finnis’s view is compatible with a source-based theory of legal validity; laws that are technically valid in virtue of source but unjust do not, according to Finnis, fully obligate the citizen. Indeed, Finnis (1996) believes that Aquinas’s classical naturalism fully affirms the notion that human laws are “posited.”
Like Finnis, Lon Fuller (1964) rejects the conceptual naturalist idea that there are necessary substantive moral constraints on the content of law. But Fuller, unlike Finnis, believes that law is necessarily subject to a procedural morality. On Fuller’s view, human activity is necessarily goal-oriented or purposive in the sense that people engage in a particular activity because it helps them to achieve some end. Insofar as human activity is essentially purposive, according to Fuller, particular human activities can be understood only in terms that make reference to their purposes and ends. Thus, since lawmaking is essentially purposive activity, it can be understood only in terms that explicitly acknowledge its essential values and purposes:
The only formula that might be called a definition of law offered in these writings is by now thoroughly familiar: law is the enterprise of subjecting human conduct to the governance of rules. Unlike most modern theories of law, this view treats law as an activity and regards a legal system as the product of a sustained purposive effort (Fuller 1964, 106).
To the extent that a definition of law can be given, then, it must include the idea that law’s essential function is to “achiev[e] [social] order through subjecting people’s conduct to the guidance of general rules by which they may themselves orient their behavior” (Fuller 1965, 657).
Fuller’s functionalist conception of law implies that nothing can count as law unless it is capable of performing law’s essential function of guiding behavior. And to be capable of performing this function, a system of rules must satisfy the following principles:
On Fuller’s view, no system of rules that fails minimally to satisfy these principles of legality can achieve law’s essential purpose of achieving social order through the use of rules that guide behavior. A system of rules that fails to satisfy (P2) or (P4), for example, cannot guide behavior because people will not be able to determine what the rules require. Accordingly, Fuller concludes that his eight principles are “internal” to law in the sense that they are built into the existence conditions for law.
These internal principles constitute a morality, according to Fuller, because law necessarily has positive moral value in two respects: (1) law conduces to a state of social order and (2) does so by respecting human autonomy because rules guide behavior. Since no system of rules can achieve these morally valuable objectives without minimally complying with the principles of legality, it follows, on Fuller’s view, that they constitute a morality. Since these moral principles are built into the existence conditions for law, they are internal and hence represent a conceptual connection between law and morality. Thus, like the classical naturalists and unlike Finnis, Fuller subscribes to the strongest form of the Overlap Thesis, which makes him a conceptual naturalist.
Nevertheless, Fuller’s conceptual naturalism is fundamentally different from that of classical naturalism. First, Fuller rejects the classical naturalist view that there are necessary moral constraints on the content of law, holding instead that there are necessary moral constraints on the procedural mechanisms by which law is made and administered: “What I have called the internal morality of law is … a procedural version of natural law … [in the sense that it is] concerned, not with the substantive aims of legal rules, but with the ways in which a system of rules for governing human conduct must be constructed and administered if it is to be efficacious and at the same time remain what it purports to be” (Fuller 1964, 96- 97).
Second, Fuller identifies the conceptual connection between law and morality at a higher level of abstraction than the classical naturalists. The classical naturalists view morality as providing substantive constraints on the content of individual laws; an unjust norm, on this view, is conceptually disqualified from being legally valid. In contrast, Fuller views morality as providing a constraint on the existence of a legal system: “A total failure in any one of these eight directions does not simply result in a bad system of law; it results in something that is not properly called a legal system at all” (Fuller 1964, 39).
Fuller’s procedural naturalism is vulnerable to a number of objections. H.L.A. Hart, for example, denies Fuller’s claim that the principles of legality constitute an internal morality; according to Hart, Fuller confuses the notions of morality and efficacy:
[T]he author’s insistence on classifying these principles of legality as a “morality” is a source of confusion both for him and his readers…. [T]he crucial objection to the designation of these principles of good legal craftsmanship as morality, in spite of the qualification “inner,” is that it perpetrates a confusion between two notions that it is vital to hold apart: the notions of purposive activity and morality. Poisoning is no doubt a purposive activity, and reflections on its purpose may show that it has its internal principles. (“Avoid poisons however lethal if they cause the victim to vomit”….) But to call these principles of the poisoner’s art “the morality of poisoning” would simply blur the distinction between the notion of efficiency for a purpose and those final judgments about activities and purposes with which morality in its various forms is concerned (Hart 1965, 1285-86).
On Hart’s view, all actions, including virtuous acts like lawmaking and impermissible acts like poisoning, have their own internal standards of efficacy. But insofar as such standards of efficacy conflict with morality, as they do in the case of poisoning, it follows that they are distinct from moral standards. Thus, while Hart concedes that something like Fuller’s eight principles are built into the existence conditions for law, he concludes they do not constitute a conceptual connection between law and morality.
Unfortunately, Hart overlooks the fact that most of Fuller’s eight principles double as moral ideals of fairness. For example, public promulgation in understandable terms may be a necessary condition for efficacy, but it is also a moral ideal; it is morally objectionable for a state to enforce rules that have not been publicly promulgated in terms reasonably calculated to give notice of what is required. Similarly, we take it for granted that it is wrong for a state to enact retroactive rules, inconsistent rules, and rules that require what is impossible. Poisoning may have its internal standards of efficacy, but such standards are distinguishable from the principles of legality in that they conflict with moral ideals.
Nevertheless, Fuller’s principles operate internally, not as moral ideals, but merely as principles of efficacy. As Fuller would likely acknowledge, the existence of a legal system is consistent with considerable divergence from the principles of legality. Legal standards, for example, are necessarily promulgated in general terms that inevitably give rise to problems of vagueness. And officials all too often fail to administer the laws in a fair and even-handed manner even in the best of legal systems. These divergences may always be prima facie objectionable, but they are inconsistent with a legal system only when they render a legal system incapable of performing its essential function of guiding behavior. Insofar as these principles are built into the existence conditions for law, it is because they operate as efficacy conditions and not because they function as moral ideals.
Ronald Dworkin’s so-called third theory of law is best understood as a response to legal positivism, which is essentially constituted by three theoretical commitments: the Social Fact Thesis, the Conventionality Thesis, and the Separability Thesis. The Social Fact Thesis asserts it is a necessary truth that legal validity is ultimately a function of certain kinds of social facts; the idea here is that what ultimately explains the validity of a law is the presence of certain social facts, especially formal promulgation by a legislature.
The Conventionality Thesis emphasizes law’s conventional nature, claiming that the social facts giving rise to legal validity are authoritative in virtue of a social convention. On this view, the criteria that determine whether or not any given norm counts as a legal norm are binding because of an implicit or explicit agreement among officials. Thus, for example, the U.S. Constitution is authoritative in virtue of the conventional fact that it was formally ratified by all fifty states.
The Separability Thesis, at the most general level, simply denies naturalism’s Overlap Thesis; according to the Separability Thesis, there is no conceptual overlap between the notions of law and morality. As Hart more narrowly construes it, the Separability Thesis is “just the simple contention that it is in no sense a necessary truth that laws reproduce or satisfy certain demands of morality, though in fact they have often done so” (Hart 1994, 185-186).
Dworkin rejects positivism’s Social Fact Thesis on the ground that there are some legal standards the authority of which cannot be explained in terms of social facts. In deciding hard cases, for example, judges often invoke moral principles that Dworkin believes do not derive their legal authority from the social criteria of legality contained in a rule of recognition (Dworkin 1977, p. 40).
In Riggs v. Palmer, for example, the court considered the question of whether a murderer could take under the will of his victim. At the time the case was decided, neither the statutes nor the case law governing wills expressly prohibited a murderer from taking under his victim’s will. Despite this, the court declined to award the defendant his gift under the will on the ground that it would be wrong to allow him to profit from such a grievous wrong. On Dworkin’s view, the court decided the case by citing “the principle that no man may profit from his own wrong as a background standard against which to read the statute of wills and in this way justified a new interpretation of that statute” (Dworkin 1977, 29).
On Dworkin’s view, the Riggs court was not just reaching beyond the law to extralegal standards when it considered this principle. For the Riggs judges would “rightfully” have been criticized had they failed to consider this principle; if it were merely an extralegal standard, there would be no rightful grounds to criticize a failure to consider it (Dworkin 1977, 35). Accordingly, Dworkin concludes that the best explanation for the propriety of such criticism is that principles are part of the law.
Further, Dworkin maintains that the legal authority of standards like the Riggs principle cannot derive from promulgation in accordance with purely formal requirements: “[e]ven though principles draw support from the official acts of legal institutions, they do not have a simple or direct enough connection with these acts to frame that connection in terms of criteria specified by some ultimate master rule of recognition” (Dworkin 1977, 41).
On Dworkin’s view, the legal authority of the Riggs principle can be explained wholly in terms of its content. The Riggs principle was binding, in part, because it is a requirement of fundamental fairness that figures into the best moral justification for a society’s legal practices considered as a whole. A moral principle is legally authoritative, according to Dworkin, insofar as it maximally conduces to the best moral justification for a society’s legal practices considered as a whole.
Dworkin believes that a legal principle maximally contributes to such a justification if and only if it satisfies two conditions: (1) the principle coheres with existing legal materials; and (2) the principle is the most morally attractive standard that satisfies (1). The correct legal principle is the one that makes the law the moral best it can be. Accordingly, on Dworkin’s view, adjudication is and should be interpretive:
[J]udges should decide hard cases by interpreting the political structure of their community in the following, perhaps special way: by trying to find the best justification they can find, in principles of political morality, for the structure as a whole, from the most profound constitutional rules and arrangements to the details of, for example, the private law of tort or contract (Dworkin 1982, 165).
There are, thus, two elements of a successful interpretation. First, since an interpretation is successful insofar as it justifies the particular practices of a particular society, the interpretation must fit with those practices in the sense that it coheres with existing legal materials defining the practices. Second, since an interpretation provides a moral justification for those practices, it must present them in the best possible moral light.
For this reason, Dworkin argues that a judge should strive to interpret a case in roughly the following way:
A thoughtful judge might establish for himself, for example, a rough “threshold” of fit which any interpretation of data must meet in order to be “acceptable” on the dimension of fit, and then suppose that if more than one interpretation of some part of the law meets this threshold, the choice among these should be made, not through further and more precise comparisons between the two along that dimension, but by choosing the interpretation which is “substantively” better, that is, which better promotes the political ideals he thinks correct (Dworkin 1982, 171).
As Dworkin conceives it, then, the judge must approach judicial decision-making as something that resembles an exercise in moral philosophy. Thus, for example, the judge must decide cases on the basis of those moral principles that “figure in the soundest theory of law that can be provided as a justification for the explicit substantive and institutional rules of the jurisdiction in question” (Dworkin 1977, 66).
And this is a process, according to Dworkin, that “must carry the lawyer very deep into political and moral theory.” Indeed, in later writings, Dworkin goes so far as to claim, somewhat implausibly, that “any judge’s opinion is itself a piece of legal philosophy, even when the philosophy is hidden and the visible argument is dominated by citation and lists of facts” (Dworkin 1986, 90).
Dworkin believes his theory of judicial obligation is a consequence of what he calls the Rights Thesis, according to which judicial decisions always enforce pre-existing rights: “even when no settled rule disposes of the case, one party may nevertheless have a right to win. It remains the judge’s duty, even in hard cases, to discover what the rights of the parties are, not to invent new rights retrospectively” (Dworkin 1977, 81).
In “Hard Cases,” Dworkin distinguishes between two kinds of legal argument. Arguments of policy “justify a political decision by showing that the decision advances or protects some collective goal of the community as a whole” (Dworkin 1977, 82). In contrast, arguments of principle “justify a political decision by showing that the decision respects or secures some individual or group right” (Dworkin 1977, 82).
On Dworkin’s view, while the legislature may legitimately enact laws that are justified by arguments of policy, courts may not pursue such arguments in deciding cases. For a consequentialist argument of policy can never provide an adequate justification for deciding in favor of one party’s claim of right and against another party’s claim of right. An appeal to a pre-existing right, according to Dworkin, can ultimately be justified only by an argument of principle. Thus, insofar as judicial decisions necessarily adjudicate claims of right, they must ultimately be based on the moral principles that figure into the best justification of the legal practices considered as a whole.
Notice that Dworkin’s views on legal principles and judicial obligation are inconsistent with all three of legal positivism’s core commitments. Each contradicts the Conventionality Thesis insofar as judges are bound to interpret posited law in light of unposited moral principles. Each contradicts the Social Fact Thesis because these moral principles count as part of a community’s law regardless of whether they have been formally promulgated. Most importantly, Dworkin’s view contradicts the Separability Thesis in that it seems to imply that some norms are necessarily valid in virtue of their moral content. It is his denial of the Separability Thesis that places Dworkin in the naturalist camp.
Kenneth Einar Himma
Seattle Pacific University
U. S. A.
Last updated: May 3, 2005 | Originally published: