By its broadest definition, the term ‘Neo-Kantianism’ names any thinker after Kant who both engages substantively with the basic ramifications of his transcendental idealism and casts their own project at least roughly within his terminological framework. In this sense, thinkers as diverse as Schopenhauer, Mach, Husserl, Foucault, Strawson, Kuhn, Sellers, Nancy, Korsgaard, and Friedman could loosely be considered Neo-Kantian. More specifically, ‘Neo-Kantianism’ refers to two multifaceted and internally-differentiated trends of thinking in the late Nineteenth and early Twentieth-Centuries: the Marburg School and what is usually called either the Baden School or the Southwest School. The most prominent representatives of the former movement are Hermann Cohen, Paul Natorp, and Ernst Cassirer. Among the latter movement are Wilhelm Windelband and Heinrich Rickert. Several other noteworthy thinkers are associated with the movement as well.
Neo-Kantianism was the dominant philosophical movement in German universities from the 1870′s until the First World War. Its popularity declined rapidly thereafter even though its influences can be found on both sides of the Continental/Analytic divide throughout the twentieth century. Sometimes unfairly cast as narrowly epistemological, Neo-Kantianism covered a broad range of themes, from logic to the philosophy of history, ethics, aesthetics, psychology, religion, and culture. Since then there has been a relatively small but philosophically serious effort to reinvigorate further historical study and programmatic advancement of this often neglected philosophy.
During the first half of the Nineteenth-Century, Kant had become something of a relic. This is not to say that major thinkers were not strongly influenced by Kantian philosophy. Indeed there are clear traces in the literature of the Weimar Classicists, in the historiography of Bartold Georg Niebuhr (1776-1831) and Leopold von Ranke (1795-1886), in Wilhelm von Humboldt’s philosophy of language (1767-1835), and in Johannes Peter Müller’s (1801-1858) physiology. Figures like Schleiermacher (1768-1834), Immanuel Hermann Fichte (1796-1879), Friedrich Eduard Beneke (1798-1854), Christian Hermann Weiße (1801-1866), the Fries-influenced Jürgen Bona Meyer (1829-1897), the Frenchman Charles Renouvier (1815-1903), the evangelical theologian Albrecht Ritschl (1822-1889), and the great historian of philosophy Friedrich Ueberweg (1826-1871), made calls to heed Kant’s warning about transgressing the bounds of possible experience. However, there was neither a systematic nor programmatic school of Kantian thought in Germany for more than sixty years after Kant’s death in 1804.
The first published use of the term ‘Neo-Kantianer’ appeared in 1862, in a polemical review of Eduard Zeller by the Hegelian Karl Ludwig Michelet. But it was Otto Liebmann’s (1840-1912) Kant und die Epigonen (1865) that most indelibly heralds the rise of a new movement. Here Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762-1814), Hegel (1770-1831), and Schelling (1775-1854), whose idealist followers held sway in German philosophy departments during the early decades of the 19th Century, are chided for taking over only Kant’s system-building, and for doing so only in a superficial way. They sought to create the world from scratch, as it were, by finding new, more-fundamental first principles upon which to create a stronghold of interlocking propositions, one following necessarily from its predecessor. Insofar as those principles were generated from reflection rather than experience, however, the ‘descendants’ would effectively embrace Kant’s idealism at the expense of his empirical realism. The steep decline of Hegelianism a generation later opened a vacuum which was to be filled by the counter-movement of scientific materialism, represented by figures like Karl Vogt (1817-1895), Heinrich Czolbe (1819-1873), and Ludwig Büchner (1824-1899). By reducing speculative philosophy to a system of naturalistic observation consistent with their realism, the materialists utilized a commonsense terminology that reopened philosophical inquiry for those uninitiated in idealist dialectics. Despite their successes in the realm of the natural sciences, the materialists were accused of avoiding serious philosophical problems rather than solving them. This was especially true about matters of consciousness and experience, which the materialists were inclined to treat unproblematically as ‘given’. Against the failings of both the idealists and the materialists, Liebmann could only repeatedly call, “Zurück zu Kant!”
The 1860’s were a sort of watershed for Neo-Kantianism, with a row of works emerging which sought to move past the idealism-materialism debate by returning to the fundamentals of the Kantian Transcendental Deduction. Eduard Zeller’s (1814-1908) Ueber Bedeutung und Aufgabe der Erkenntnishteorie (1862) placed a call similar to Liebmann’s to return to Kant, maintaining a transcendental realism in the spirit of a general epistemological critique of speculative philosophy. Kuno Fischer’s (1824-1907) Kants Leben und die Grundlagen seiner Lehre (1860), and the second volume of his Geschichte der neuern Philosophie (1860) manifested the same call, too, in what remain important commentaries on Kant’s philosophy. Fischer was at first not so concerned to advance a new philosophical system as to correctly understand the more intricate nuances of the true master. These works gained popular influence in part because of their major literary improvement upon the commentaries of Karl Leonhard Reinhold (1757-1823), but in part also because of the controversy surrounding Fischer’s interpretation of Kant’s argument that space is a purely subjective facet of experience. Worried that the ideality of space led inexorably to skepticism, Friedrich Adolf Trendelenburg (1802-1872) sought to retain the possibility that space was also empirically real, applicable to the things-in-themselves at least in principle. Fischer returned fire by claiming that treating space as a synthetic a posteriori would effectively annul the necessity of Newtonian science, something Fischer emphasized was at the very heart of the Kantian project. Their spirited quarrel, which enveloped a wide circumference of academics over a twenty-year span, climaxed with Trendelenburg’s highly personal Kuno Fischer und sein Kant (1869) and Fischer’s retaliatory Anti-Trendelenburg (1870). Although such personal diatribes attract popular attention, the genuine philosophical foundations of Neo-Kantianism were laid earlier.
Hermann Ludwig Ferdinand von Helmholtz (1821-94) outstripped even the scientific credentials of the materialists, combining his experimental research with a genuine philosophical sophistication and historical sensitivity. His advances in physiology, ophthalmology, audiology, electro- and thermo-dynamics duly earned him an honored place among the great German scientists. His Über die Erhaltung der Kraft (1847) ranks only behind The Origin of Species as the most influential scientific treatise of the Nineteenth-Century, even though its principle claim might have been an unattributed adoption of the precedent theories by Julius Robert von Mayer (1814-1878) and James Joule (1818-1889). His major philosophical contribution was an attempt to ground Kant’s theoretical division between phenomena and noumena within empirically verifiable sense physiognomy. In place of the materialist’s faith in sense perception as a copy of reality and in advance of Kant’s general ignorance about the neurological conditions of experience, Helmholtz noted that when we see or hear something outside us there is a complicated process of neural stimulation. Experience is neither a direct projection of the perceived object onto our sense organs nor merely a conjunction of concept and sensuous intuition, but an unconscious process of symbolic inferences by which neural stimulations are made intelligible to the human mind.
The physical processes of the brain are a safer starting point, a scientifically-verifiable ground on which to explain the a priori necessity of experience, than Kant’s supra-naturalistic deduction of conceptual architectonics. Yet two key Kantian consequences are only strengthened thereby. First, experience is revealed to be nothing immediate, but a demonstrably discursive process wherein the material affect of the senses is transformed by subjective factors. Second, any inferences that can possibly be drawn about the world outside the subject must reckon with this subjective side, thereby reasserting the privileged position of epistemology above ontology. Helmholtz and the materialists both thought that Newtonian science was the best explanation of the world; but Helmholtz realized that science must take account of what Kant had claimed of it: science is the proscription of what can be demonstrated within the limits of possible experience rather than an articulation about objects in-themselves. Empirical physiognomy would more precisely proscribe those limits than purely conceptual transcendental philosophy.
Friedrich Albert Lange (1828-1875) was, at least in the Nineteenth-Century, more widely recognized as a theorist of pedagogy and advocate of Marxism in the Vereinstag deutscher Arbeitervereine than as a forerunner to Neo-Kantianism. But his influence on the Marburg school, though brief, was incisive. He took his professorship at Marburg in 1872, one year before Cohen completed his Habilitationschrift there. Lange worked with Cohen for only three years before his untimely death in 1875.
Much of Lange’s philosophy was conceived before his time in Marburg. As Privatdozent at Bonn, Lange attended Helmholtz’s lectures on the physiology of the senses, and later came to agree that the best way to move philosophy along was by combining the general Kantian insights with a more firmly founded neuro-physiology. In his masterpiece, Geschichte des Materialismus und Kritik seiner Bedeutung in der Gegenwart (1866), Lange argues that materialism is at once the best explanation of phenomena, yet quite naïve in its presumptive inference from experience to the world outside us. The argument is again taken from the progress of the physiological sciences, with Lange providing a number of experiments that reveal experience to be an aggregate construction of neural processes.
Where he progresses beyond Helmholtz is his recognition that the physiognomic processes themselves must, like every other object of experience, be understood as a product of a subject’s particular constitution. Even while denying the given-ness of sense data, Helmholtz had too often presumed to understand the processes of sensation on the basis of a non-problematic empirical realism. That is, even while Helmholtz viewed knowledge of empirical objects as an aggregate of sense physiognomy, he never sufficiently reflected on the conditions for the experience of that very sense physiognomy. So even while visual experience is regarded as derivative from the physiognomy of the eyes, optic nerves, and brain, how each of these function is considered unproblematically given to empirical experience. For Lange, we cannot so confidently infer that our experience of physiognomic processes corresponds to what is really the case outside our experience of them—that the eyes or ears actually do work as we observe them to—since the argument by which that conclusion is reached is itself physiological. Neither the senses, nor the brain, nor the empirically observable neural processes between them permit the inference that any of these is the causal grounds of our experience of them.
With such skepticism, Lange would naturally dispense, too, with attempts to ground ethical norms in either theological or rationalistic frameworks. Our normative prescriptions, however seemingly unshakeable by pure practical reason, are themselves operations of a brain, which develop contingently over great spans of evolutionary history. That brain itself is only another experienced representation, nothing which can be considered an immutable and necessary basis of which universal norms could be considered derivative. Lange thought this opened a space for creative narratives and even myths, able to inspire rather than regulate the ethical side of human behavior. Through their mutual philology teacher at Bonn, Friedrich Ritschl, Lange was also a decisive influence on the epistemology and moral-psychology of Friedrich Nietzsche.
The progenitors of Neo-Kantianism, represented principally by Liebmann, Fischer, Trendelenburg, Helmholtz, and Lange, evince a preference for Kant’s theoretical rather than ethical or aesthetical writings. While this tendency would be displaced by both the Marburg school’s social concerns and the Baden school’s concentration on the logic of values, the proto-Neo-Kantians had definite repercussions for later figures like Hans Vaihinger (1852-1933), the so-called empirio-positivists like Richard Avenarius and Ernst Mach, and the founder of the Vienna Circle, Moritz Schlick (1882-1936).
Herman Cohen (1842-1918) was Lange’s friend and successor, and is usually considered the proper founder of Neo-Kantianism at Marburg. The son of a rabbi in Coswig, he was given a diverse schooling by the historian of Judaism Zacharias Frankel (1801-1875) and the philologist Jacob Bernays (1824-1881). Moving to Berlin, he studied philosophy under Trendelenburg, philology under August Boeckh (1785-1867), culture and linguistics with Heymann Steinthal (1823-1899), and physiology with Emil Du Bois-Reymond (1818-1896). One of his earliest papers, “Zur Controverse zwischen Trendelenburg und Kuno Fischer” (1871), was a sort of coming-out in academic society. Against Fischer, the attempt above all to understand the letter of Kant perfectly –even the problems that persisted in his work—was tantamount to historicizing what ought to be a living engagement with serious philosophical problems. Although roughly on the side of his teacher Trendelenburg, Cohen stood mostly on his own ground in denying that objectivity required any appeal to extra-mental objects. Granted a professorship at the University of Marburg in 1876, Cohen came to combine Kant-interpretation with Lange’s instinct to develop Kant’s thinking in light of contemporary developments: a “Verbindung der systematischen und historischen Aufgabe.” It was Cohen who published Lange’s Logische Studien (1877) posthumously and produced several new editions of his Geschichte des Materialismus. More interested in logic than science, however, Cohen took Lange’s initiatives in a decidedly epistemological direction.
Cohen’s early work consists mainly in critical engagements with Kant: Kants Theorie der Erfahrung (1871), Kants Begründung der Ethik (1877), and Kants Begründung der Aesthetik (1889). Where he progresses beyond Kant is most plainly in his attempt to overcome the Kantian dualism between intuition and discursive thinking. Cohen argues that formal a priori laws of the mind not only affect how we think about external objects, but actually constitute those objects for us. “Thinking produces that which is held to be” (Logik der reinen Erkenntnis [Berlin 1902], 67). That is, the laws of the mind not only provide the form but the content of experience, leaving Cohen with a more idealistic picture of experience than Kant’s empirical realism would have warranted. These laws lie beyond, as it were, both Kant’s conceptual categories as well as Helmholtz’s and Lange’s physiognomic processes, the latter of which Cohen considered unwarrantedly naturalistic. The transcendental conditions of experience lay in the most fundamental rules of mathematical thinking, such that metaphysics, properly understood, is the study of the laws that make possible mathematical, and by derivation, scientific thinking. While Cohen did not deny the importance of the categories of the understanding or of the necessity of sensuous processes within experience, his own advancement beyond these entailed that an object was experienced and only could be experienced in terms of the formal rules of mathematics. The nature of philosophical investigation becomes, in Cohen’s hands, neither a physiognomic investigation of the brain or senses as persistent ‘things’ nor a transcendental deduction of the concepts of the understanding and the necessary faculties of the mind, but an exposition of the a priori rules that alone make possible any and every judgment. The world itself is the measure of all possible experience.
The view had a radical implication for the notion of a Kantian self. Kant never much doubted that something persistent was the fundament on which judgment was constructed. He denied that this thing was understandable in the way either materialism or commonsense presumed, of course, but posited a transcendental unity of apperception as, at least, the logically-necessary ground for experience. Cohen replaces the ‘unity’ of a posited self, and indeed any ‘faculties’ of the mind, with a variety of ‘rules’, ‘methods’, and ‘procedures’. What we are is not a ‘thing’, but a series of logical acts. The importance of his view can be illustrated in terms of Cohen’s theoretical mathematics, especially his notions of continuity and the infinitesimally small. Neither of these is an object, obviously, in the views of materialists or empiricists. And even idealists were at pains to decipher how either could be represented. By treating both as rules for thinking rather than persistent things, Cohen was able to show their respective necessities in terms of what sorts of everyday experiences would be made impossible without them. Continuity becomes an indispensable rule for thinking about any objects in time, while the infinitesimally smallest thing becomes an indispensable rule for thinking about the composition of objects in space. Though a substantial departure from the Kantian ascription of faculties, Cohen never prided himself so much on ascertaining and propagating the conclusions of Kant as on applying Kant’s transcendental method to its sincerest conclusions.
Like his Marburg colleagues, Cohen is sometimes unfairly cast as an aloof logical hair-splitter. Quite the contrary, he was deeply engaged in ethics as well as in the social and cultural debates of his time. His approach to them is also based on a generally Kantian methodology, which he sometimes dubbed a ‘social idealism’. Dismissing the practical and applied aspects of Kant’s ethics as needlessly individualistic psychology, he stressed the importance of Kant’s project of grounding ethical laws in practical reason, therein presenting for the first time a transcendentally necessary ought. This necessity holds for humanity generally, insofar as humanity is considered generally and not in terms of the privileges or disadvantages of particular individuals. Virtues like truthfulness, honor, and justice, which relate to the concept of humanity, thus take priority over sympathy or empathy, which operate on particular individuals and their circumstances. Like both experience and ethical life, civil laws could only be justified insofar as they were necessary, in terms of their intersubjective determinability. Because class-strata effectually inculcate authoritative relationships of power, a democratic –or better— a socialist society that effaced autocratically decreed legal dicta would better fulfill Kant’s exhortation to treat people as ends rather than means, as both legislators and legislated at the same time. However, Cohen thought that then-contemporary socialist ideals put too much stock in the economic aspects of Marx’s theory, and in their place tried to instill a greater concentration on the spiritual and cultural side of human social life. Cohen’s grounding of socialism in a Kantian rather than Marxist framework thus circumvents some of its statist and materialist overtones, as Lange also tried to do in his 1865 Die Arbeiterfrage.
Hermann Cohen also remains important for his contributions to Jewish thought. In proportion to his decreasing patriotism in Germany, he became an increasingly unabashed stalwart of Judaism in his later writing, and indeed is still considered by many to be the greatest Jewish thinker of his century. After his retirement from Marburg in 1912, he taught at the Berlin Lehranstalt für die Wissenschaft des Judentums. His posthumous Die Religion der Vernunft aus den Quellen des Judentums (1919) maintains that the originally Jewish method of religious thinking –its monotheism— reveals it as a “religion of reason,” a systematic and methodological attempt to think through the mysteries of the natural world and to construct a universal system of morality ordered under a single universal divine figure. As such, religion is not simply an ornament to society or a mere expression of feelings, but an entirely intrinsic aspect of human culture. The grand summation of these various strands of his thought was to have been collated into a unified theory of culture, but only reached a planning stage before his death in 1918. Even had he completed it, Cohen’s fierce advocacy of socialism and fiercer defense of Judaism, especially in Germany, would have made an already adverse academic life increasingly difficult.
Cohen’s student Paul Natorp (1854-1924) was a trained philologist, a renowned interpreter of Plato and of Descartes, a composer, a mentor to Pasternak, Barth, and Cassirer, and an influence on the thought of Husserl, Heidegger, and Gadamer. Arriving at Marburg in 1881, much of Natorp’s career was concerned with widening the sphere of influence of Cohen’s interpretation of Kant and with tracing the historical roots of what he understood to be the essence of critical philosophy. For Natorp, too, the necessity of Neo-Kantian philosophizing lie in overcoming the speculations of the idealists and in joining philosophy again with natural science by means of limiting discourse to that which lay within the bounds of possible experience, in overcoming the Kantian dualism of intuition and discursive thinking.
However close their philosophies, Natorp stresses more indelibly the experiential side of thinking than did Cohen’s concentration on the logical features of thought. Natorp saw it as a positive advance on Kant to articulate the formal rules of scientific inquiry not as a set of axioms, but as an exposition of the rules—the methods for thinking scientifically—to the extreme that the importance of the conclusions reached by those rules becomes subsidiary to the rules themselves. Knowledge is an ‘Aufgabe’ or task, guided by logic, to make the undetermined increasingly more determined. Accordingly, the Kantian ‘thing-itself’ ceases to be an object that lies outside possible experience, but a sort of regulative ideal that of itself spurs the understanding to work towards its fulfillment. That endless call to new thinking along specifically ordered lines is just what Natorp means by scientific inquiry—a normative requirement to think further rather than a set of achieved conclusions. Thus, where Kant began with a transcendental logic in order to ground math and the natural sciences, Natorp began with the modes of thinking found already in the experimental processes of good science and the deductions of mathematics as evidence of what conditions are necessarily at play in thinking generally. The necessities of math and science do not rest, as they arguably do for Kant, upon the psychological idiosyncrasies of the rational mind, but are self-sufficient examples of what constitutes objective thinking. Thus philosophy itself, as Natorp conceived it, does not begin with the psychological functions of a rational subject and work towards its products. It begins with a critical observation of those objectively real formations—mathematical and scientific thinking—to ground how the mind itself must have worked in order to produce them.
One of the consequences of Natorp’s concentration on the continual process of methodological thinking was his acknowledgement that a proper exposition of its laws required an historical basis. Science, as the set of formal rules for thinking, begins to inquire by reflecting on why a thing is, not just that it is. Whenever that critical reflection on the methods of scientific thinking occurs, there ensues a sort of historical rebirth that generates a new cyclical age of scientific inquiry. This reflection, Natorp thought, involves rethinking how one considers that object: a genetic rather than static reflection on the changing conditions for the possibility of thinking along the lines of the continuing progress of science.
Plato’s notion of ideal forms marks the clearest occasion of –to borrow Kuhn’s designation for a similar notion—a paradigm shift. Under Natorp’s interpretation, Plato’s forms are construed not as real subsistent entities that lie beyond common human experience, but regulative hypotheses intended to guide thinking along systematic lines. No transcendent things per se, the forms are transcendental principles about the possibility of the human experience of objects. In this sense, Natorp presented Plato as a sort of Marburg Neo-Kantian avant le lettre, a view which garnered little popularity.
Like Cohen, Natorp also had significant cultural interests, and thought that the proper engagement with Kant’s thought had the potential to lead to a comprehensive philosophy of culture. Not as interested as Cohen in the philosophy of religion, it is above all in Natorp’s pedagogical writings that he espouses a social-democratic, anti-dogmatic ideal of education, the goal of which was not an orthodox body of knowledge but an attunement to the lines along which we think so as to reach knowledge. Education ought to be an awareness of the ‘Aufgabe’ of further determining the yet undetermined. Accordingly, the presentation of information in a lecture was thought to be intrinsically stilting, in comparison to the guided process of a quasi-Socratic method of question and answer. An educator of considerable skill, among his students were Karl Vorländer (1860-1928), Nicolai Hartmann (1882-1950), José Ortega y Gasset (1883-1955), and Boris Pasternak (1890-1960).
Ernst Cassirer (1874-1945) is usually considered the last principle figure of the Marburg school of Neo-Kantianism. Entering Marburg to study with Cohen himself in 1896, though he would never teach there, Cassirer adopted both the school’s historicist leanings and its emphasis on transcendental argumentation. Indeed, he stands as one of the last great comprehensive thinkers of the West, equal parts epistemologist, logician, philosopher of science, cultural theorist, and historian of thought. His final work, written after having immigrated to America in the wake of Nazi Germany, wove together Cohen’s defense of Judaism together with his own observations of the fascist employment of mythic symbolism to form a comprehensive critique of the Myth of the State (published posthumously in 1946). His wide interests were not accidental, but a direct consequence of his lifelong attempt to show the logical and creative aspects of human life –the Naturwissenschaften and Geisteswissenschaften— as integrally entwined within the characteristically human mode of mentality: the symbolic form.
Cassirer’s earlier historical works adopt the basic view of history promulgated by Natorp. The development of the history of ideas takes the form of naïve progresses interrupted by a series of fundamental reconsiderations of the epistemological methods that gave rise to those progresses, through Plato, Galileo, Spinoza, Leibniz, and Kant. Like Natorp, too, the progress of the history of ideas is, for Cassirer, the march of the problems and solutions constructed by the naturally progressive structure of the human mind. Despite this seemingly teleological framework, Cassirer’s histories of the Enlightenment, of Modernity, of Goethe, Rousseau, Descartes, and of epistemology are generally reliable, lucidly written expositions that aim to contextualize an author’s own thought rather than squeeze it into any particular historiographical framework. A sort of inverse of Hegel, for Cassirer the history of ideas is not reducible to an a priori necessary structure brought about by the nature of reason, but reliable evidence upon which to examine the progression of what problems arise for minds over time.
Cassirer’s historicism also led him to rethink Cohen’s notion of the subject. As Cohen thought the self was just a logical placeholder, the subject-term of the various rules of thinking, so Cassirer thought the self was a function that united the various symbolic capacities of the human mind. Yet, that set is not static. What the history of mathematics shows is not a timeless set of a priori rules that can in principle be deciphered within a philosophical logic, but a slow yet fluid shift over time. This is possible, Cassirer argued, because mathematical rules are tied neither to any experience of objects nor to any timeless notion of a context-less subject. Ways of thinking shift over time in response to wider environmental factors, and so do the mathematical and logical forms thereby. Einstein’s relativity theory, of which Cassirer was an important promulgator, underscores Cassirer’s insights especially in its assumption of non-Euclidean geometry. Put into the language of Cassirer’s mature thought, the logical model on which Einsteinian mathematics was based is itself an instantiation not of the single correct outlook on the world, but of a powerful new shift in the symbolic form of science. What Einstein accomplished was not just another theory in a world full of theories, but the remarkably concise formula for a modified way of thinking about the physical world.
The complete expression of Cassirer’s own philosophy is his three-volume Philosophie der symbolischen Formen (1923-9). In keeping with a general Kantianism, Cassirer argues that the world is not given as such in human experience, but mediated by subject-side factors. Cassirer thought that more complex structures constituted experience and the human necessity to think along certain pre-given lines. What Cassirer adds is a much greater historical sensitivity to earlier forms of human thinking as they were represented in myths and early religious expressions. The more complex and articulate forms of culture –the three major ones are language, myth, and science— are not a priori necessary across time or cultures, but are achieved by a sort of dialectical solution to problems arising when other cultural forms become unsustainable. Knowledge for Cassirer, unlike Natorp, is not so much the process of determination, but a web of psycho-linguistic relations. The human mind progresses over history through linguistic and cultural forms, from the affective expressions of primitives, to representational language, which situates objects in spatial and temporal relations, to the purely logical and mathematical forms of signification. The unique human achievement is the symbolic form, an energy of the intellect that binds a particular sensory signal to a meaningful general content. By means of symbols, humans not only navigate the world empirically and not only understand the world logically, but make the world meaningful to themselves culturally. This symbolic capacity is indeed what separates the human species from the animals. Accordingly, Cassirer saw himself as having synthesized the Neo-Kantian insights about subjectivity with the roughly Hegelian-themed phenomenology of conscious forms.
The intellectual pride of the Marburg school fostered a prickly relationship with their fellow neo-Kantians. The rivalry developed with the Baden Neo-Kantians (alternately named the “Southwest” school) was not so much a competition for the claim to doctrinal orthodoxy as much as what the proper aims and goals of Kant-studies should be. Although it is a generalization, where the Marburg Neo-Kantians sought clarity and methodological precision, the Baden school endeavored to explore wider applications of Kantian thought to contemporary cultural issues. Like their Marburg counterparts, they concerned themselves with offering a third, critical path between speculative idealism and materialism, but turned away from how science or mathematics were grounded in the logic of the mind toward an investigation of the human sciences and the transcendental conditions of values. While they paid greater attention to the spiritual and cultural side of human life than the Marburg school, they were less active in the practical currents of political activity.
Wilhelm Windelband (1848-1915), a student of Kuno Fischer and Hermann Lotze (1817-1881), set the tone of the school by claiming that to truly understand Kant was not a matter of philological interpretation–per Fischer—nor a return to Kant–per Liebmann—but of surpassing Kant along the very path he had blazed. Never an orthodox Kantian, he originally said “Kant verstehen, heißt über ihn hinausgehen.” Part of that effort sprung from Kant’s distinction between different kinds of judgment as being appropriate to different forms of inquiry. Whereas the Marburg school’s conception of logic was steeped in Kant, Windleband found certain elements of Fichte, Hegel, and Lotze to be fruitful. Moreover, the Marburgers too-hastily applied theoretical judgment to all fields of intellectual investigation summarily, and thereby conflated the methods of natural science with proper thinking as such. This effectively relegated the so-called cultural sciences, like history, sociology, and the arts – Geisteswissenschaften – to a subsidiary intellectual rank behind logic, mathematics, and the natural science – Naturwissenschaften. Windelband thought, on the contrary, that these two areas of inquiry had a separate but equal status. To show that, Windelband needed to prove the methodological rigor of those Geisteswissenschaften, something which had been a stumbling block since the Enlightenment. In a distinctly Kantian vein, he was able to show that the conditions for the possibility of judging the content of any of the Geisteswissenschaften took the shape of idiographic descriptions, which focus on the particular, unique, and contingent. The natural sciences, on the other hand, are generalizing, law-positing, and nomothetic. Idiographic descriptions are intended to inform, nomothetic explanations to demonstrate. The idiographic deals in Gestaltungen, the nomothetic in Gesetze. Both are equally parts of the human endeavor.
The inclination to seek a more multifaceted conception of subjectivity was a hallmark of the Baden Neo-Kantians. The mind is not a purely mathematical or logical function designed to construct laws and apply them to the world of objects; it works in accordance with the environment in which it operates. What is constructed is done as a response to a need generated by that socio-cultural-historical background. This notion was a sort of leitmotif to Windelband’s own history of philosophy, which for the first time addressed philosophers organically in terms of the philosophical problems they faced and endeavored to solve rather than as either a straightforward chronology, a series of schools, or, certainly, a sort of Hegelian conception of a graduated dialectical unfolding of a single grand idea.
Heinrich Rickert (1863-1936) began his career with a concentration on epistemology. Alongside many Neo-Kantians, he denied the cogency of a thing itself, and thereby reduced an ontology of externalities to a study of the subjective contents of a common, universal mind. Having dissertated under Windelband in 1888 and succeeding him at Heidelberg in 1916, Rickert also came to reject the Marburger’s assumption that the methodologies of natural science were the rules for thinking as such. Rickert argued instead that the mind engages the world along the dual lines of Geisteswissenschaften and Naturwissenschaften according to idiographic or nomothetic judgments respectively, the division which Rickert borrowed from his friend Windelband and elaborated upon (although it is sometimes attributed to Rickert or even Dilthey mistakenly). And similar to him as well, Rickert considered it a major project of philosophy to ground the former in a critical method, as a sort of transcendental science of culture. Where Rickert went his own way was in his critique of scientific explanations insofar as they rested on abstracted generalizations and in his privilege of historical descriptions on account of their attention to life’s genuine particularity and the often irrational character of historical change. Where Windelband saw equality-but-difference between the Geistes—and Naturwissenschaften, Rickert saw the latter as deficient insofar as it was incapable of addressing values.
History, for Rickert, was the exemplary case of a human science. Historians write about demonstrable facts in time and space, wherein the truth or falsity of a claim can be demonstrated with roughly the same precision as the natural sciences. The relational links between historical events – causes, influences, consequences – rely on mind-centered concepts rather than on observable features of a world outside the historian; though this of itself would not preclude the possibility of at least phenomenal explanations of history. More importantly, historians deal with events which cannot be isolated, repeated, or tested, particular individuals whose actions cannot be subsumed under generalizations, and with human values which resist positive nomothetic explanation. Those values constitute the essence of an historiographical account in a way entirely foreign to the physical sciences, whose objects of inquiry – atoms, gravitational forces, chemical bonds, etc.—remain value-neutral. A historian passes judgment about the successes and failures of policies, assigns titular appellations from Alexander the Great to Ivan the Terrible, decides who is king and who a tyrant, and regards eras as contributions or hindrances to human progress. The values of historians essentially comprise what story is told about the past, even if this sacrifices history’s status as an exact, demonstrable, or predictive science.
Rickert’s differentiation of the methods of history and science has been influential on post-modern continental theorists, in part through his friend and colleague, Karl Jaspers (1883-1969), and through his doctoral student, Martin Heidegger (1889-1976). The traditional scientific reliance on a correspondential theory of truth seemed woefully uncritical and thereby inadequate to the cultural sciences. The very form of reality should be understood as a product of a subject’s judgment. However, Rickert’s recognition of this subjective side did not entangle him in value relativism. Although the historian’s values, for example, do indeed inform the account, Rickert also thought that values were nothing exclusively personal. Values, in fact, express proximate universals across cultures and eras. Philosophy itself, as a critical inquiry into the values that inform judgment, reveals the endurance and trans-cultural nature of values in such a way that grounds the objectivity of an historical account in the objectivity of the values he or she holds. That truth is something that ‘ought to be sought’ is perhaps one such value. But Rickert has been criticized for believing that the values of historians on issues of personal ethics, the defensibility of wars, the treatment of women, or the social effects of religion were universally agreed upon.
Twentieth-century attempts to categorize thinkers historically into this or that school led to some debate about which figures were ‘really’ Neo-Kantian. But this overlooks the fact that even until the mid-1880’s the term ‘Neo-Kantian’ was rarely self-appellated. Unlike other more tightly-knit schools of thought, the nature of the Neo-Kantian movement allowed for a number of loosely-associated members, friends, and students, who were seekers of truth first and proponents of a doctrine second. Although each engaged the basic terminology and transcendental framework of either Kant or the Neo-Kantians, none did so wholesale or uncritically.
Hans Vaihinger (1852-1933) remains arguably the best scholar of Kant after Fischer and Cohen. And he probably maintained the closest ties with Neo-Kantianism without being assimilated into one or the other school. His massive commentary, begun in 1881 and left unfinished due to his health, exposited not only Kant’s work, but also the history of Neo-Kantian interpretation to that point. He founded the Kant-Studien in 1897, which is both the worldwide heart of Kant studies and the model for all author-based periodicals published in philosophy. Vaihinger’s own philosophy, which resonates in contemporary debates about fictionalism and anti-realism, takes as its starting point a curious blend of Kant, Lange, and Nietzsche in his Die Philosophie des Als-Ob (1911). For Vaihinger, the expressions that stem from our subjective makeup render moot the question whether they correspond to the real world. Not only do the concepts of math and logic have a subjective source, as per many of the Neo-Kantians, but the claims of religion, ethics, and even philosophy turn out to be subjectively-generated illusions that are found to be particularly satisfying to certain kinds of life, and thereafter propagated for the sake of more successfully navigating an unconceptualizable reality in-itself. Human psychology is structured to behave ‘as-if’ these concepts and mental projections corresponded to the way things really were, though in reality there is no way to prove whether they do. Freedom, a key notion for Vaihinger, is not merely one side of a misunderstanding between reason and the understanding, but a useful projection without which we could neither act nor live.
Wilhelm Dilthey (1833-1911) remains alongside Vaihinger as one of the great patrons of Kant scholarship for his work on the Academy Edition of Kant’s works, which began in 1900. Taught by both Fischer in Heidelberg and Trendelenburg in Berlin, Dilthey was strongly influenced by the hermeneutics of Schleiermacher as well, and entwines his Neo-Kantian denial of material realism with the hermeneutical impulse to see judgment as socio-culturally informed interpretation. Dilthey shares with the Baden school the distinction between nomothetic and idiographic sciences. Where he stresses the distinction, though, is slightly different. The natural sciences explain by way of causal relationships, whereas history makes understood by correctly associating particulars and wholes. In this way, the practice of history itself allows us to better understand the Lebenzusammenhang –how all life’s aspects are interconnected—in a way the natural sciences, insofar as they treat the objects of their study as abstract generalizations, cannot. The natural sciences utilize an abstract Verstand; the cultural sciences use a more holistic way of understanding, a Verstehen.
Despite his shared interest in the conditions of experience, Dilthey is usually not considered a Neo-Kantian. Among several key differences, he rejects the Marburg proclivity to construct laws of thinking and experience that supposedly hold for all rational beings. Their consideration of the self as a set of logico-mathematical rules was an illegitimate abstraction from the really-lived, historically-contextualized human experience. In its place he stresses the ways historicity and social contexts shape the experiences and thinking processes of unique individuals. In distinction from the Baden school, Dilthey rejects Rickert’s theses about both the necessarily phenomenal and universal character of historical experience. Since we have unmediated access to our lived inner life through a sort of ‘reflexive awareness’, our explanations of historical events may indeed require a degree of generalization and abstraction; however, our sympathetic awareness of agent’s motivations and intentions remains direct. That inner world is not representational or inferential, but – contrary to the natural sciences – lived from within our inter-contextualized experience of the world. In this way, Dilthey alsocrossed the mainstay Neo-Kantian position on the role of psychology in the human sciences. It is not a field alongside sociology or economics that requires a transcendental grounding in order to gain a nomothetic status. Psychology is an immediate descriptive science that alone enables the other Geisteswissenschaften to be understood properly as a sort of mediation between the individual and their social milieu. Dilthey thought the results of psychology will, contra Windelband, allow us to move beyond a purely idiographic description of individuals to a law-like (though not strictly nomothetic) typology according to worldviews or ‘Weltanschauungen’.
Max Weber (1864-1920) was a student and friend of Rickert’s in Freiburg, and was also concerned with distinguishing the logic of historical judgment from that of the natural sciences. The past itself contains no intelligibility. Intelligibility is something added by means of the historian’s act of contextualizing an individual in his or her social environment. Unlike Comte (1798-1857), whatever ‘laws’ we might discover in history are really just constructions. And unlike Durkheim (1858-1917), talk of ‘societies’ runs the risk of hypostasizing what is actually a convenient symbol. Social history should instead be about trying to understand the motivations behind individual and particular changes.
The sociology of Georg Simmel (1858-1918) was also informed by a personal connection to Rickert. From its foundation by Comte and Mill (1806-1873), sociology had been marked by both a positivist theory of explanation-under-law and by an uncritical empiricism. Simmel, with the familiar Neo-Kantian move, undermined their naivety and replaced it with a more careful consideration of how society could be conceived at all. How do individuals relate to society, in what sense does society have a sort of psychology in its own right that generates changes and out of which spiritual shifts emerge, and how do the representational faculties affect societal rituals like money, fashion, and the construction of cities?
Taking history away from its sociological orientation and back to its conceptual roots was Emil Lask (1875-1915). Having dissertated on Fichte under Rickert in 1902 and habilitated on legal theory under Windelband in 1905, Lask was called to Heidelberg in 1910, where his inaugural lecture –“Hegel in seinem Verhältnis zur Weltanschauung der Aufklärung”— intimated a rather different line of influence. His work is comprised of two major published titles: Logik der Philosophie oder die Kategorienlehre (1911) and Lehre vom Urteil (1912). In them, Lask works out an immediate-intuitional theory of knowledge that went beyond the Kantian categories of the understanding of objects into the realm of a logic of values, and even probed the borders of the irrational. In fact he criticized the generalities of the Baden school’s Problemsgeschichte for lacking a concrete grounding in actual historical movements. Although Lask’s insistence to fight on the eastern front in the First World War cut short what should have been a promising career, he had significant influence on German philosophy through Weber, Lukács, and Heidegger. His death, in the same year as Windelband’s, stands as the usual endpoint of the Baden school of Neo-Kantianism.
The physiognomic leanings of the Neo-Kantian forerunners, like Helmholtz and Lange, were revitalized by a pair of philosophers of considerable scientific reputation. Richard Avenarius (1843-96) and Ernst Mach (1838-1916), founders of empirio-criticism, sought to overcome the idealism-materialism rift in German academic philosophy by closer investigation into the nature of experience. This entailed replacing traditional physics with a phenomenalistic conception of thermodynamics as the model of positivist science. In his Kritik der reinen Erfahrung (1888-90), Avenarius showed that the physiognomic factors of experience vary according to environmental conditions. As the nervous system develops regular patterns within a relatively constant environment, experience itself becomes regularized. That feeling of being accustomed to typical experiences, rather than logical deduction, is what counts as knowledge. Mach was similarly critical of realist assumptions about sensation and experience, positing instead the mind’s inherent ability to economize the welter of experience into abbreviated forms. Although the concepts we use, especially those in the natural sciences, are indispensable for communication and for navigating the world, they cannot demonstrate the substantial objects from which they are believed to be derived.
Alois Riehl (1844-1924) denied Liebmann’s claim that the Kantian thing-in-itself was nothing more than an incidental remnant of enlightenment rationalism. Were it, Riehl argued, Kantianism should give up any pretension to a positive engagement with science. Kant in fact never entirely rejected the possibility of apprehending the thing-in-itself, only the attempt to do so by way of the understanding and reason. It was not inconsistent with Kant to try to articulate noumena mediately, via indirect inferences from their perceptible characteristics in observation. Beyond its spatio-temporal and categorical qualifications, the particular characteristics of an object which we perceive and by which we distinguish it from any other object depend not on us so much, as upon its mode of appearance as it really is outside us.
Although Rudolph Otto (1869-1937) taught in Marburg, he had little interest in the logic of mathematics per se. Otto did, however, follow his school’s inclination to understand the objects of study in terms of the transcendental conditions of their experience as fundamental to the proper study, specifically of religion. What Otto discovered thereby was a new kind of experience –the ‘holy’— that was irreducible either to the categories of the understanding or to feeling. This had a substantial influence on the religious phenomenology of two other loosely-associated Neo-Kantian thinkers, Ernst Troeltsch (1865-1923) and Paul Tillich (1886-1965).
With certain Hegelian overtones, Bruno Bauch (1877-1942) was another fringe member of the Baden school with much to say about religion. While he studied with Fischer in Heidelberg, Rickert in Freiburg, and wrote his Habilitationschrift under Vaihinger in Berlin, he was more concerned than most Badeners with logic and mathematics, and in this respect represents a key link between the Neo-Kantians and both Frege, his confidant, and Carnap, his student. But his views about religion and contemporary politics kept Bauch at considerable distance from mainline Neo-Kantians. Due, in fact to his overt anti-Semitism, he was made to resign his editorship at the Kant-Studien. Having argued that Jews were intrinsically foreign to German culture, his embrace of Nazism during the very period of Cassirer’s emigration was an obvious affront, too, to the legacy of Cohen, whatever honors it may have gained him by the state-run academies.
Nicolai Hartmann (1882-1950) began his career as a Neo-Kantian under Cohen and Natorp, but soon after developed his own form of realism. While remaining largely beholden to transcendental semantics, Hartmann rejected the basic Neo-Kantian position on the priority of epistemology to ontology. The first condition for thinking about objects is itself the existence of those objects. It was an error of idealism to assume the human mind constitutes the knowability of those objects and equally the error of materialism to assume that those objects are all open to knowability. To Hartmann, some objects were able to be known by way of their appropriate categorization. Others, however, must remain mysterious, closed off to human inquiry at least until philosophy could point the way toward new methods of comprehending them. Philosophy’s task, accordingly, was to discover the discontinuities between the ‘subjective categories’ of thought and the ‘objective categories’ of reality, and, where possible, to eventually overcome them.
Given the predominance of Neo-Kantianism in German academies during the turn of the century, a number of fringe-members deserve at least mention here. None can be considered an orthodox ‘Marburg’ or ‘Southwestern’ school Neo-Kantian, but each had certain affinities or at least critical engagements with the general movement. Friedrich Paulsen (1846-1908), Johannes Volkelt (1848-1930), Benno Erdmann (1851-1921), Rudolf Stammler (1856-1938), Karl Vorländer (1860-1928), the Harvard psychologist Hugo Münsterberg (1863-1916), Ernst Troeltsch (1865-1923), the plant physiologist Jonas Cohn (1869-1947), Albert Görland (1869-1952), Richard Hönigswald (1875-1947), Artur Buchenau (1879-1946), Eduard Spranger (1882-1963), and the neo-Friesian Leonard Nelson (1882-1927), who, though more critical than not about Neo-Kantian epistemology, shared certain ethical and social Neo-Kantian themes. There was also significant Neo-Kantian influence on French universities in the same years, with representative figures like Charles Renouview (1815-1903), Jules Lachelier (1832-1918), Émile Boutroux (1845-1921), Octave Hamelin (1856-1907), and Léon Brunschvicg (1869-1944). (For a more detailed look at French Neo-Kantians, see Luft and Capeillères 2010, pp. 70-80.)
From March 17 to April 6, 1929, the city of Davos, Switzerland hosted an International University Course intended to bring together the continent’s best philosophers. The keynote lecturers and subsequent leaders of the famous disputation were the author of the recent Being and Time, Martin Heidegger, and the author of the recent Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, Ernst Cassirer. Heidegger’s contribution was his interpretation of Kant as chiefly concerned with trying to ground metaphysical speculation in what he calls the transcendental imagination through temporally-finite human reason. Cassirer countered by revealing Heidegger’s formulation of that imagination as unwarrantedly accepting of the non-rational. Agreeing that the progress of Kantian philosophy must acknowledge the finitude of human life, as Heidegger held, Cassirer emphasized that beyond this it must retain the spirit of critical inquiry, the openness to natural science, and the clarity of rational argumentation that marked Kant himself as a great philosopher and not only as an intuitive visionary. The Analytic philosopher Rudolf Carnap (1891-1970) was a participant in the Davos congress, and was thereafter prompted to write a highly critical review of Heidegger. What should have been an event that revitalized Neo-Kantianism in contemporary thought became instead the symbol both for the rise of the Analytic school of philosophy and for its cleavage from Continental thought. Increasingly, Cassirer was viewed as defending an unfashionable way of philosophizing, and after he emigrated from Germany in the wake of increasing anti-Jewish sentiment in 1933 the influence of Neo-Kantianism waned.
Even while serious Kant scholarship thrives in the Anglophone world of the early 21st century, Neo-Kantianism remains perhaps the single worst-neglected region of the historical study of ideas. This is unfortunate for Kant studies, since it inculcates an attitude of offhandedness toward nearly a century of superb scholarship on Kant, from Fischer to Cohen to Vaihinger to Cassirer. The Neo-Kantians were also the single most dominant group in German philosophy departments for half a century. Few works of Cohen, Natorp, Rickert, or Windelband have been translated in their entirety, to say nothing of the less prominent figures. Cassirer and Dilthey have attracted the interest of solid scholars, though it tends to be historical and hermeneutical rather than programmatic. Study of Simmel and Weber has been consistently strong, but more for their sociological conclusions than their philosophical starting points. To the rest, it has become customary to attribute a secondary philosophy rank behind the Idealists, Marxists, and Positivists –and even a tertiary one behind the Romantics, Schopenhauer, Nietzsche, and Kierkegaard, none of whom, it may be reminded, held a professorship in the field. It is not uncommon even in lengthy histories of 19th Century philosophy to find their names omitted entirely.
The reasons for this neglect are complex and not entirely clear. The writing of the Marburg school is dense and academically forbidding, true, but that of Windelband, Cassirer, Vaihinger, and Simmel are quite eloquent. The personalities of Cohen and Rickert were eccentric to the point of unattractive, though Natorp and Cassirer were congenial. Their ad hominem criticisms of rival members seem crass, but such gossip is undeniably salacious as well. Some of their writing was intentionally set against the backdrop of obscure political developments, though often with other figures such obscurities give rise to cottage-industries of historical scholarship (see Willey, 1978). The two World Wars no doubt had a severely negative impact on the continuity of any movement or school, though phenomenology has fared far better. The fact that many of the Neo-Kantians were both social-liberals and Jewish virtually guaranteed their works would be repressed in Hitler’s Germany. Forced resignation and even exile was a reality for many Jewish academics; Cassirer even had his habilitation at Straßburg rejected explicitly on the grounds that he was Jewish. He and Brunschvicg both escaped likely persecution by giving up their homeland. But as the examples of Bauch and Fischer make clear, Neo-Kantianism need not be subsumed under a specifically Jewish or even minimally Semitically-tolerant worldview. And as Cohen’s resurgent legacy in Jewish scholarship proves, not all aspects that were once repressed need forever be.
To ignore the Neo-Kantians, however, creates the false impression of a philosophical black hole in the German academies between the decline of Hegelianism and the rise of phenomenology, a space more often devoted to anti-academic philosophers like Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. Moreover, the Neo-Kantian influence on 20th century minds from Husserl and Heidegger to Frege and Carnap is pronounced, and should not be brushed aside lightly. In terms of early 21st century philosophy, Neo-Kantianism reminds us of the importance of reflecting on method and of philosophizing in conjunction with the best contemporary research in the natural sciences, something for which Helmholtz, Lange, and Cassirer stand as exemplars. And just as Liebmann’s motto ‘Back to Kant’ was exhorted to bridge the gap between idealism and materialism in the 19th century, so too may it be a sort of third way that rectifies the split between contemporary continental and analytic partisanship. If the old saying still carries water, then “one can philosophize with Kant, or against Kant; but one cannot philosophize without Kant.”
Fortunately there are signs of renewed interest. In 2010, Luft and Rudolf Makkreel edited Neo-Kantianism in Contemporary Philosophy (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press), which presents a well-rounded contemporary collection of research papers. In Continental Europe, no one has done more to revitalize Neo-Kantian studies than Helmut Holzhey and Fabien Capeillères, who have each published a row of books, editions, and papers on the theme. Under the directorship of Christian Krijnen and Kurt Walter Zeidler, the Desiderata der Neukantianismus-Forschung has hosted a number of congresses and meetings throughout Europe. A 2008 issue of the Philosophical Forum was dedicated to Neo-Kantianism generally, and featured articles by Rolf-Peter Horstmann, Paul Guyer, Michael Friedman, and Frederick Beiser among others. Studies of particular Neo-Kantians have been produced by Poma (1997), Krijnen (2001), Zijderveld (2006), Skildelsky (2008), and Munk (2010). And Charles Bambach (1995), Michael Friedmann (2000), Tom Rockmore (2000), and Peter Eli Gordon (2012) have composed fine works of intellectual history concerning the heritage of Neo-Kantianism in the twentieth century.
Anthony K. Jensen
U. S. A.
Last updated: February 18, 2013 | Originally published: