“Neo-Confucianism” is the name commonly applied to the revival of the various strands of Confucian philosophy and political culture that began in the middle of the 9th Century and reached new levels of intellectual and social creativity in the 11th Century in the Northern Song Dynasty. The first phase of the revival of the Confucian tradition was completed by the great philosopher Zhu Xi (1130-1200) and became the benchmark for all future Confucian intellectual discourse and social theory. Especially after the Song, the Neo-Confucian movement included speculative philosophers, painters, poets, doctors, social ethicists, political theorists, historians, local reformers and government civil servants. By the 14th Century Zhu’s version of Confucian thought, known as daoxue or the teaching of the way or lixue or the teaching of principle, became the standard curriculum for the imperial civil service examination system. The Neo-Confucian dominance of the civil service continued until the whole system was abolished in 1905.
The greatest challenge to Zhu Xi’s initial synthesis of the various themes and praxis of daoxue was presented by the great Ming philosopher, poet, general, and civil servant, Wang Yangming (1472-1529). Wang, while continuing many of the characteristic practices of the movement, argued for a different philosophical interpretation and cultivation of the xin or mind-heart, so much so that Wang’s distinctive philosophy is known as xinxue or the teaching of the mind-heart in order to distinguish it from Zhu’s teaching of principle. In the Qing Dynasty (1644-1911) there was a further reaction against the speculative philosophy of both Zhu and Wang and the movement known as hanxue of the learning of Han [Dynasty] arose to combat what were taken to be the grave mistakes of both Zhu and Wang. This last great Chinese Neo-Confucian movement is also know as the school of evidential research because of its commitment to historical and philological research in contradistinction to the Song and Ming fascination with speculative metaphysics and personal moral self-cultivation.
It is important to remember that along with being highly philosophical, the Neo-Confucian masters where also teachers of various forms of personal moral self-cultivation. From the Neo-Confucian perspective, merely abstract knowledge was useless unless conjoined with ethical self reflection and cultivation that eventuated in proper moral behavior and social praxis. The Neo-Confucians sought to promote a unified vision of humane flourishing that would end with a person becoming a sage or worthy by means of various forms of self-cultivation.
It is also vital to remember that Neo-Confucianism became an international movement and spread to Korea, Japan, and Vietnam. Neo-Confucianism flourished in all of these East Asian countries and since the 16th Century some of most creative philosophical work was achieved in Korea and Japan.
In the 20th Century, even amidst the tremendous political and military upheavals throughout the East Asian region, there was yet another revival movement based on Neo-Confucianism now known as New Confucianism. While the New Confucian movement is clearly an heir of its Neo-Confucian past, it is also deeply engaged in dialogue with Western philosophy and is emerging as fascinating form of global philosophy at the beginning of the 21st Century.
Before we explore the revival of Confucian learning throughout East Asia, we need to reflect on just what was being revived. Prior to the emergence of the “Neo-Confucian” thinkers, the Confucian tradition already had a long and distinguished tradition of commentary on the teachings of the famous teachers from the legendary past into the historical world of the Warring States and later.
The English labels “Confucianism” and “Neo-Confucianism” imply a close connection to the life and thought of Master Kong or Kongzi (Confucius), whose traditional dates are 551-479 BCE. If the term “Neo-Confucianism” is considered problematic because of its modern origin, its ancestor, “Confucianism,” is likewise imprecise and without a clear reference in traditional East Asian philosophical usage. Critical scholars have pointed out that there is no single Chinese, Korean, Japanese or Vietnamese traditional term that matches “Confucianism.” The closest term would be the hallowed Chinese designation of ru or scholar. Some have suggested that Confucianism should be renamed, they have suggested Ruism or the Ruist tradition; they point out that this would match more closely what Master Kong thought he was doing in teaching about the glories of Zhou culture. The problem is that ru originally meant a scholar of ritual tradition and not just followers of Master Kong. While it is true that, by the Song dynasty, ru did indeed come to mean a “Confucian” as opposed to Daoist or Buddhist scholars, this was not the case in the classical period. Therefore, it is true that all “Confucians” were ru, although not all ru scholars were followers of Master.
As we shall see, the use of the term “Neo-Confucian” is confusing and needs some careful revision. By Song times, there are some perfectly good Chinese terms that can be used to define the work of these later Confucian masters. There are a number of terms in use after the Song such as ru or classical scholar, daoxue or learning of the way, lixue or the teaching of principle, xingxue or teaching of the mind-heart, or hanxue or Han learning just to name a few. All of these schools fit into the Western definition of Confucianism, but the use of a single name for all of them obscures the critical differences that East Asian scholars believe are stipulated by the diverse Chinese nomenclature. While Confucians did almost always recognize each other across sectarian divides, they were passionately concerned to differentiate between good and bad versions of the Confucian Way.
Is it possible to provide a perfect and succinct definition of the Confucian Way? Modern critical scholars are extremely wary of any hegemonic set of essential criteria to define something as vast and diverse as the Confucian Way in all its diverse East Asian forms. For instance, is the Confucian tradition to be defined as an East Asian philosophical discourse or is it better understood as one of China’s indigenous religious wisdom teachings? Or is the Confucian Way something entirely different from what would be included or excluded by the criteria of the Western concepts of philosophy or religion?
Notwithstanding such proper scholarly reticence, two contemporary Confucian philosophers, Xu Fuguan and Mou Zongsan, have offered a suggestion about at least one sustaining and comprehensive motif that suffuses Confucian thought from the classical age to its modern revivals. First, Xu and Mou argue that Confucianism has always generated and sustained a profound social and ethical dimension to its philosophical and social praxis. This kind of commitment has lead many western scholars to define Confucianism as an axiological philosophical sensibility, a worldview ranging from social ethics to an inspired aesthetics. Second, accepting for a moment the axiological nature of much Confucian discourse, Xu and Mou give such philosophic reflections a particular name and call this informing motif of the Confucian Way “concern consciousness.” First, concern consciousness speaks of the perennial Confucian “concern” for proper social relations and hence the tradition’s abiding interest in ethical reflection and ethically edifying ritual praxis. Secondly, concern consciousness is always set within a social context. For instance, Confucian teachers have often taught that the folk etymology of ren or humaneness makes the point of social nature of all proper Confucian action: humaneness is at least two people treating each other as they ought to in order to sustain human flourishing. Therefore Xu and Mou argue that all Confucian thinkers will eventually return to an explication of some form of “concern consciousness” when they are giving a robust and detailed explanation of the rich teachings of the Confucian Way. An unconcerned Confucian is an oxymoron. The content and context of their concern for the world and the Dao will vary dramatically, yet the sense of concern, of having a care as the Quakers taught on the other side of Eurasia, remains a hallmark of Confucian philosophical sensibilities.
The historical development of the Confucian Way or movement has been variously analyzed in terms of distinct periods. The simplest version is that there was a great classical tradition that arose in the Xia, Shang and Zhou kingdoms that was perfected in the works and records of the legendary sage kings and ministers and was then continued and refined by their later followers such as Kongzi, Mengzi (Mencius) and Xunzi. The death of Kongzi in 481 BCE marked the end of the Spring and Autumn periods of the Eastern Zhou kingdom and the beginning of the era called the Warring States period. On the one hand, although later Chinese thinkers decried the ceaseless interstate warfare that characterized the era, on the other hand the Warring States period is remembered as the most creative philosophical epoch in Chinese history. All of the great indigenous schools of Chinese philosophy find their origin in this period from 480 to 221 BCE when the Qin state finally unified the empire under the rule of the First Emperor of the Qin. After the incredible cultural efflorescence of the Warring States intellectuals, all future philosophical achievements were deemed to be commentary on the depositions of the classical masters.
Later scholars have suggested that this binary division of Chinese philosophical history is too simple and that there are three or more clear divisions for the Confucian movement because it has demonstrated a longevity and continuity of maturation for more than two thousand five hundred years. For instance, some modern scholars suggest that, based on creativity and transformation of the tradition, there was a three-fold division of the classical period, the Neo-Confucian movements of the Song, Yuan, Ming and Qing dynasties and most recently the era defined by the impact of the modern West on the East Asian philosophical and religious Confucian worlds. The most complex periodization differentiates the achievement of Confucian thinkers over the centuries more subtly than either the binary or triadic divisions allow. A strong case can be made for defining six discrete eras in the historical development of the Confucian tradition in East Asia:
- The classical period beginning in the Xia, Shang and Zhou kingdoms: includes the justly famous Warring States philosophers (c. 1700-221 BCE)
- The rise of the great commentarial traditions on early classical texts during the Han dynasty (206 BCE—200 CE)
- The renewal of the Daoist tradition and the arrival of Buddhism (220-907 CE)
- The renaissance of the Song [“Neo-Confucianism”], the flowering in the Yuan and Ming dynasties, and the spread of Neo-Confucianism into Korea and Japan (960-1644 CE)
- The “Han Studies” or “Evidential Research” movements of the Qing dynasty and the continued growth of the movement in Korea and Japan (1644-1911 CE)
- The impact of the West, the rise of modernity, and the decline and reformation of the Confucian Way as “New Confucianism” (1912 CE to the present)
In order to give a capsule outline of the development of Confucianism down to the rise of the great Neo-Confucian thinkers in the Song, what follows is a very short set of outlines of the first three of these six periods, which preceded the rise of Neo-Confucian movements. It is important to remember that although Confucianism began as a Chinese tradition it became an international movement throughout East Asia. A full understanding of Neo-Confucianism requires that attention be paid to its advancement in Korea, Japan and Vietnam along with the continuing unfolding of the tradition in China.
According to Master Kong, there was a long and distinguished tradition of sage wisdom that stretched back even before the Xia and Shang dynasties. Master Kong sought to collect, edit and transmit these precious texts to his students in the hope that such an education project would lead to the renewed flourishing of the culture of humaneness based on the teachings of the sage kings and their ministers. Master Kong was followed by a stellar set of Confucian masters, the most important being Mengzi and Xunzi. These great Confucian masters not only argued among themselves about the nature of the Confucian way, they confronted the attacks of the other great schools and thinkers of the Warring States period. The texts attached to the names of these great scholars have served, along with the other early canonical material, to define the contours of the Confucian Way ever since the Warring States period.
While Master Kong would have rejected the notion that he founded or created a new tradition, it is to his Analects that countless generations of Confucians return to discover wisdom and insight into the nature of Confucian culture. Further, great teachers such as Master Meng and Master Xun continue to defend and refine the teachings of Master Kong in robust debate with the other schools of the Warring States period. Although there has always been skepticism about the claim for such authorship, traditional Confucian scholars held that Master Kong himself had an editorial role in the compilation of many of the canonical texts that became ultimately the Thirteen Confucian Classics.
The Han dynasty contribution to the growth of the Confucian Way is often overshadowed by the grand achievements of the classical period. Yet the Han scholars edited almost all of the texts that survived and began to add their own critical commentaries and interpretations to the canonical texts. In many cases these Han commentaries are now recognized as classics in their own right. One of the features of the Confucian tradition is the use of various forms of commentaries as a vital philosophical genre. It is a period that reveres historical traditions and hence the commentary is viewed as a proper way to transmit the traditional learning.
After the fall of the Han dynasty, there was a marked revival of various facets of the earlier Daoist traditions. The movement was called xuanxue or arcane or abstruse (profound) learning. Xuanxue thinkers were highly eclectic; sometimes they praised and used the great Warring States Daoist texts such as the Daodejing or the Zhuangzi to frame their complicated philosophical and religious visions, and sometimes they reframed materials drawn from the Confucian tradition as well. It is universally recognized that the great xuanxue scholars brought a new level of philosophical sophistication to their analysis of the classical and Han texts. Moreover, this was also the epoch of the emergence of the great Daoist religious traditions that mark the Chinese and East Asian landscape from this era down to the present day. The Daoist religious founders and reformers also claimed the early texts such as the Daodejing, Zhuangzi and the Yijing [The Book of Changes] as their patrimony.
The xuanxue revival was ultimately eclipsed by the arrival of Buddhism in China. The era stretching roughly from 200 to 850 marks the height of the influence of Buddhism on Chinese culture. Along with the translation of the immense Buddhist canon into Chinese, the scholar monks of this era also created the unique Chinese Buddhist schools that went on to dominate the religious life of East Asia. The Buddhists also introduced novel social institutions such as monastic communities for both men and women. Great Chinese schools of Buddhist philosophy and practice were founded, such as the Tiantai, Huayan, Pure Land and Chan traditions. In short, the impact on Chinese society and intellectual life was immense and shaped the future of Confucian philosophy.
It is very important to remember that Confucianism continued to play a vital and even creative role in the history of Chinese philosophy while Buddhism was ascendant. Confucianism never “disappeared” from sight and in fact continued to dominate elite family life and governmental service. Confucianism remained the preferred approach to political and social thought and much personal and communal ethical reflection was concurrent with the powerful contributions of Daoist and Buddhist thinkers.
Both traditional and modern historians of China mark the year 755 CE as the great divide within the Tang dynasty. This was the year of the catastrophic An Lushan rebellion and although the Tang dynasty formally lasted until its final demise in 906, it never recovered its full glory. And glorious the Tang was; it is the dynasty always remembered as one of the high points of Chinese imperial history in terms of political, military, artistic, philosophical and religious creativity. For instance, it was the flourishing and cosmopolitan culture of the Tang world—with everything from metaphysics to painting, calligraphy, poetry, food and clothes—that spread throughout East Asia into the emerging societies of Korea and Japan. Moreover, while the Tang is noted as the golden age of Buddhist philosophical originality in terms of the formation of important Chinese schools such as the Tiantai, Huayan, Pure Land and Chan [Zen in Japanese pronunciation], a number of important Confucian thinkers began to challenge the intellectual and philosophical supremacy of Buddhism.
Three great Confucian scholars stand out as the earliest “Neo-Confucians”: Han Yu (768-824), Li Ao (ca. 772-836) and Liu Zongyuan (773-819). All three scholars launched a double-pronged attack on Buddhism and a concomitant appeal for the restoration and revival of the Confucian Way. Just after the deaths of this trio of Confucian scholars, a late Tang emperor began a major persecution of Buddhism. Although not a bloody event as persecutions of religions go, many major schools failed to revive fully after 845 and this date, along with the earlier rebellion of An Lushan, marks dramatic changes in the philosophical landscape of China.
Along with his friends Han Yu and Li Ao, Liu Zongyuan was regarded as one of the most famous scholars of his time. Liu is perhaps more of a bridging figure between the early and later Tang intellectual worlds, but he still expressed a number of highly consistent Neo-Confucian themes and did so with a style that links him forward to the Song masters. For instance, Liu, unlike many earlier Tang Confucians, was interested in finding what he thought to be the principles expounded in the classic texts rather than a convoluted, arcane if compendious commentarial exegesis. He searched for the true meaning of the sages in the texts and not merely to study the philological subtlety of traditional commentarial lore. Further, Liu passionately believed that the authentic Dao was to be found in antiquity, by which he meant the true ideals of the Confucian teachings of the early sages. Along with this commitment to finding the confirmed teachings of the sages in the historical records, Liu was committed to political engagement based on these sage teachings. Like all the later Neo-Confucians, Liu asserted the need to apply Confucian ethical norms and insights to political and social life.
Han Yu is considered to be the most important and innovative of the Tang Confucian reformers. He was a true renaissance man; he was an important political figure, brilliant essayist, Confucian philosopher and anti-Buddhist polemicist. What gives his work such power is that he carried out his various roles with a unified vision in mind: the defense and restoration of the Confucian Way.
In order to restore the Confucian Way, Han Yu developed a program of reform and renewal manifested in a literary movement called guwen or the ancient prose movement. But Han was doing much more than simply calling for a return to a more elegant prose style. He was urging this reform in order to clarify the presentation of the ideas of the Confucian tradition that was needlessly obscured by the arcane writing styles of the current age. He wanted to write clearly in order to express the plain truth of the Confucian Way. Moreover, Han stressed a profound self-cultivation of the Dao. In order to do so, Han accentuated the image of the sage as the proper role model for humane self-cultivation. And last, but certainly not least, Han and his colleagues proposed a Confucian canon-within-the-canon of a select set of texts that especially facilitate such a quest, namely such works as The Doctrine of the Mean, The Great Learning, the Analects and the Mengzi .
Along with his reform of the style and canon of the teaching of the Confucian Way, Han also explained his philosophical program in terms of the vocabulary and sensibility of the later Song Neo-Confucian revival. As Han put it, the sage seeks “to develop one’s nature to perfection through the penetration of principle” or qiongli jinxing. Han himself wrote in an exegesis of a passage in the Analects in the examinations of 794:
Answer: The sage embraces integrity (cheng) and enlightenment (ming) as his true nature (zhengxing); he takes as his base the perfect virtue; this is equilibrium and harmony (zhongyong). He generates (fa) these inside and gives them form outside; they do not proceed from thought, yet all is in order. This mind [-heart] set on evil has no way to develop in him, and preferable behavior cannot be applied to him; so only the Sage commits no errors (Hartman 1986: 201).
Han Yu’s friend Li Ao shared similar views and wrote a highly influential essay on human nature that sounded more of the philosophic themes that would dominate the Song Neo-Confucian revival. While Li’s vision of the self might be a bit too quiescent for the tastes of the more activist Song literati, it still captured the tone of the philosophical revival:
Therefore it is sincerity that the sage takes as his nature, absolutely still and without movement, vast and great, clear and bright, shining on Heaven and Earth. When stimulated he can then penetrate all things in the world. In act or in rest, in speech or silence, he always remains in the ultimate. It is returning to his true nature that the worthy man follows without ceasing. If he follows it without ceasing he is enabled to get back to the source (Barrett 1992: 102).
In many ways it was this attempt to “get back to the source” in the classical Confucian texts that characterizes the philosophical endeavors of the Song, Yuan, Ming and Qing masters. There is a continuous debate about what this nature is, whether it is in constant movement or is still; what “the ultimate” ultimately is or what the nature of the source of all of this is.
One of the most common assumptions about the philosophical achievements of the Neo-Confucian literati is that it was stimulated into life by interaction with Daoist and Buddhist thinkers. While there is a genuine element of truth in this stimulus theory of the origins of Neo-Confucianism, it is also true that, once prompted by the best of Daoist and Buddhist thought, the Neo-Confucians constructed their philosophies out of materials indigenous to the historical development of the Confucian Way. For instance, I have chosen to call this historical background the Confucian Way (rudao) because this was the concept used by the great Song masters. They argued that they were not inventing something new but were rather reviving “this culture of ours” as the true Dao of the sage kings of antiquity as transmitted by Master Kong and Master Meng. Yet the materials, the traits, concepts, themes and motifs the Song masters used in reconstructing the Confucian Way were drawn almost exclusively from the classical repertoire. These concepts, traits, themes and terms include:
- Ren as the paramount virtue and marker for all the other virtues such as justice/yi, ritual action/li, wisdom or discernment/zi and faithfulness/xin; these five constant virtues provide the axiological sensibility to the whole Neo-Confucian enterprise; these are linked to filial piety/xiao as an expression of primordial familial relationships.
- Li as ritual action; the social glue that holds society together and in fact helps to constitute the humane person.
- Tian or heaven and tianming or the Mandate of Heaven; di or earth; whether we should use a capital “H” for tian is an important question for the Neo-Confucian philosophy of religion; Tian, di and ren or heaven, earth and human beings form an important cosmological triad for the Neo-Confucians.
- Li as principle, pattern or order to the whole of the cosmos; a key Song philosophic term as a little used early Confucian concept.
- Xin or the mind-heart; the living center of the human person; needs to be cultivated by proper ritual in order to realize true virtue.
- Xing or human tendencies, dispositions or nature; this is the principle/li given to each emerging person by tian as the mandate for what the person ought to be.
- Qi or vital force or material force that functions as the dynamic force or matrix out of which all object or events emerge and into which they all return when their career is completed.
- Qing as emotion, desire and passion; intimately related to qi/vital force as the dynamic side of the cosmos.
- Dao wenxue & zun dexing or serious study and reflection or honoring the moral tendencies or dispositions as designations of two different ways of cultivating the xin/mind-heart and as contrasting modes of moral epistemology.
- gewu or the investigation of things was a key [and highly contested] epistemological methodology for the examination of the concrete objects and events of the world.
- Cheng or sincerity, genuineness and the self-actualization of the moral virtues such that one achieves a morally harmonious life via various forms of xiushen or self-cultivation by means of such praxis as jing mindfulness or attentiveness; this praxis is the “how” of the moral self-cultivation of the five constant virtues.
- Nei/wai as the inner and outer dimensions of any process; often also used for the “king without, sage within”; often also discussed in terms of the opposition of si/selfishness and pian/partiality or one-sidedness and gong of public spirit.
- tiyong or substance and function and ganying or stimulus and response as typical analytic dyads used to describe the reactive movement, generations, productions and emergence of the objects and events of the cosmos.
- liyi fenshu or the teaching that principle is one or unified while its manifestations are many or diverse; often seen as the characteristic holistic organic sensibility and yet realistic pluralism of Neo-Confucian thought.
- daotong or the Transmission of the Way or Succession, or Genealogy of the Way; Zhu Xi’s masterful account of the revival of the Confucian Way by a set of Northern Song philosophical masters.
- siwen or “this culture of ours” as the expression of refined self-cultivation and the manifestation of principle from the family to the cosmos.
- He or harmony and zhong or centrality as designations of the goals or outcomes of the successful cultivation of all the virtues necessary for humane flourishing.
- zhishan or the highest good as the realization of harmony and centrality; the ideal would be to become a sheng or sage (theoretically possible but in practice extremely difficult) or a junzi, a worthy or noble person.
- Taiji or the Supreme Polarity or Supreme Ultimate as the highest formal trait of the principle of the whole cosmos and for each particular thing; often discussed in terms of benti or the origin-substance or substance and source of all objects and events.
- Dao or the perfect good of all that is, will or can be; the totality of the cosmos as the shengsheng buxi or generation without cessation; also usually implies a moral “more” to the myriad things of the cosmos.
Zhu Xi’s (1130-1200) version of and description of the revival of Confucian thought formed the paradigm for the main philosophical developments that give rise to the Western notion of Neo-Confucianism and the variety of East Asian designations of the various Song movements such as daoxue. Other thinkers would adopt, modify, challenge, transform and sometimes abandon Zhu’s philosophy and his narrative of the development of the tradition; nonetheless, it is Zhu’s version of the Confucian Way that became the paradigm for all future Neo-Confucian discourse for either positive affirmation or negative evaluation. It is Master Zhu who also provides the philosophical interpretation of the rise of Neo-Confucianism that defines the historical accounts of the tradition from the Southern Song on. In short, Zhu’s theory of the daotong or the transmission or succession (genealogy) of the Way not only provides the content for the tradition but also the historical context for its further analysis by partisans and critics in the Yuan, Ming and Qing dynasties.
Zhu Xi inherited the rich complexity of the revival of Confucian thought from a variety of Northern Song masters. In organizing this heritage into an enduring synthesis, Zhu was highly selective in his choices about who he placed in the daotong or the succession of the way or the true teachings drawn from the legendary sages; historical paladins such as the Kings Wen, Wu and the Duke of Zhou, and then Master Kong and Master Meng as the consummate philosophers of the classical age. It is always important to remember that the Song cultural achievement is much broader then Zhu’s favored short list of Northern Song masters. Anyone interested in the history of Song Confucian thought will need to pay careful attention to thinkers as diverse as the Northern Song scholars and activists such as Fan Zhongyan (989-1052), Ouyang Xiu (1007-1072), Wang Anshi (1021-1086), Sima Guang (1019-1086), Su Shi (10-37-1101) and Southern Song colleagues and critics of Zhu such as Lu Xiangshan (1139-1193) and Chen Liang (1143-1194)—just to give a short list of major Song philosophers, scholars, politicians, historians, social critics and poets.
Zhu Xi’s own list included Zhou Tunyi (1017-1073), Zhang Zai (1020-1077), Cheng Hao (1032-1085) and Cheng Yi (1033-1107) [and though not canonized by Zhu, any such list would be incomplete without recognition of Shao Yong (1011-1077)]. Each one of these thinkers, according to Zhu, contributed important material for the recovery of “this culture of ours” and to the formation of daoxue as the appropriate Confucian teaching of the Song cultural renaissance. Zhu’s unique contribution to the process was to give philosophical order to the disparate contributions of the Northern Song masters.
What Zhu Xi did was to give a distinctive ordering to the kinds of terms listed above; he gave them a pattern that became the philosophical foundation of daoxue. For those who disagreed, such as Lu Xiangshan and the later Ming thinker Wang Yangming (1472-1529), Zhu provided the template of Song thought that must be modified, transformed or even rejected, but never ignored.
The most famous innovation Zhu provided, based on the original insights of the two Cheng brothers and Zhang Zai was to frame daoxue philosophy via the complicated cosmological interaction of principle/li and vital force/qi. To understand Zhu’s argument, we must consider how the question of the relationship of principle and vital force presented itself to Zhu Xi as a philosophical problem in need of a solution. Zhu understood his analysis of principle and vital force to be the answer to the question of interpreting the relationship of the human mind-heart, human natural tendencies and the emotions. Trying to resolve how all of this fit together, Zhu borrowed a critical teaching of Zhang Zai to the effect that the mind-heart unifies the human tendencies and the emotions. Zhu then went on to claim that analytically understood this meant that the principle qua human tendencies or dispositions gave a particular order or pattern to the emerging person and that the dyad of principle and vital force coordinated and unified the actions of the mind-heart. In other words, Zhu discerned a tripartite patterning or principle of the emergence of the person, and by extension, all the other objects or events of the world in terms of form or principle, dynamics or vital force and their unification via the mind-heart: the mature schematic is form, dynamics and unification. Moreover, once this unification of the principle and vital force was achieved and perfected, the outcome, at least for the human person, was a state of harmony or balance.
Zhu’s ingenious synthesis, to which he gave the name daoxue or teaching of the way, accomplished two different ends. First, its breadth of vision provided Confucians with a response to the great philosophical achievements of the Chinese Buddhist schools such as the Tiantai or Huayan. Second, and more important, it outlined a Confucian cosmological axiology based upon the classical Confucian texts of the pre-Han era as well as an explanation for and analysis of the coming to be of the actual objects or events of the world. Zhu achieved this feat by showing how all the various concepts of the inherited Confucian philosophical vocabulary could be construed in three different modalities based on the pattern of form, dynamics and unification.
For instance, the analysis of the human person was very important for Zhu Xi. Each person was an allotment of vital force generated by union of the parents. Along with this allotment of qi or vital force, each person inherited a set of natural tendencies or what has often been called human nature. The subtlest portion of the vital force becomes the mind-heart for each person. The mind-heart has both cognitive and affective abilities; when properly cultivated, the mind-heart, for instance, can recognize the various principles inherent in its own nature and the nature of other objects and events. And when subject to proper education and self-cultivation, the mind-heart can even learn to correctly discern the various is/ought contrasts found in the world in order to sustain human flourishing via ethical action. In short, the mind-heart, as the experiential unity of concern consciousness becomes the human agent for creative and humane reason. The most pressing human is/ought contrast is that between the nature of principle as the ethical tendencies of human nature and the dynamic flux of human emotions that are governed, without proper self-cultivation, by selfishness and one-sidedness. There is nothing evil in an Augustinian sense of the human emotions save for the fact that they are much too prone to excess without the guidance of principle.
When asked to give an analytic account of this portrait of the human person, Zhu Xi then noted that this was to be explained by recourse to the concepts of the particular principle for each object or event, vital force of each such object or event and the normative or “heavenly mandate” of each object or event, which Zhu Xi called the Supreme Ultimate or Polarity. The whole system was predicated on the daoxue conviction of the ultimate moral tendency of the Dao to regulate the creative structure of the ceaseless production of the objects and events of the world. The world was thus to be seen as endlessly creative and relentlessly realistic in the sense that this cosmic creativity of the Dao eventuated in the concrete objects and events of the world.
The experiential world of the human mind-heart and the analytic schema of the unification of principle and vital force could also be described by the use of classical Confucian selective or mediating concepts such as cheng or self-actualization of jen or ultimate humanization as the paramount human ethical norm. Cheng and jen provide the modes of self-actualization and the methods of self-cultivation of the various emotional dispositions that give moral direction to the person when the person is grasped by a proper recognition of the various is/ought contrasts that inevitably arise in the conduct of human life. Hence the concern-consciousness of the person is the basis of individual creativity and manifests the particular principle of the mandate of heaven in a specific time and place for each person. Cosmic creativity or the ceaseless production of the objects and events of the cosmos replicates itself in the life of the person, and when properly actualized or integrated, can cause the person to find the harmony and balance of a worthy or even a sage. Thus even Zhu Xi’s explanation of the role of formal analysis, the arising of the existential manifestation of human nature and human emotion via the various mediating or selective concepts appropriate to the various levels of abstract or concrete determination itself takes on a carefully crafted triadic structure that manifests the proper discernment of the various dyadic conceptual pairs so evident in classical Confucian discourse. Both the tensions of the contrasting pairs such as nature and emotion are preserved and yet re-inscribed in the various allotments of the qi of each of the objects or events of the cosmos with a vision of their harmonious and balanced creative interaction. Zhu’s world is truly one of liyi fenshu or principle is one [unitary], whereas the manifestations are many.
Zhu Xi was equally famous for this theory of the praxis of the self-cultivation of the ultimately moral axiology of his multi-level system of philosophical analysis. His preferred method was that of gewu or the investigation of things. Zhu Xi believed that all the objects and events of the world had their own distinctive principle and that it was important for the student to study and comprehend as many of these principles as possible. It was a method of intellectual cultivation of the mind-heart that included both introspection and respect for external empirical research. In many respects, gewu was an attempt toward finding an objective and inter-subjective method to overcome pian or the perennial human disinclination to be one-sided, partial or blinkered in any form of thought, action and passion. In Zhu’s daoxue a great deal of emphasis was placed on reading and discerning the true meaning the Confucian classics, but there was also room in the praxis for a form of meditation known as quiet-sitting as well as empirical research into the concrete facts of the external world. The debates about the proper way to pursue self-cultivation and the examination of things proved to be one of the most highly debated sets of interrelated philosophical concerns throughout the Neo-Confucian world.
In terms of philosophical debate about the worthiness of daoxue, there was a great deal of disagreement about a variety of issues in the Song, Yuan, Ming and Qing dynasties. The Qing scholars were the most radical in their critique and merit a separate section; however, there were immediate Song dynasty rejoinders to Zhu Xi who argued against part of the synthesis on philosophical grounds. The first major rebuttal came from Zhu’s friend and critic Chen Liang (1143-1194), one of the great utilitarian philosophers of the Confucian tradition. What worried Chen about Zhu’s daoxue was that it was too idealistic and hence not suited to the actual geopolitical demands of the Southern Song reality. While it is clear that Zhu was passionately involved in the politics of his day, Chen contended that the world was a more empirically complex place than Zhu’s system implied. “I simply don’t agree with [your] joining together principles and [complex] affairs [as neatly and artificially] as if they were barrel hoops” (Tillman 1994: 52).
The nub of the debate revolved around the proper understanding of the notion of “public” or gong, gongli, public benefit. Here Chen broke with Zhu and suggested that good laws were needed just as good Neo-Confucian philosophers trained in a metaphysical praxis such as daoxue. “The human mind-heart (xin) is mostly self-regarding, but laws and regulations (fa) can be used to make it public-minded (gong)….Law and regulations comprise the collective or commonweal principle (gongli)” (Tillman 1994:16).
Such arguments for pragmatic political theory and even an appeal to the beneficial outcomes of carefully constructed legal regimes were never well received in the Neo-Confucian period, even if they did point to some genuinely diverse views within the Song Confucian revivals.
The most influential critique of Zhu Xi’s daoxue also came from another good friend, Lu Xiangshan (1139-1193). The crux of the philosophical disagreement resides in Lu’s different interpretation of the role of the mind-heart in terms of the common Neo-Confucian task of finding the right method for evaluating the moral epistemology of interpreting the world correctly. In a dialogue with a student, Lu pinpointed his argument with Zhu:
Bomin asked: How is one to investigate things (gewu)?
The Teacher (Lu Xiangshan) said: Investigate the principle of things.
Bomin said: The ten thousand things under Heaven are extremely multitudinous; how, then, can we investigate all of them exhaustively?
The teacher replied: The ten thousand things are already complete in us. It is only necessary to apprehend their principle (Huang 1977: 31).
There are two important things to notice about Lu’s critical response to the question of the examination of things. First, in many ways Lu does not disagree with the basic cosmological outline provided by Zhu Xi. Second, the philosophic sensibility, however, becomes even more focused on the internal self-cultivation of the person. Many scholars have remarked upon the fact that we find a turn inward in so much Song and Ming philosophy, and none more so than in Lu’s intense desire to find principle within the person. Of course, this is not to be understood as a purely subjective idealism. Rather, Lu would argue that only by finding principle in the mind-heart could the person then effectively comprehend the rest of the world. The point is not a solipsistic retreat into subjective and relativistic reveries of isolated individuality but rather a heightened ability to interpret and engage the world as it really is. The critical question is to find the proper place to start the investigation of things. If we start with the things of the world, we fall prey to the problems of self-delusion and partiality that infect the uncultivated person. But if we can find the correct place and method to investigate things and comprehend their principles, then we will understand the actual, concrete unity of principle.
Centuries later in the mid-Ming dynasty, Wang Yangming (1472-1529) sharpened what he took to be Lu’s critique of Zhu Xi. Wang’s philosophy was inextricably intertwined with of his eventful life. Wang also had the richest life of any of the major Neo-Confucian philosophers: he was a philosopher of major import, a poet, a statesman and an accomplished general. Wang began as a young student by attempting to follow Zhu’s advice about how to gewu or investigate things. With a group of naïve young friends they went into a garden to sit in front of some bamboos in order to discern the true principle of bamboo. The band of young scholars obviously thought that this would be an easy task. One by one they fell away, unable to make any progress in their quest to understand bamboo principle. Wang was the last to give up and only did so after having exhausted himself in the futile effort. Wang recounts that he simply believed that he lacked the moral and intellectual insight to carry out the task at hand; at this time he did not question Zhu’s master narrative about how to engage the world as a Confucian philosopher.
Later during a painful political exile in the far south of China, Wang Yangming had a flash of insight into the problem of finding the true location of principle. As Tu Weiming writes, “For the first time Yangming came to the realization that “My own nature is, of course, sufficient for me to attain sagehood. And I have been mistaken in searching for the li [principle] in external things and affairs [shiwu]” (Tu 1976: 120). Wang clearly understood this enlightenment experience as a confirmation that Lu Xiangshan was correct when Lu had declared that principle was to be found complete within the mind-heart of the person. In much greater detail than Lu, Wang then set out to develop the philosophical implications of the primordial insight into the proper way to carry out Confucian moral epistemology and self-cultivation. And after having straightened out the epistemology, Wang then went on to explain how the Confucian worthy should act in the world. This strong emphasis on the cultivation of the mind-heart led to the categorization of Wang’s teaching as a xinxue or teaching of the mind-heart as opposed to Zhu’s lixue or teaching of principle, and, in fact, this is the way later scholars often labeled the teachings of Zhu and Wang.
The way Wang taught about the task of realizing what he called the innate goodness of human nature was his famous doctrine of the unity of knowledge and action. As Wang said, “Knowledge is the direction for action and action is the effort for knowledge” and “Knowledge is the beginning of action and action is the completion of knowledge” (Ching 1976: 68). The problem that Wang was addressing was the deep concern that Zhu’s method for examining things in order to cultivate the essential goodness of the mind-heart was too fragmented and that such epistemological fragmentation would eventuate in moral failure and cognitive incompetence. Real praxis and theory could not be separated, and even if Wang acknowledged that Zhu was a sincere seeker after the Dao, Wang believed that Zhu’s methods were hopelessly flawed and actually dangerous to the cultivation of the Confucian worthy.
There was yet another philosophical realignment within Ming thought that is harder to identify with the specific teachings of any one master, namely the debate over the role of qing or emotion within the Neo-Confucian world of discourse [representative scholars would be Li Zhi (1527-1602) and Ho Xingyin (1517-1579)]. The nature of the emotions or human feelings was always a topic of reflection within the broad sweep of the historical development of Confucianism because of the persistent Confucian fascination with moral anthropology and ethics. Zhu Xi had a very important place for the emotions in his teachings of the way, though many later thinkers felt that Zhu was too negative about the function of the emotions. While it was perfectly clear that Zhu never taught that the emotions per se were evil or entirely negative, he did teach that the emotions needed to be properly and carefully cultivated in terms of the conformity of the emotional life to the life of principle. Zhu thematized this as the contrast between the daoxin or the Mind of Dao and the renxin or the Mind of Humanity (the mind of the psychophysical person). Moreover, it was also perfectly clear that Zhu taught that the truly ethical person needed to realize the Mind of Dao in order to actualize the human tendencies as mandated by heaven for each person. If not hostile to the emotions, Zhu was wary of them as the prime location for human self-centered and partial behavior.
By the late Ming dynasty many of the followers of Wang Yangming harshly questioned what they took to be the negative Song teachings about the emotional life. In fact, many of these thinkers made the bold claim that the emotions were just as important and valuable philosophical resources for authentic Confucian teachings as reflections on the themes of principle or vital force. In fact, they contended that it was a proper and positive interpretation of human emotions and even passions that distinguishes Confucianism from Daoism and Buddhism. Whether or not these thinkers were correct in their interpretations of Daoist and Buddhist thought need not detain us here. What is more important is that these thinkers developed a more positive interpretation of qing than had been the case in earlier Song and Ming thought. It might be argued that such a concern for the emotions was just another marker of the Neo-Confucian turn toward the subject, a flight to contemplation of an inner subjective world as opposed to the much more activist style of the Han and Tang scholarly traditions. However, this speculation about emotion, even romantic love, had the unintended effect of allowing educated Chinese women to enter into the debate. Debarred, as they noted, from active lives outside the literati family compounds, the women observed that although living circumscribed lives compared to their fathers, brothers, husbands and sons, they did know something about the emotions—and that they had something positive to add to the debate.
Dorothy Ko’s important study of the role of educated women tells the wonderful and poignant story of three young women, Chan Tong (ca. 1650-1665), Tan Ze (ca. 1655-1675) and Qian Yi (fl. 1694). All three were eventually the wives of Wu Ren, with Chan and Tan dying very early in life and leaving what would be called the Three Wives Commentary on the famous Ming drama The Peony Pavilion to be completed and published in 1694 by the third wife, Madame Qian. The three women demonstrated just as great scholarly exegetical and hermeneutic skills as their husband, and he always acknowledged their authorship and their collective and individual genius against those who thought women unable to achieve this level of cultural, artistic and philosophical sophistication. In short, the three women defended and explicated the theory about human emotions, also held by the radical Taizhou school followers of Wang Yangming, that even the entangled emotions of romantic love could become “a noble sentiment that gives meaning of human life” (Ko 1994:84). Although not widely accepted in late Ming and Qing society, these Confucian women defended the notion of companionate marriage based, in part, on a Confucian analysis of the emotional needs of women and men.
After the conquest of all of China by the Manchu in 1644, there was a tremendous cultural backlash against the radical thinkers of the late Ming dynasty. Rather than seeking validation of the emotions and human passions, many Qing scholars took a completely different approach to rediscover the true teachings of the classical Confucian sages. The point of departure for all of these thinkers was to reject the philosophical foundations of both Song scholars such as Zhu Xi and Ming teachers such as Wang Yangming. The charge the radical Qing scholars made against both Zhu and Wang Yangming was that both lixue and xinxue were completely infused with so much extraneous Daoist and Buddhist accretions that the true Confucian vision was subverted into something strange to the teachings of the classical Confucian masters. Therefore, the task of the Qing scholars was to strip Neo-Confucianism of its Daoist and Buddhist subversive inclusions.
The method that the Qing scholars chose has been called hanxue or Han Teaching or kaozhengxue, Evidential Research Learning. The chief tactic was to argue that the best way to return to true Confucian teachings in the face of Song Neo-Confucian distortions was to return to the work of the earliest stratum of texts, namely the work of the famous Han exegetes. The theory was that these Han scholars were closer to the classical texts and were also without the taint of undue Daoist or Buddhist influence. The other way to describe the movement is to note that these scholars promoted a various rigorous historical-critical and philological approach to the philosophical texts based on what they called an evidential research program. The grand axiom or rubric of the kaozhengxue scholars was to find the truth in the facts. They abjured what they believed to be the overly metaphysical flights of fancy of the Song and Ming thinkers and went back to the careful study of philology and textual and social history in order to return to a true Confucian scholarly culture. The better philosophers of this group, with Ku Yanwu (1613-1682) and Dai Zhen (1724-1777) as the bookends of the tradition, recognized that such an appeal to research methodology as opposed to Song metaphysics was also a philosophical appeal in its own right. Yet all these Evidential Research scholars were united in trying to find the earliest core of true Confucian texts by a meticulous examination of the whole history of Confucian thought. Along with major contributions to Confucian classical studies, these Evidential Research philosophers also made major additions to the promotion of local historical studies and even advanced practical studies in agriculture and water management. They really did try to find the truth in the facts. Yet the world of the Qing Evidential Research scholars was as ruthlessly destroyed as the metaphysical speculations of Song-style philosophers with the arrival of the all-powerful Western imperial powers in the middle of the 19th century.
It is extremely important to remember that Neo-Confucianism was an international and cross-cultural tradition in East Asia, with different manifestations in China, Korea, Japan and Vietnam. For instance, a strong case can be made for the strong philosophical creativity of Korean Neo-Confucians in the 15th and 16th centuries and in Japan after the inception of Tokugawa rule in 1600. Two examples will have to suffice to demonstrate that in some eras the most stimulating and innovative Confucian philosophical work was being done in Korea and Japan. As mentioned above, little study has been devoted to the Vietnamese reception and appropriation of Neo-Confucian philosophy at that time, and thus it is still impossible to speak with as much confidence about it as we can about the creativity of the Korean and Japanese Neo-Confucian philosophers.
The Korean Neo-Confucians who practiced the official ideology of the Choson kingdom after its founding in 1392 were devoted followers of Zhu Xi’s daoxue. But just because they were profound students of Master Zhu’s Southern Song Neo-Confucian synthesis does not mean that they did not realize that there were still a number of outstanding philosophical issues that needed to be debated in terms of how Zhu Xi depicted the daoxue project as a coherent philosophical vision. The most famous case of this Korean perspicacity is found in the justly famous Four-Seven Debate, a profound dialogue among scholars about the role of emotions within Zhu’s Neo-Confucian cosmology; the two most famous philosophers were Yi T’oegye (1501-1570) and Yi Yulgok (1536-1583).
The debate was framed as a technical discussion of two different lists of emotions (one list of four and another of seven different emotions, and hence the name for the Four-Seven Debate) inherited from the classical Confucian texts. But the most interesting underlying philosophical issues that emerged had to do with the analysis of the nature of and relationship between principle and vital force. In short, the Korean scholars realized that as elegant as it might be, there were problems with Zhu’s account of the nature of principle. The problem was put this way in a famous metaphor: how could a dead rider (principle as a purely formal pattern) guide the living horse of vital force? In other words, the Korean scholars understood clearly that the whole sensibility of the daoxue project was suffused with an emphasis on cosmic process. Hence, if process was so essential to the working of Zhu’s system, how could principle, as a critical philosophical trait, itself be without the living creativity of process? In the words of the Yijing or Book of Changes, if the very spirit of the Dao is shengsheng buxi or the generation [of the myriad things] without cessation, then how does this notion of genuine cosmological creativity inform the proper interpretation of principle as the key trait of the formal side of Zhu’s master narrative?
Yi Yulgok, the younger of the two giants of Korean Neo-Confucianism, gave the most creative response to this question. Yulgok is often portrayed as a proponent of a qi-monism wherein Yulgok defends the primacy of process sensibilities in daoxue by augmenting the role of vital force at the expense of principle. While Yulgok does indeed have all kinds of illuminating insights into the role of vital force, he never abandons a deep concern for the role of principle. Yulgok forthrightly links the notion of principle creatively with the equally important concept of cheng or the self-actualization of the mind-heart. In making this strong linkage, Yulgok is able to defend the thesis that principle itself is a vital manifestation of the living creativity of the Dao as the ceaseless generation of the myriad things. It was a philosophical tour-de-force and is probably the most imaginative reinterpretation of Zhu’s daoxue to be found in traditional East Asia.
In 17th century Tokugawa Japan Kaibara Ekken (1630-1714) provides an exemplar of the Japanese contribution to the refinement of Neo-Confucian discourse. Ekken, like so many other great Confucian scholars, was something of a renaissance figure. This social concern manifested itself in some very traditional ventures such as the publication of his famous Precepts for Daily Life in Japan, wherein he tried to give advice about how Confucian principles could be applied to the conduct of concrete daily life. Moreover, this passion for the concrete details of daily life also led to a fervent naturalist concern for the world of plants, animals, fish and even shellfish. Ekken not only wrote about these humble creatures but, like many early Western naturalists, provided illustrations of these plants and animals.
Ekken’s concern for the dynamic processes of the quotidian world also led him to reread Zhu Xi’s daoxue in a dramatic way. For instance, Ekken argued that the Supreme Ultimate/Polarity was not some kind of abstract pattern but actually the correct name for the primordial qi before it began to divide into the yin and yang forces. Ekken did not abandon Zhu’s category of principle but rather read the cosmos via a stronger emphasis on the dynamic role of vital force. “The ‘Way of the sage’ is the principle of life and growth of heaven and earth; the original qi harmonizing the yin and yang in ceaseless fecundity” (Tucker 1989: 81). Ekken made a further deduction from his re-evaluation of the role of vital force, namely that there is no ontological or cosmological ground for holding to a distinction between the ideal nature, mandated by tian, and the physical nature or endowment of the particular creature or person. It is for this reason that Ekken is often held to be a champion of the primacy of a qi-monism, but this kind of reduction does not do justice to Ekken’s subtle re-inscription of the various roles of concepts such as principle, vital force and the Supreme Ultimate/Polarity within daoxue. Just as with his Korean colleagues, Ekken’s naturalistic vision of the Confucian Dao was such that he believed the nature of the Dao “flows through the seasons and never stops. It is the root of all transformations and it is the place from which all things emerge; it is the origin of all that is received from heaven” (Tucker 1989: 81).
The fate of Korean and Japanese Neo-Confucianism was subject to the same immense impact of the arrival of the Western imperial powers. As Korea and Japan struggled to find their ways in the modern world, Neo-Confucianism seemed a historical part of their traditional cultures and hardly something of great value for the transformations of culture in the contemporary world dominated by the Western powers. In this sense, the arrival of Western-inspired modernization marked the end of the Neo-Confucian epoch in East Asia.
The arrival of the imperial Western powers in East Asia during the nineteenth century caused an unprecedented challenge to the Confucian traditions of the region. Never before had the countries of East Asia faced a combination of military conquest, cultural attack and infiltration by a powerful new civilization. Opium, guns and ideas were pouring into Asia during the nineteenth and twentieth centuries, with catastrophic results for the sphere of Confucian East Asia. The intellectual assault was as powerful – and perhaps even more significant in the long term – as the material impositions of colonial and semi-colonial regimes. No Asian tradition suffered more than the Confucian Way.
Yet even in the darkest hours after 1911, a significant renewal movement arose in East Asia in defense of the good to be recovered from traditions such as Confucianism. Along with the revivals of Daoism and Buddhism, there was a new movement in East Asia called in English ‘New Confucianism’ in order to distinguish it from the previous avatars of the Confucian Way. Although New Confucianism has its obvious roots in the great achievements of the Song, Yuan, Ming and Qing periods, it is also the child of intercultural dialogue with Western philosophical movements and ideas. While it is too soon to chart the course of New Confucianism, it is clear that some form of the Confucian Way will not only survive into the 21st century but will flourish anew in East Asia and farther abroad wherever the East Asian Diaspora carries people for whom the Confucian Way functions as part of their cultural background.
Hitherto, it is impossible to chart the changes wrought by either contemporary philosophers who are dedicated to the revival and reformation of the Confucian Way or by other scholars who are interested in Confucian discourse as merely one important traditional element for modern East Asian philosophers to utilize in terms of their own constructive work. It is clear, however, that Neo-Confucianism has now passed over into a completely new era, that of New Confucian ecumenical dialogue and conversation with philosophers from around the global city of a vastly expanded new republic of letters.
John H. Berthrong
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 22, 2005 | Originally published: