Naturalism is an approach to philosophical problems that interprets them as tractable through the methods of the empirical sciences or at least, without a distinctively a priori project of theorizing. For much of the history of philosophy it has been widely held that philosophy involved a distinctive method, and could achieve knowledge distinct from that attained by the special sciences. Thus, metaphysics and epistemology have often jointly occupied a position of “first philosophy,” laying the necessary grounds for the understanding of reality and the justification of knowledge claims. Naturalism rejects philosophy’s claim to that special status. Whether in epistemology, ethics, philosophy of mind, philosophy of language, or other areas, naturalism seeks to show that philosophical problems as traditionally conceived are ill-formulated and can be solved or displaced by appropriately naturalistic methods. Naturalism often assigns a key role to the methods and results of the empirical sciences, and sometimes aspires to reductionism and physicalism. However, there are many versions of naturalism and some are explicitly non-scientistic. What they share is a repudiation of the view of philosophy as exclusively a priori theorizing concerned with a distinctively philosophical set of questions.
Naturalistic thinking has a long history, but it has been especially prominent in recent decades, and its influence is felt all across philosophy. This article will look at why and in what ways it is prominent and will describe some of the most influential versions of naturalism.
“Naturalism” is a term that is applied to many doctrines and positions in philosophy, and in fact, just how it is to be defined is itself a matter of philosophical debate. Still, the overall landscape of naturalism can be surveyed, and that is what we will do here. This discussion will not present a defense or critique of one or another specific version of naturalism. Its aim is to characterize the broad range of views typically identified as naturalistic and to say something about what motivates them. It will also locate the debate about naturalism in the larger setting of philosophical inquiry and theorizing overall.
Different periods in the history of philosophy exhibit different emphases in what are the most prominent and pressing concerns, and there are reasons why different issues are at the forefront at different times. In antiquity, basic questions about the constitution of reality motivated various conceptions about the material substance of things, about whether that substance is material, and about the relation between matter and whatever else might be constitutive of reality. Views ranged from variants of (recognizably naturalistic) materialism to those that included decidedly non-materialist and non-naturalist elements, such as Platonism and Aristotelianism. During the medieval period, debates over the status of universals and the nature of the intellect, the will, and the soul were especially central. In large part, this had to do with their significance for issues in natural theology. Also, questions concerning the relation between soul and body and whether and how the soul survives the death of the body were prominent. This was because of their significance for the individuation of persons, the possibility and nature of immortality, and for the nature of providence. These families of issues were prominent in all three of the great Western religious traditions. They are though, enduring philosophical questions. Many of them have roots in the Classical tradition.
In the early modern period debates about the respective roles of reason and the senses in knowledge were especially prominent. They had long been important, but there was a revived interest in skepticism and the possibility of knowledge. Also, debates concerning determinism and free will attained high visibility. In both cases, the explanation had to do, in part, with the impact of dramatic developments in scientific theorizing. Those developments led to large-scale revisions in the conceptions of many things, including human nature and human action. In the twentieth century a focus on questions of meaning and semantic issues played a role in many different philosophical movements (from logical positivism to ordinary language philosophy). It was widely thought that linguistic approaches might untie some age-old philosophical knots.
The main problems of philosophy have not really changed over time, but there are differences in what motivates certain formulations of them and ways of addressing them. In recent philosophy, the methods and the results of the sciences are again playing an increasingly important role in motivating new philosophical conceptions, and indeed, overall conceptions of philosophy itself. Various versions and defenses of naturalism are currently at the center of many philosophical debates. Naturalism is a philosophical view, but one according to which philosophy is not a distinct mode of inquiry with its own problems and its own special body of (possible) knowledge. According to many naturalists, philosophy is a certain sort of reflective attention to the sciences and it is continuous with them. They maintain that this is so not only in the sense that philosophy’s problems are motivated by the sciences, but also in that its methods are not fundamentally distinct. It might be said that the sciences afford us a more systematic, rigorous, and explanatory conception of the world than is supplied by common sense. In turn, we might say that philosophy is motivated by, and remains connected to the scientific conception of the world. There may be ways in which the scientific conception dramatically departs from common sense, but it is rooted in experience and the questions that arise at the level of common sense. Similarly, according to many defenders of naturalism, philosophy is not discontinuous with science. While it attains a kind of generality of conceptions and explanations that is perhaps not attained by the special sciences, it is not an essentially different inquiry. There are no separate philosophical problems that need to be addressed in a distinctive manner. Moreover, philosophy does not yield results that are different in content and kind from what could be attained by the sciences. Thus, in being a view about the world, naturalism is also a view about the nature of philosophy.
It is worthy of remark that while the sources of naturalism go back a very long way in Western philosophy, it has been especially prominent in philosophy in America. The pragmatist tradition, in which philosophers such as C. S. Peirce, William James, John Dewey, W. V. O. Quine, and Richard Rorty are key figures, has been crucial to the development of recent and contemporary naturalism. (There are other key figures in the American pragmatist tradition less clearly associated with its naturalist dimension. In recent years Nelson Goodman [1978; 1979] and Hilary Putnam  are examples.) There is a naturalistic cast to a great deal of pragmatist thought in a number of respects. It regards the general skeptical problem in epistemology as less than genuine. (We will see the significance of this below.) It closely ties meaning to experiential consequences, and it closely ties truth to methods of inquiry and the practical consequences of belief. Also, it often emphasizes the public or social and non-a priori character of inquiry (in contrast to the ego-situated method described by René Descartes, for example). It is anti-foundational, anti-skeptical, and fallibilist. It tends to put a great deal of weight on the accessibility to scientific resolution of genuine intellectual problems. In the American pragmatist tradition there is a wide spectrum of views, of course. But it is an outstanding example of a significant, modern, and still evolving tradition with significant naturalistic currents running in it. Peirce and other American pragmatists have influenced a great deal of recent philosophy of many types. As a result, they are beginning to be more thoroughly studied, after having been widely neglected for several decades.
At numerous places in this discussion we will see that the affirmation of science as the only genuine approach to acquiring knowledge is often a feature of naturalism. However, naturalism is not always narrowly scientistic. There are versions of naturalism that repudiate supernaturalism and various types of a priori theorizing without exclusively championing the natural sciences.
The debate about naturalism ranges across many areas of philosophy, including metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, and philosophy of mind, just to mention areas where it is especially prominent. There are two basic dimensions in which the debate takes place. One of them concerns (to put it simply) what there is, and the other concerns methods of acquiring belief and knowledge. There are several affiliated issues (supervenience, objectivity, various realism/antirealism debates, the character of norms of epistemic justification, the theory of meaning, and so forth) but they are all connected through those two main concerns.
With respect to the first, the naturalist maintains that all of what there is belongs to the natural world. Obviously, a great deal turns on how nature is understood. But the key point is that an accurate, adequate conception of the world does not (according to the naturalist) include reference to supernatural entities or agencies. According to the naturalist, there are no Platonic forms, Cartesian mental substances, Kantian noumena, or any other agents, powers, or entities that do not (in some broad sense) belong to nature. As a very loose characterization, it may suffice to say that nature is the order of things accessible to us through observation and the methods of the empirical sciences. If some other method, such as a priori theorizing, is needed to have access to the alleged entity or to the truth in question, then it is not a real entity or a genuine truth. According to the naturalist, there is only the natural order. If something is postulated or claimed to exist, but is not described in the vocabulary that describes natural phenomena, and not studied by the inquiries that study natural phenomena, it is not something we should recognize as real.
Unsurprisingly, the success of the sciences has been one of the main motivations for thinkers to embrace naturalism. The sciences have proved to be powerful tools for making the world intelligible. They seem to have such a strong claim to yield genuine knowledge that it is widely thought that whatever there is, is a proper object of science. That does not require that in embracing naturalism one also embrace determinism, physicalism, and reductionism. (However, it is true that many advocates of some or all of those are also very often naturalists.) While those specific theses about the structure or character of the world are not essential features of naturalism, many who endorse naturalism believe that over time scientific progress will make the case for physicalism, in particular. Even if, for example, attempts to provide fully reductive accounts of mental phenomena, certain biological phenomena, and values do not succeed, that would not be an insurmountable impediment to physicalism; or, at least that is the view of some defenders of naturalism. There is only the physical natural order, even if there are various constituents and aspects of it that are to be described in their own non-reducible vocabularies.
Naturalism could be said to involve a denial that there is any distinctively metaphysical area of inquiry. Thus, even if one’s preferred interpretation of naturalism is not reductionist or even physicalist (in a non-reductionist form), naturalism is a conception of reality as homogeneous in the sense that there is one natural order that comprises all of reality. There are no objects or properties that can only be identified or comprehended by metaphysical theorizing or non-empirical understanding. What exactly is the true theory of that single natural order may remain open to dispute. The key points are that our conception of reality need include nothing that is exclusively accessible to a priori theorizing, or to “first philosophy,” and there is only one natural order.
For natrualistic epistemology, the main claim is roughly the following: the acquisition of belief and knowledge is a (broadly) causal process within the natural order, and a priori norms, principles, and methods are not essential to the acquisition or justification of beliefs and knowledge. Compare David Hume and Descartes, for example. Hume explains our acceptance of beliefs on the basis of habits of association—causal tendencies that we can reflectively articulate into rules of epistemic practice. There are processes of belief acquisition and acceptance, but they are not underwritten by principles formulated a priori, nor are they structured by such principles. Epistemology is part of the overall science of human nature. It is not a project that is prior to or independent of the empirical sciences. There are norms of belief acceptance and of inquiry, but they are derived from consideration of experience and practice. (Here too, there is also an important point of contrast with Kant and also with the Platonic theory of knowledge as recollection of innate ideas, as well as with Descartes.)
Descartes held that the norms and method of belief acceptance must be independent of experience, and must have their grounds in reason alone. Otherwise, they would be vulnerable to exactly the sorts of skeptical objections that led to the search for epistemic principles in the first place. Even if one does not defend rationalism or a conception of the synthetic a priori, one might still think (as most philosophers have) that there are certain distinctively philosophical epistemological issues that can be dealt with only by distinctively philosophical (that is, a priori) methods. Hume and Descartes’ positions are rather like bookends, and there are many other, less “pure” or radical positions, in between theirs. But they are excellent examples of a causal-empirical approach on the one hand and a rationalist-a priori normative approach on the other.
There is a vast contemporary literature on the extent to which epistemology can be naturalized and what a naturalized epistemology would or should look like. At the core of the controversy is whether we need a philosophical theory in order to understand knowledge or epistemic justification, or is the so-called “problem of knowledge” really just another (broadly) empirical problem. If it is, then perhaps it can be addressed by the methods of the sciences (psychology, linguistics, neuroscience, cognitive science, etc.). This is not just the same as the debate between rationalists and empiricists, though it is related to it. It is open to an empiricist to argue that there are analytic truths that are known just by consideration of their meanings, and that this knowledge is not explicable in exclusively naturalistic terms. Similarly, if there are conceptual truths or logical truths that are not explicated in naturalistic terms, then that could be an important part of an empiricism that is not also a variant of naturalism. Still, there are some affinities between empiricism and naturalism that make them plausible candidates for having close relations.
Most epistemological theories are not as purely rationalistic as Descartes’. Also, though Kant’s influence has been enormous, there are few contemporary theorists who accept the conception of synthetic a priori knowledge on the basis of Kant’s transcendental idealism. Nonetheless, many epistemologists argue that fundamental issues concerning skepticism and the nature of epistemic justification cannot be successfully handled by the resources of naturalism. Or, they argue that they can only be handled in a question begging way by those resources. On the other hand, naturalists insist that there is nothing for a priori epistemology to be. Unless epistemology remains fully grounded in and tethered to the practices of scientific inquiry and the results they yield, it is cut off from the only sorts of evidence and strategies of explanation that can be conclusively vindicated or confirmed.
Recent decades have seen the development of not only different versions of naturalized epistemology, but also different overall approaches to it. One of the key distinctions is between what are sometimes called “replacement” theories and theories that develop naturalistic accounts of epistemic justification instead of repudiating the traditional epistemological project. The former are attempts to abandon the normative issue of epistemic justification. They substitute for it a more fully descriptive and causal account of our beliefs.
For example, at some points in his career, Quine openly rejected the traditional project of justification (at least as he construed it). He sought to fully assimilate epistemology to psychology (broadly construed), making it a part of empirical science, rather than a special inquiry that might underwrite scientific knowledge claims. He held that we should abandon (as hopeless) the project of identifying epistemically privileged foundational beliefs and inferring other beliefs from them, via a priori rules. Moreover, there is no clean break between supposed analytic truths on the one hand and synthetic truths on the other, and there is no realm of meanings distinct from linguistic behavior and the rest of behavior that it is embedded in. The philosophical distinction between truths of meaning and truths of fact does not reflect a genuine, explanatorily significant distinction. Like the entire project of a priori epistemology, it is a misrepresentation of what the actual problems of knowledge are. Also, while Hume had shown that there is no a priori justification of inductive inference, Quine maintained that that does not leave us with a profound skeptical difficulty. Rather, we are to examine and adjust our inductive practices in light of what we find to be empirically effective and supported without first (or ever) requiring that they be justified on non-empirical grounds. There is no “first philosophy” that underwrites science.
Other defenders of naturalistic epistemology, such as Alvin Goldman (1979; 1986), have developed causal accounts of justified beliefs or of knowledge, but still regard the philosophical project of epistemology as a genuine project, though it is to be carried out with naturalistic resources. We still are to speak in terms of beliefs being justified. In that respect there are versions of naturalism that continue to regard epistemology as involving normative considerations about belief and knowledge. Also, if we ascertain what is involved in beliefs being caused by reliable processes, we can deflect or defeat various general skeptical challenges. Those can be taken seriously, but naturalism can meet them. In meeting them, we will have attained substantive conditions of justification, but without requiring that they be accessible to a cognitive agent in order to be fulfilled. The causality of justified beliefs is one thing; whether an agent can articulate grounds for his beliefs is another. Justification can be explicated in non-epistemic terms, in terms of processes that are reliably truth-conducive. The problems of epistemology admit of naturalistic solutions, but need not repudiate the problems as unwelcome and less than genuine philosophical artifice.
Both the more and the less radical approaches share the central claim that the correct account of knowledge is in terms of reliable processes of belief-acquisition that are themselves explicated in empirical, and mainly causal, terms. The true beliefs of cognitive subjects, we might say, are one type of phenomenon that occurs in the natural world. We need not leave the latter in order to explain the former. There is no stand-alone problem of epistemic justification, requiring its own distinctive vocabulary and evidential considerations. Epistemic value, we might say, can be interpreted in terms of naturalistic facts and properties.
On the basis of the discussion so far, it might appear that naturalism is more or less a type of scientism, the view that only the methods of the sciences are legitimate in seeking knowledge, and that only the things recognized by the sciences as real are real. There are indeed naturalists who hold that view, but it is not a necessary feature of naturalism. As noted at the outset, there is considerable debate over what sorts of views should be recognized as naturalistic. There are theorists who wish to identify their views and approaches as naturalistic without embracing reductionist physicalism. There are also some approaches that can plausibly be described as naturalistic that are quite self-consciously anti-scientistic. In particular, there are philosophers who have been influenced by the later work of Ludwig Wittgenstein (1953) who regard their general approach as naturalistic, though it is just as critical of scientism as it is of traditional metaphysics.
This is not to say that Wittgenstein was deliberately making a case for naturalism. Rather, because of his emphasis on the importance of looking at actual practice, the significance of the wider social context of practices, and the avoidance of a priori theorizing, his work can be seen as having features of naturalism. Like G. E. Moore before him, Wittgenstein argued that the refutation of skeptical hypotheses is not required in order to succeed in making knowledge claims, and that we have knowledge of the external world without first proving that such knowledge is possible. Moreover, Wittgenstein rejected the view that there is some single, global method (including the scientific method) for arriving at a true account of the world, and his approach is explicitly oriented to honoring the differences between contexts. This is evident in his discussion of language games, for example. His philosophical explorations are anti-reductionist. They disavow any attempt to capture and explain everything in the terms of some overall theory within one or another special science. He vigorously opposed the attempt to force phenomena to “fit” some preferred theory or vocabulary. Indeed, in some important ways, his work is anti-theoretical without being anti-philosophical. (The same might be said of Thomas Reid  in the eighteenth century. It is also plausible to regard his views as naturalistic in important respects. One can see this especially in contrast to Kant, for example.)
If it is appropriate to describe this approach as naturalistic it is because of the ways in which Wittgenstein insisted that philosophical examination should look closely at the facts and should avoid theorizing about them in ways that lead to a large scale reconceiving of them or to postulation of entities, agencies, and processes. Very often the truth is disclosed by looking carefully, rather than by discovering something “behind” or distinct from what we encounter in experience. There is not some order of the “really real” or a transcendent order beyond what we meet with in the natural world. Yet, this does not mean that only a narrowly scientific understanding of it is a correct understanding. That sort of view itself would be an example of an overly restrictive approach that misrepresents the world and our understanding of it.
In addition, Wittgenstein was especially concerned to understand normative issues (such as the normativity involved in the use of concepts and in engaging in various practices) without explaining them away or reducing them to something non-normative. There are important normative issues even in contexts where we are not directly investigating questions concerning values. All sorts of practices, including various kinds of thinking and the use of language, have normative dimensions. Their normativity cannot be reduced to the occurrence of this or that event, or state, or causal process. For example, there may be no specific physical or psychological state or process that underlies or causally explains how a person is able to go on applying a concept to new cases, and to use a term in indefinitely many new situations, and to do so correctly in ways that are understood by others. That might mean that there is an irreducible normativity involved in the use of concepts and terms. There is nothing metaphysically exotic about that. It does not indicate that there are special normative entities or properties in addition to the practices and activities in question. There just is the normative, but natural activity of speaking, understanding, and making judgments. These are altogether familiar to all of us. If we want to understand what makes for the correct use of a term, for example, we should look at the way that it is used rather than look for some other fact or entity underlying its use. There is no special realm of meanings, or a thinking substance that grasps them, or a world of universals outside of space and time that is grasped by thought. (It is noteworthy that Plato understood the forms to be not only real, but normative realities.)
Many approaches to meaning, to the explication of inference and thought in general, and to the acquisition of concepts that have been influenced by Wittgenstein (see Wittgenstein on meaning), are naturalistic in an anti-metaphysical regard and in their close descriptive attention to the actual facts and natural and social contexts of the phenomena at issue. Traditional, central, philosophical debates, such as those between realism and nominalism in regard to universals, are purportedly deflated by Wittgensteinian approaches. That makes it plausible to regard them as naturalistic in at least a broad sense, though there is a very wide spectrum of Wittgenstein-influenced views and of Wittgenstein interpretation. Many different “-isms” can be interpretively connected to Wittgenstein’s work. Some Wittgensteinians and interpreters of Wittgenstein seem to support antirealism and nominalism. Others present views plausibly described as realist, but in a distinctively Wittgensteinian way. The range of Wittgenstein-influenced views is so wide, in large part, because he refused to be drawn into the use of many of the prevailing formulations of issues.
Wittgensteinian approaches have been very influential in the philosophy of social explanation, an area in which there has long been a debate about whether the methods of the natural sciences are appropriate to the kinds of phenomena it is claimed are uniquely encountered in social explanation. This is a place where we can see the breadth of the field of interpretation of naturalism. In one sense, Wittgensteinian approaches are naturalistic, in the ways described. At the same time, they are decidedly not naturalistic, if by “naturalism” we mean that the categories, concepts, and methods of the natural sciences are the only ones that are needed to explain whatever there is.
There are some affinities between Wittgenstein and some currents in American pragmatism with respect to the emphasis on the importance of the shared, public world for understanding language and the significance of practices. In particular, recent work by Richard Rorty (1979; 1982) has been important in drawing attention to that tradition and reinvigorating pragmatism in a post-Wittgensteinian context. His views and others like them have also attracted a great deal of criticism, reinvigorating debates about the interpretation and plausibility of naturalism. At the center of the debate is the issue of whether there are enduring philosophical problems about the nature of reality, and truth, and about value, for example, or just the more concrete, contingent, but still significant problems that individuals and societies encounter in the business of living.
As might be expected, many naturalistic thinkers feel discomfort at being grouped with Wittgenstein under the same heading. They regard his approach as unscientific and as much more permissive in regard to interpretation than more empirically fastidious approaches can accept. Still, it is plausible to regard at least some of Wittgenstein’s views as naturalistic even though they constitute a version of naturalism that differs from others in important respects.
Ethics is a context in which there are important non-scientistic versions of naturalism. For example, there are respects in which neo-Aristotelian virtue ethics can be regarded as naturalistic. It does not involve a non-natural source or realm of moral value, as does Kant’s ethical theory, or Plato’s or Moore’s. For Aristotle, judgments of what are goods for a human being are based upon considerations about human capacities, propensities, and the conditions for successful human activity of various kinds. Thus, while it is not a scientistic conception of human agency or moral value, it also contrasts clearly with many clearly non-naturalistic conceptions of agency and moral value. Central to the view are the notions that there are goods proper to human nature and that the virtues are excellent states of character enabling an agent to act well and realize those goods. This can be construed as naturalism in that many defenders of the view, especially recent ones, have argued that familiar versions of the so-called “fact-value distinction” are seriously mistaken. Correlatively, they have argued that the distinction between descriptive meaning and evaluative meaning is mistaken. Their view is that various types of factual considerations have ethical significance—not as a non-natural supervening property, and not merely expressively or projectively. The agent with virtues is able to acknowledge and appreciate the ethical significance of factual considerations, and act upon them accordingly.
While it is apt to call this “naturalism,” it is quite different from some paradigmatic examples of moral naturalism, such as the hedonistic utilitarianism of John Stuart Mill. Mill attempted to explain moral value in non-moral (naturalistic) terms—in terms of what people desire for its own sake and what they find pleasing. He sought to do this without any non-empirical assumptions or commitments about what people should desire, or what are proper goods for human beings. (He tried to make distinctions between inferior and superior pleasures on an empirical basis independent of antecedent normative commitments.) This is an attempt to demystify moral value by showing that it can be explained (even if not outright defined) in terms of facts and properties that are themselves non-moral and accessible to observation and the methods of the sciences. Other theorists, whether or not they accept Mill’s conception of what in fact has moral value, have pursued the project of theorizing in the same general direction in so far as they wish to show that moral values can be understood in terms of natural (including social) facts and properties.
In some respects, this is analogous to showing how, say, biological phenomena are explicable in physico-chemical terms. There are theories of moral value according to which it is constituted by, supervenes upon, or is defined in terms of non-moral, natural facts and properties. (Each is a different account of the relation between the moral and the non-moral. They are not simply different ways of saying the same thing.) This does not turn moral thought into a department of natural science, but it does mean that the explanation of what moral thought is about may very well depend extensively upon scientific methods. There may be regular and even law-like relations between non-moral facts and properties on the one hand, and moral facts and properties on the other. It may be that moral concepts are not entailed by or reducible to non-moral ones, but moral values have no independent ontological standing and are not essentially different in kind from natural phenomena in the way that Moore, for example, understood them to be. At the same time, moral values are real, and there are moral facts. The evaluative meaning of moral judgments is not merely expressive (see non-cognitivism in ethics). Moral judgments report moral facts, and moral claims are literally true or false. There are numerous versions of naturalistic moral realism.
There are other versions of ethical naturalism that owe much more to Hume and make the case for antirealism rather than realism. It was central to Hume’s moral theory that there are no value-entities or special faculties for perceiving or knowing them. According to Hume, moral value and moral motivation are to be explained in terms of facts about human sensibility. In this type of view, moral judgments are to be interpreted projectively, but they are also to be regarded as having all the form and force of cognitive discourse. On the one hand, commitment to objective values (with all of their alleged metaphysical and epistemological difficulties) is avoided. On the other hand, there is ample scope for moral argument, for critical assessment of moral views, and for regarding moral language as having much richer meaning than just being emotive in a person-relative way. The learning of moral concepts, the practice of reason-giving, and the adjustment of moral beliefs that we take to be part of moral experience and practice really are parts of it, though their genuineness does not depend upon there being moral facts or objective values. All that is needed is a common human sensibility and our propensity to make action-guiding judgments. To defenders of this approach, naturalism is not a way of explaining away moral values, or translating moral language into non-moral language. Instead it is the project of explaining all that moral values can be, in terms of sensibility, and showing how that is sufficient for full-fledged morality. It may be instructive to interpret this account of moral thought and discourse as analogous to Hume’s treatment of causal thought and discourse. There too, he severely criticized realist interpretations, but he also sought to show that his account could preserve the significance and the form of causal claims and causal reasoning. In that regard, the Humean approach can be said to explain moral judgments and causal judgments, rather than explaining them away.
Some Humean-influenced views of morality put weight on the role of evolutionary explanations. They can be important to the story of how there came to be creatures with morally relevant sentiments and moral concern, and also why certain kinds of cooperative and coordinated behavior—certain types of moral behavior—well-serve us as a species, and are regarded by us as valuable. That does not mean that we are “naturally” moral, but that naturalistic explanations are central to the account of the possibility and character of morality. The Humean-influenced approach (of which there are many variants) to meta-ethics is not reductive naturalism, but it certainly seems to count as a type of naturalism. And, as we have noted, special argumentation is needed to show why naturalism would have to be reductive.
There are also versions of evolutionary ethics that are not much influenced by Hume. Ethical theories strongly influenced by evolutionary thinking but without ties to Hume’s philosophy were developed in the latter half of the nineteenth century and the first half of the twentieth. Some were crude variants of Social Darwinism, but others were sophisticated attempts to show the naturalistic origin and ground of ethical value and practice. (Thomas Henry Huxley  is a good example of a subtle, sophisticated nineteenth century exponent of the role of evolution in ethics.) In recent decades there have been important developments in this tradition, incorporating knowledge of genetics and animal behavior and its physiological bases.
In general terms, evolutionary ethics attempts to show that the attitudes, motives, and practices that are part and parcel of ethical life are to be accounted for in terms of how they are adaptive. Virtues, vices, moral rules and principles, and so forth do not have an independent standing, or a basis in a priori reasoning. Moral values are not detected by a quasi-perceptual moral sense or by a faculty of intuition. This does not mean that morally significant behavior is robotic or uninfluenced by judgment and reasoning. Rather, the point is that needs are met by certain dispositions, susceptibilities, and behaviors, and the presence of those things themselves is explicable in terms of selective advantage in the struggle for existence. Altruism and various patterns of coordinated behaviors are explained in terms of the biological benefits they confer. They enhance fitness. That there is morality and concern for moral issues at all are facts that can be accounted for in terms of an account of how we came to be, and came to be the sorts of animals we are in a process of natural selection. Defenders of this view argue that only if one thinks morality must have its source in God or reason would one find this threatening to morality. It does not subvert virtue, or render moral motivation something base or no more than an animal function, like digestion or excretion. Morality is a no less real or significant part of our lives, but it is in our lives at all, in the ways that it is, because of our evolutionary history. We need not look elsewhere.
The philosophy of mind is another area in which naturalistic views have been prominent and highly controversial in recent times. Many theorists hold that the categories, concepts, and vocabulary needed to explain consciousness, experience, thought, and language are those of the natural sciences (and perhaps some of the social sciences, understood naturalistically). The impetus for this view comes from a number of directions, including developments in biological sciences, linguistics, artificial intelligence, and cognitive science. To many theorists it seems increasingly clear, or at least plausible, that the mind is as fully a part of nature as anything else. They hold that while the properties and processes of mental life may have distinctive features, (which, admittedly, may be especially difficult to study and to understand) they are not ultimately inexplicable by the methods of the sciences. The study of them is especially complicated because of the ways in which biochemical, physiological, social, developmental, and many other processes and events interact. But according to the naturalist, the mind is not “outside of nature.” It operates in accordance with principles fundamentally like those that govern other natural phenomena. Here again, the naturalist need not be a reductionist physicalist. The theorist of mind may be a non-reductionist physicalist (taking the view that the mental supervenes on the physical) or not take an explicit stand on physicalism one way or the other. Rather, the naturalist with respect to philosophy of mind may emphasize the claim that the study of the mind does not involve any methods other than those recognized in the various natural sciences. It requires no commitments to the existence of entities and properties other than those recognized in the sciences.
As before, Plato, Descartes, and Kant are excellent examples of non-naturalism concerning the mind. Their theories differ in important ways, but they all share the principle that the mind and its activities are not physical and are not governed by the laws of nature. This is not because of pre-scientific ignorance or lack of sophistication. It is because they found it virtually or literally incoherent that awareness, comprehension, and the activity of thought should just be part of what goes on in the natural order. Many theorists still find that incoherent. They argue that either the object of cognition is something non-natural, such as a state of affairs, or a proposition, or a universal (or a complex of instances of universals), or that cognition itself is something non-natural—or that both are. Thinking, the objects of thought, and the relations between them (which are often necessary relations, but not causally necessary relations) seem to be matters that are not susceptible to being rendered in naturalistic terms. (It may be that the objects of cognition are not exactly the same things as the objects of perception, which are natural objects and also artifacts made by human beings.) Indeed, even apart from disputes focused on naturalism these are some of the persistent, fundamental problems of philosophy of mind, and its relations to epistemology, metaphysics, and philosophy of language.
Modern critics of naturalism often point to (at least) two especially significant problem areas for naturalism. One of them concerns how a naturalistic conception of mind is to handle intentional states—states such as belief, desire, hope, fear, and others that have objects. These are expressed in the form, “X believes that…” or “X hopes that…” and so forth. These are states that are about something. Many mental states are intentional in this way, and this feature of being about something seems to be distinctive of mental states. A state of temperature, or a quantity, or a positive or negative charge, or a valence, or combustion, or the suppression of an immunological response is not about something. These and other states, events, and processes have causes (and effects) but do not have objects. They are not directed at anything in the way that many mental states are. There are difficult questions concerning the nature of intentionality and also the nature and status of the objects of intentional states. Are the latter propositions, or states of affairs, or something else? Many mental states (such as belief) seem to be representational. How is representation to be understood?
A second issue is the following. Is understanding the meaning of a sentence, or the grasp of a mathematical truth, or the grasp of other sorts of necessary truths (as in logic) something that can be exhaustively explained in terms confined to the language of the natural sciences and its referents? In addition to questions about how thought has intentional objects and about the objects of thought, there are questions about the form and structure of thought and whether they are susceptible to naturalistic treatment. Is the necessity of logical validity something that can be completely accounted for in causal-empirical terms? Are relations between concepts supervenient upon, or explicable in terms of, relations between events? Are they resistant to assimilation into natural causal processes, even if they are dependent upon them? (There are analogies here to the issue of epistemic justification and the status of moral values, which too may be dependent upon naturalistic phenomena, though not simply “nothing but” naturalistic phenomena.)
The insistence that the mind is not a separate substance is not sufficient to make for naturalism about the mind. Similarly, insisting that we can only learn language and develop cognitive abilities because of the way we have evolved is not enough to underwrite naturalism. It is not a view only about what is relevant to explain or understand a certain range of phenomena. It is a view about what is sufficient to do so. Substance dualism is very much out of favor, but it is hardly the only alternative to naturalism with regard to the mind. In this context, as in the other contexts, there is a broad range of views, many of them naturalistic, many of them not. It is not as though there is a single, prevailing naturalistic theory of mind. The debate about what naturalism about the mind should look like remains very much open and ongoing.
The debate about naturalism remains so very much alive and so complex. Much of it concerns just how narrowly or broadly to construe naturalism and how open it should be to the form and content of what is accepted as belonging to science. What if our best understanding of the sciences indicates that reductionism is at best “local,” confined to certain areas, and there is no single, fundamental level of description in which all scientific truths can be expressed? And what if the interpretation of the “physical” is expanded to include supervenient properties, including mental properties, and moral values? Would that be a defeat for naturalism, or only for certain versions of it? Or, suppose a theorist claimed that philosophy could dispense with a priori theorizing or with attempts to arrive at highly general theories altogether (the theory of knowledge, the theory of morality, the theory of meaning, etc.), say, in the manner of the later Wittgenstein? Would that rejection of “first philosophy” and the search for foundations or essences constitute a kind of naturalism? We can imagine a defender of that approach answering in the affirmative, and other self-avowed naturalists finding that inappropriate and misleading. In their view naturalism requires certain quite specific commitments about what there is and how it can be known or explained.
This does not mean that the debate about naturalism is merely or mainly verbal. There are significant, substantive issues involved. Some of them concern just how naturalism is to be interpreted, and some of them concern the truth of naturalism in one or another area. These are not matters of stipulation, but difficult, complex issues. In trying to resolve them there is considerable traffic back and forth between philosophical theorizing and empirical science. One could, for example, be a naturalist about moral value, but not a “global” naturalist, a naturalist about all things. Moral theorizing has some important relations with epistemology, metaphysics, and philosophy of mind, but one need not tackle all of those issues and relations at once in order to assess the claims of naturalism in one area. Or, at least that appears to be a workable approach. At the same time, part of the appeal of naturalism is its potentially global scope. It has the apparent merit of providing a single, or at least integrated overall account of what there is, and what it is like, and how it works—including the actions, experiences, and thoughts of rational animals.
Totalizing views have often had considerable appeal to philosophers. Such views promise to make the world intelligible with a single array of fundamental concepts. They purport to overcome the perplexities attending views in which the world is ultimately heterogeneous, with objects, properties, and processes of fundamentally different kinds, belonging to different categories. Objective idealism such as Hegel’s is one sort of totalizing view, and so is global naturalism, though the two are radically different from each other. Spinoza’s metaphysical theory according to which there is just one substance is another totalizing view, and so is phenomenalism, in its own way. Each is an attempt to produce the widest and most thorough intelligibility by identifying a small number of basic categories and principles through which things can be understood.
It is understandable that a great deal of philosophical theorizing should have a tendency to be reductionist or to seek a “privileged” vocabulary for describing the ultimate constituents of reality or the basic activities or processes that govern it. After all, many philosophers conceive the project of philosophy to include the task of articulating an account of the most general features of reality, knowledge, value, and so forth. In one respect, naturalism resists that tendency, in so far as it rejects the project of a priori theorizing as hopeless, irrelevant, or obsolete. Given the guiding intellectual disposition of naturalism, it seems that it would countenance as real whatever the progress of (empirical) enquiry indicates is required for complete explanations. It would be open to what is found. Rather than fashioning a completely general and abstract conception of reality, it focuses on the substantive explanations and theories that are developed in specific areas of inquiry. According to naturalism, if philosophy becomes detached from those, it is mere theory-building and does not afford us real understanding.
In another respect though, naturalism is a decidedly philosophical approach and an entrant in the grand debate about what is the true global view. As noted above, naturalism is itself a philosophical view, though it claims to be a rejection of a great deal that historically has been distinctive of philosophy. Even if naturalism is articulated in strictly empirical terms, and strives to be scientific, we are still faced with the issue of whether strictly empirical terms are adequate to capture and express all that there is and all we can know. It is not as though naturalism can avoid questions about whether it is itself a true view, and all the associated concerns about how to interpret truth, and what would make it a true view. The issue of whether naturalism is true may be the sort of issue that is not clearly resolvable in exclusively naturalistic terms. At least it seems that the view that it can be, is itself a distinctively philosophical view. Once we begin to explore such questions, we are of course doing philosophy, even if our aim is to make the case for naturalism.
For critiques of naturalism, see the Social Science article.
This list indicates titles of selected sources and is not an attempt to be exhaustive. It includes some of the most relevant works of thinkers referred to in the article and also some important works by thinkers who are not named in the article.
Last updated: April 19, 2009 | Originally published: August/26/2002
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