Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Neo-Platonism

Neo-platonism (or Neoplatonism) is a modern term used to designate the period of Platonic philosophy beginning with the work of Plotinus and ending with the closing of the Platonic Academy by the Emperor Justinian in 529 C.E. This brand of Platonism, which is often described as ‘mystical’ or religious in nature, developed outside the mainstream of Academic Platonism. The origins of Neoplatonism can be traced back to the era of Hellenistic syncretism which spawned such movements and schools of thought as Gnosticism and the Hermetic tradition. A major factor in this syncretism, and one which had an immense influence on the development of Platonic thought, was the introduction of the Jewish Scriptures into Greek intellectual circles via the translation known as the Septuagint. The encounter between the creation narrative of Genesis and the cosmology of Plato’s Timaeus set in motion a long tradition of cosmological theorizing that finally culminated in the grand schema of Plotinus’ Enneads. Plotinus’ two major successors, Porphyry and Iamblichus, each developed, in their own way, certain isolated aspects of Plotinus’ thought, but neither of them developed a rigorous philosophy to match that of their master. It was Proclus who, shortly before the closing of the Academy, bequeathed a systematic Platonic philosophy upon the world that in certain ways approached the sophistication of Plotinus. Finally, in the work of the so-called Pseudo-Dionysius, we find a grand synthesis of Platonic philosophy and Christian theology that was to exercise an immense influence on mediaeval mysticism and Renaissance Humanism.

Table of Contents

  1. What is Neoplatonism?
  2. Plotinian Neoplatonism
    1. Contemplation and Creation
    2. Nature and Personality
    3. Salvation and the Cosmic Process
      1. Plotinus’ Last Words
    4. The Achievement of Plotinus
      1. The Plotinian Synthesis
  3. Porphyry and Iamblichus
    1. The Nature of the Soul
      1. The (re)turn to Astrology
    2. The Quest for Transcendence
      1. Theurgy and the Distrust of Dialectic
  4. Proclus and Pseudo-Dionysius
    1. Being — Becoming — Being
    2. The God Beyond Being
  5. Appendix: The Renaissance Platonists
  6. References and Further Reading

1. What is Neoplatonism?

The term ‘Neoplatonism’ is a modern construction. Plotinus, who is often considered the ‘founder’ of Neoplatonism, would not have considered himself a “new” Platonist in any sense, but simply an expositor of the doctrines of Plato. That this required him to formulate an entirely new philosophical system would not have been viewed by him as a problem, for it was, in his eyes, precisely what the Platonic doctrine required. In a sense, this is true, for as early as the Old Academy we find Plato’s successors struggling with the proper interpretation of his thought, and arriving at strikingly different conclusions. Also, in the Hellenistic era, certain Platonic ideas were taken up by thinkers of various loyalties — Jewish, Gnostic, Christian — and worked up into new forms of expression that varied quite considerably from what Plato actually wrote in his Dialogues. Should this lead us to the conclusion that these thinkers were any less ‘loyal’ to Plato than were the members of the Academy (in its various forms throughout the centuries preceding Plotinus)? No; for the multiple and often contradictory uses made of Platonic ideas is a testament to the universality of Plato’s thought — that is, its ability to admit of a wide variety of interpretations and applications. In this sense, Neo-Platonism may be said to have begun immediately after Plato’s death, when new approaches to his philosophy were being broached. Indeed, we already see a hint, in the doctrines of Xenocrates (the second head of the Old Academy) of a type of salvation theory involving the unification of the two parts of the human soul — the “Olympian” or heavenly, and the “Titanic” or earthly (Dillon 1977, p. 27). If we accept Frederick Copleston’s description of Neoplatonism as “the intellectualist reply to the … yearning for personal salvation” (Copleston 1962, p. 216) we can already locate the beginning of this reply as far back as the Old Academy, and Neoplatonism would then not have begun with Plotinus. However, it is not clear that Xenocrates’ idea of salvation involved the individual; it is quite possible that he was referring to a unified human nature in an abstract sense. In any case, the early Hermetic-Gnostic tradition is certainly to an extent Platonic, and later Gnosticism and Christian Logos theology markedly so. If an intellectual reply to a general yearning for personal salvation is what characterizes Neoplatonism, then the highly intellectual Gnostics and Christians of the Late Hellenistic era must be given the title of Neoplatonists. However, if we are to be rigorous and define Neoplatonism as the synthesis of various more or less ‘Platonistic’ ideas into a grand expression of Platonic philosophy, then Plotinus must be considered the founder of Neoplatonism. Yet we must not forget that these Platonizing Christian, Gnostic, Jewish, and other ‘pagan’ thinkers provided the necessary speculative material to make this synthesis possible.

2. Plotinian Neoplatonism

The great third century thinker and ‘founder’ of Neoplatonism, Plotinus, is responsible for the grand synthesis of progressive Christian and Gnostic ideas with the traditional Platonic philosophy. He answered the challenge of accounting for the emergence of a seemingly inferior and flawed cosmos from the perfect mind of the divinity by declaring outright that all objective existence is but the external self-expression of an inherently contemplative deity known as the One (to hen), or the Good (ta kalon). Plotinus compares the expression of the superior godhead with the self-expression of the individual soul, which proceeds from the perfect conception of a Form (eidos), to the always flawed expression of this Form in the manner of a materially derived ‘personality’ that risks succumbing to the demands of divisive discursivity, and so becomes something less than divine. This diminution of the divine essence in temporality is but a necessary moment of the complete expression of the One. By elevating the experience of the individual soul to the status of an actualization of a divine Form, Plotinus succeeded, also, in preserving, if not the autonomy, at least the dignity and ontological necessity of personality. The Cosmos, according to Plotinus, is not a created order, planned by a deity on whom we can pass the charge of begetting evil; for the Cosmos is the self-expression of the Soul, which corresponds, roughly, to Philo’s logos prophorikos, the logos endiathetos of which is the Intelligence (nous). Rather, the Cosmos, in Plotinian terms, is to be understood as the concrete result or ‘product’ of the Soul’s experience of its own Mind (nous). Ideally, this concrete expression should serve the Soul as a reference-point for its own self-conscious existence; however, the Soul all too easily falls into the error of valuing the expression over the principle (arkhê), which is the contemplation of the divine Forms. This error gives rise to evil, which is the purely subjective relation of the Soul (now divided) to the manifold and concrete forms of its expressive act. When the Soul, in the form of individual existents, becomes thus preoccupied with its experience, Nature comes into being, and the Cosmos takes on concrete form as the locus of personality.

a. Contemplation and Creation

Hearkening back, whether consciously or not, to the doctrine of Speusippus (Plato’s successor in the Academy) that the One is utterly transcendent and “beyond being,” and that the Dyad is the true first principle (Dillon 1977, p. 12), Plotinus declares that the One is “alone with itself” and ineffable (cf. Enneads VI.9.6 and V.2.1). The One does not act to produce a cosmos or a spiritual order, but simply generates from itself, effortlessly, a power (dunamis) which is at once the Intellect (nous) and the object of contemplation (theôria) of this Intellect. While Plotinus suggests that the One subsists by thinking itself as itself, the Intellect subsists through thinking itself as other, and therefore becomes divided within itself: this act of division within the Intellect is the production of Being, which is the very principle of expression or discursivity (Ennead V.1.7). For this reason, the Intellect stands as Plotinus’ sole First Principle. At this point, the thinking or contemplation of the Intellect is divided up and ordered into thoughts, each of them subsisting in and for themselves, as autonomous reflections of the dunamis of the One. These are the Forms (eidê), and out of their inert unity there arises the Soul, whose task it is to think these Forms discursively and creatively, and to thereby produce or create a concrete, living expression of the divine Intellect. This activity of the Soul results in the production of numerous individual souls: living actualizations of the possibilities inherent in the Forms. Whereas the Intellect became divided within itself through contemplation, the Soul becomes divided outside of itself, through action (which is still contemplation, according to Plotinus, albeit the lowest type; cf. Ennead III.8.4), and this division constitutes the Cosmos, which is the expressive or creative act of the Soul, also referred to as Nature. When the individual soul reflects upon Nature as its own act, this soul is capable of attaining insight (gnôsis) into the essence of Intellect; however, when the soul views nature as something objective and external — that is, as something to be experienced or undergone, while forgetting that the soul itself is the creator of this Nature — evil and suffering ensue. Let us now examine the manner in which Plotinus explains Nature as the locus of personality.

b. Nature and Personality

Contemplation, at the level of the Soul, is for Plotinus a two-way street. The Soul both contemplates, passively, the Intellect, and reflects upon its own contemplative act by producing Nature and the Cosmos. The individual souls that become immersed in Nature, as moments of the Soul’s eternal act, will, ideally, gain a complete knowledge of the Soul in its unity, and even of the Intellect, by reflecting upon the concrete results of the Soul’s act — that is, upon the externalized, sensible entities that comprise the physical Cosmos. This reflection, if carried by the individual soul with a memory of its provenance always in the foreground, will lead to a just governing of the physical Cosmos, which will make of it a perfect material image of the Intellectual Cosmos, i.e., the realm of the Forms (cf. Enneads IV.3.7 and IV.8.6). However, things don’t always turn out so well, for individual souls often “go lower than is needful … in order to light the lower regions, but it is not good for them to go so far” (Ennead IV.3.17, tr. O’Brien 1964). For when the soul extends itself ever farther into the indeterminacy of materiality, it gradually loses memory of its divine origin, and comes to identify itself more and more with its surroundings — that is to say: the soul identifies itself with the results of the Soul’s act, and forgets that it is, as part of this Soul, itself an agent of the act. This is tantamount to a relinquishing, by the soul, of its divine nature. When the soul has thus abandoned itself, it begins to accrue many alien encrustations, if you will, that make of it something less than divine. These encrustations are the ‘accidents’ (in the Aristotelian sense) of personality. And yet the soul is never completely lost, for, as Plotinus insists, the soul need simply “think upon essential being” in order to return to itself, and continue to exist authentically as a governor of the Cosmos (Ennead IV.8.4-6). The memory of the personality that this wandering soul possessed must be forgotten in order for it to return completely to its divine nature; for if it were remembered, we would have to say, contradictorily, that the soul holds a memory of what occurred during its state of forgetfulness! So in a sense, Plotinus holds that individual personalities are not maintained at the level of Soul. However, if we understand personality as more than just a particular attitude attached to a concrete mode of existence, and rather view it as the sum total of experiences reflected upon in intellect, then souls most certainly retain their personalities, even at the highest level, for they persist as thoughts within the divine Mind (cp. Ennead IV.8.5). The personality that one acquires in action (the lowest type of contemplation) is indeed forgotten and dissolved, but the ‘personality’ or persistence in intellect that one achieves through virtuous acts most definitely endures (Ennead IV.3.32).

c. Salvation and the Cosmic Process

Plotinus, like his older contemporary, the Christian philosopher Origen of Alexandria, views the descent of the soul into the material realm as a necessary moment in the unfolding of the divine Intellect, or God. For this reason, the descent itself is not an evil, for it is a reflection of God’s essence. Both Origen and Plotinus place the blame for experiencing this descent as an evil squarely upon the individual soul. Of course, these thinkers held, respectively, quite different views as to why and how the soul experiences the descent as an evil; but they held one thing in common: that the rational soul will naturally choose the Good, and that any failure to do so is the result of forgetfulness or acquired ignorance. But whence this failure? Origen gave what, to Plotinus’ mind, must have been a quite unsatisfactory answer: that souls pre-existed as spiritual beings, and when they desired to create or ‘beget’ independently of God, they all fell into error, and languished there until the coming of Logos Incarnate. This view has more than a little Gnostic flavor to it, which would have sat ill with Plotinus, who was a great opponent of Gnosticism. The fall of the soul Plotinus refers, quite simply, to the tension between pure contemplation and divisive action — a tension that constitutes the natural mode of existence of the soul (cf. Ennead IV.8.6-7). Plotinus tells us that a thought is only completed or fully comprehended after it has been expressed, for only then can the thought be said to have passed from potentiality to actuality (Ennead IV.3.30). The question of whether Plotinus places more value on the potential or the actual is really of no consequence, for in the Plotinian plêrôma every potentiality generates an activity, and every activity becomes itself a potential for new activity (cf. Ennead III.8.8); and since the One, which is the goal or object of desire of all existents, is neither potentiality nor actuality, but “beyond being” (epekeina ousias), it is impossible to say whether the striving of existents, in Plotinus’ schema, will result in full and complete actualization, or in a repose of potentiality that will make them like their source. “Likeness to God as far as possible,” for Plotinus, is really likeness to oneself – authentic existence. Plotinus leaves it up to the individual to determine what this means.

i. Plotinus’ Last Words

In his biography of Plotinus, Porphyry records the last words of his teacher to his students as follows: “Strive to bring back the god in yourselves to the God in the All” (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 2, my translation). After uttering these words, Plotinus, one of the greatest philosophers the world has ever known, passed away. The simplicity of this final statement seems to be at odds with the intellectual rigors of Plotinus’ treatises, which challenge — and more often than not vanquish — just about every prominent philosophical view of the era. But this is only if we take this remark in a mystical or ecstatic religious sense. Plotinus demanded the utmost level of intellectual clarity in dealing with the problem of humankind’s relation to the highest principle of existence. Striving for or desiring salvation was not, for Plotinus, an excuse for simply abandoning oneself to faith or prayer or unreflective religious rituals; rather, salvation was to be achieved through the practice of philosophical investigation, of dialectic. The fact that Plotinus, at the end of his life, had arrived at this very simple formulation, serves to show that his dialectical quest was successful. In his last treatise, “On the Primal Good” (Ennead I.7), Plotinus is able to assert, in the same breath, that both life and death are good. He says this because life is the moment in which the soul expresses itself and revels in the autonomy of the creative act. However, this life, since it is characterized by action, eventually leads to exhaustion, and the desire, not for autonomous action, but for reposeful contemplation — of a fulfillment that is purely intellectual and eternal. Death is the relief of this exhaustion, and the return to a state of contemplative repose. Is this return to the Intellect a return to potentiality? It is hard to say. Perhaps it is a synthesis of potentiality and actuality: the moment at which the soul is both one and many, both human and divine. This would constitute Plotinian salvation — the fulfillment of the exhortation of the dying sage.

d. The Achievement of Plotinus

In the last analysis, what stands as the most important and impressive accomplishment of Plotinus is the manner in which he synthesized the pure, ‘semi-mythical’ expression of Plato with the logical rigors of the Peripatetic and Stoic schools, yet without losing sight of philosophy’s most important task: of rendering the human experience in intelligible and analyzable terms. That Plotinus’ thought had to take the ‘detour’ through such wildly mystical and speculative paths as Gnosticism and Christian salvation theology is only proof of his clear-sightedness, thoroughness, and admirable humanism. For all of his dialectical difficulties and perambulations, Plotinus’ sole concern is with the well-being (eudaimonia) of the human soul. This is, of course, to be understood as an intellectual, as opposed to a merely physical or even emotional well-being, for Plotinus was not concerned with the temporary or the temporal. The striving of the human mind for a mode of existence more suited to its intuited potential than the ephemeral possibilities of this material realm, while admittedly a striving born of temporality, is nonetheless directed toward atemporal and divine perfection. This is a striving or desire rendered all the more poignant and worthy of philosophy precisely because it is born in the depths of existential angst, and not in the primitive ecstasies of unreflective ritual. As the last true representative of the Greek philosophical spirit, Plotinus is Apollonian, not Dionysian. His concern is with the intellectual beautification of the human soul, and for this reason his notion of salvation does not, like Origen’s, imply an eternal state of objective contemplation of the divinity — for Plotinus, the separation between human and god breaks down, so that when the perfected soul contemplates itself, it is also contemplating the Supreme.

i. The Plotinian Synthesis

Plotinus was faced with the task of defending the true Platonic philosophy, as he understood it, against the inroads being made, in his time, most of all by Gnostics, but also by orthodox Christianity. Instead of launching an all-out attack on these new ideas, Plotinus took what was best from them, in his eyes, and brought these ideas into concert with his own brand of Platonism. For this reason, we are sometimes surprised to see Plotinus, in one treatise, speaking of the cosmos as a realm of forgetfulness and error, while in another, speaking of the cosmos as the most perfect expression of the godhead. Once we realize the extent to which certain Gnostic sects went in order to brand this world as a product of an evil and malignant Demiurge, to whom we owe absolutely no allegiance, it becomes clear that Plotinus was simply trying to temper the extreme form of an idea which he himself shared, though in a less radical sense. The feeling of being thrown into a hostile and alien world is a philosophically valid position from which to begin a critique and investigation of human existence; indeed, modern existentialist philosophers have often started from this same premise. However, Plotinus realized that it is not the nature of the human soul to simply escape from a realm of active engagement with external reality (the cosmos) to a passive receptance of divine form (within the plêrôma). The Soul, as Plotinus understands it, is an essentially creative being, and one which understands existence on its own terms. One of the beauties of Plotinus’ system is that everything he says concerning the nature of the Cosmos (spiritual and physical) can equally be held of the Soul. Now while it would be false to charge Plotinus with solipsism (or even narcissism, as one prominent commentator has done; cf. Julia Kristeva in Hadot 1993, p. 11), it would be correct to say that the entire Cosmos is an analogue of the experience of the Soul, which results in the attainment of full self-consciousness. The form of Plotinus’ system is the very form by which the Soul naturally comes to know itself in relation to its acts; and the expression of the Soul will always, therefore, be a philosophical expression. When we speak of the Plotinian synthesis, then, what we are speaking of is a natural dialectic of the Soul, which takes its own expressions into account, no matter how faulty or incomplete they may appear in retrospect, and weaves them into a cosmic tapestry of noetic images.

3. Porphyry and Iamblichus

Porphyry of Tyre (ca. 233-305 CE) is the most famous pupil of Plotinus. In addition to writing an introductory summary of his master’s theories (the treatise entitled Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind), Porphyry also composed the famous Isagoge, an introduction to the Categories of Aristotle, which came to exercise an immense influence on Mediaeval Scholasticism. The extent of Porphyry’s investigative interests exceeded that of his teacher, and his so-called “scientific” works, which survive to this day, include a treatise on music (On Prosody), and two studies of the astronomical and astrological theories of Claudius Ptolemy (ca. 70-140 CE), On the Harmonics, and an Introduction to The Astronomy of Ptolemy. He wrote biographies of Pythagoras and Plotinus, and edited and compiled the latter’s essays into six books, each containing nine treatises, giving them the title Enneads. Unlike Plotinus, Porphyry was interested primarily in the practical aspect of salvific striving, and the manner in which the soul could most effectively bring about its transference to ever higher realms of existence. This led Porphyry to develop a doctrine of ascent to the Intellect by way of the exercise of virtue (aretê) in the form of ‘good works’. This doctrine may owe its genesis to Porphyry’s supposed early adherence to Christianity, as attested by the historian Socrates, and suggested by St. Augustine (cf. Copleston 1962, p. 218). If Porphyry had, at some point, been a Christian, this would account for his belief in the soul’s objective relation to the divine Mind — an idea shared by Origen, whom Porphyry knew as a youth (cf. Eusebius, The History of the Church, p. 195) — and would explain his quite un-Plotinian belief in a gradual progress toward perfection, as opposed to the ‘instant salvation’ proposed by Plotinus (cf. Ennead IV.8.4).

Iamblichus of Apamea (d. ca. 330 CE) was a student of Porphyry. He departed from his teacher on more than a few points, most notably in his insistence on demoting Plotinus’ One (which Porphyry left unscathed, as it were) to the level of kosmos noêtos, which according to Iamblichus generates the intellectual realm (kosmos noêros). In this regard, Iamblichus can be said to have either severely misunderstood, or neglected to even attempt to understand, Plotinus on the important doctrine of contemplation (see above). This view led Iamblichus to posit a Supreme One even higher than the One of Plotinus, which generates the Intellectual Cosmos, and yet remains beyond all predication and determinacy. Iamblichus also made a tripartite division of Soul, positing a cosmic or All-Soul, and two lesser souls, corresponding to the rational and irrational faculties, respectively. This somewhat gratuitous skewing of the Plotinian noetic realm also led Iamblichus to posit an array of intermediate spiritual beings between the lower souls and the intelligible realm — daemons, the souls of heroes, and angels of all sorts. By placing so much distance between the earthly soul and the intelligible realm, Iamblichus made it difficult for the would-be philosopher to gain an intuitive knowledge of the higher Soul, although he insisted that everyone possesses such knowledge, coupled with an innate desire for the Good. In place of the vivid dialectic of Plotinus, Iamblichus established the practice of theurgy (theourgia), which he insists does not draw the gods down to man, but rather renders humankind, “who through generation are born subject to passion, pure and unchangeable” (On the Mysteries I.12.42; in Fowden 1986, p. 133). Whereas “likeness to God” had meant, for Plotinus, a recollection and perfection of one’s own divine nature (which is, in the last analysis, identical to nous; cf. Ennead III.4), for Iamblichus the relation of humankind to the divine is one of subordinate to superior, and so the pagan religious piety that Plotinus had scorned — “Let the gods come to me, and not I to them,” he had once said (cf. Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 10) — returns to philosophy with a vengeance. Iamblichus is best known for his lengthy treatise On the Mysteries. Like Porphyry, he also wrote a biography of Pythagoras.

a. The Nature of the Soul

In his introduction to the philosophy of Plotinus, entitled Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind, Porphyry remarks that the inclination of the incorporeal Soul toward corporeality “constitutes a second nature [the irrational soul], which unites with the body” (Launching-Points 18 [1]). This remark is supposedly a commentary on Ennead IV.2, where Plotinus discusses the relation of the individual soul to the All-Soul. While it is true that Plotinus often speaks of the individual soul as being independent of the highest Soul, he does this for illustrative purposes, in order to show how far into forgetfulness the soul that has become enamored of its act may fall. Yet Plotinus insists time and again that the individual soul and the All-Soul are one (cf. esp. Ennead IV.1), and that Nature is the Soul’s expressive act (see above). Irrationality does not constitute, for Plotinus, a “second nature,” but is merely a flawed exercise of rationality — that is, doxa untempered by epistêmê – on the part of the individual soul. Furthermore, the individual soul, which comes to unite with corporeality, governs and controls the body, making possible discursive knowledge as well as sense-perception. Uncontrolled pathos is what Plotinus calls irrationality; the soul brings aisthêsis (perceptive judgment) to corporeality, and so prevents it from sinking into irrational passivity. So what led Porphyry to make such an interpretative error, if error it was? It is quite possible that Porphyry had arrived at his own conclusions about the Soul, and tried to square his own theory with what Plotinus actually taught. One clue to the reason for the ‘misunderstanding’ may possibly lie in Porphyry’s early involvement with Christianity. While Porphyry himself never tells us that he had been a Christian, Augustine speaks of him as if he were an apostate, and the historian Socrates states outright that Porphyry had once been of the Christian faith, telling us that he left the fold in disgust after being assaulted by a rowdy band of Christians in Caesarea (Copleston 1962, p. 218). In any case, it is certain that he was acquainted with Plotinus’ older contemporary, the Christian Origen, and that he had been exposed to Christian doctrine. Indeed, his own spirited attack on Christianity (“Fifteen Arguments Against the Christians,” now preserved only in fragments) shows him to have possessed a wide knowledge of Holy Scripture, remarkable for a ‘pagan’ philosopher of that era. Porphyry’s exposure to Christian doctrine, then, would have left him with a view of salvation quite different from that of Plotinus, who seems never to have paid Christianity much mind. The best evidence we have for this explanation is Porphyry’s own theory of salvation — and it is remarkably similar to what we find in Origen! Porphyry’s salvation theory is dependent, like Origen’s, on a notion of the soul’s objective relation to God, and its consequent striving, not to actualize its own divine potentiality, but to attain a level of virtue that makes it capable of partaking fully of the divine essence. This is accomplished through the exercise of virtue, which sets the soul on a gradual course of progress toward the highest Good. Beginning with simple ‘practical virtues’ (politikai arêtai) the soul gradually rises to higher levels, eventually attaining what Porphyry calls the paradeigmatikai arêtai or ‘exemplary virtues’ which make of the soul a living expression of the divine Mind (cf. Porphyry, Letter to Marcella 29). Note that Porphyry stops the soul’s ascent at nous, and presumably holds that the ‘saved’ soul will eternally contemplate the infinite power of the One. If Porphyry’s concern had been with the preservation of personality, then this explanation makes some sense. However, it is more likely that the true reason for Porphyry’s rejection of the radically ‘hubristic’ theory (at least to pietistic pagans) of the nature of the individual soul held by Plotinus was a result of his intention to restore dignity to the traditional religion of the Greeks (which had come under attack not only by Plotinus, but by Christians as well). Evidence of such a program resides in Porphyry’s allegorical interpretations of Homer and traditional cultic practice, as well as his possibly apologetic work on Philosophy from Oracles (now lost). Compared to Plotinus, then, Porphyry was quite the conservative, concerned as he was with maintaining the ancient view of humankind’s relatively humble position in the cosmic hierarchy, over against Plotinus’ view that the soul is a god, owing little more than a passing nod to its ‘noble brethren’ in the heavens.

i. The (re)turn to Astrology

One of the results of Porphyry’s conservative position toward traditional religious practice and belief was the ‘return’ to the doctrine that the stars and planets are capable of affecting and ordering human life. Plotinus argued that since the individual soul is one with the All-Soul, it is in essence a co-creator of the Cosmos, and therefore not really subject to the laws governing the Cosmos — for the soul is the source and agent of those laws! Therefore, a belief in astrology was, for Plotinus, absurd, since if the soul turned to beings dependent upon its own law — i.e., the stars and planets — in order to know itself, then it would only end up knowing aspects of its own act, and would never return to itself in full self-consciousness. Furthermore, as we have seen, Plotinian salvation was instantly available to the soul, if only it would turn its mind to “essential being” (see above); because of this, Plotinus saw no reason to bring the stars and planets into the picture. For Porphyry, however, who believed that the soul must gradually work toward salvation, a knowledge of the operations of the heavenly bodies and their relation to humankind would have been an important tool in gaining ever higher levels of virtue. In fact, Porphyry seems to have held the view that the soul receives certain “powers” from each of the planets — right judgment from Saturn, proper exercise of the will from Jupiter, impulse from Mars, opinion and imagination from the Sun, and (what else?) sensuous desire from Venus; from the Moon the soul receives the power of physical production (cf. Hegel, p. 430) — and that these powers enable to the soul to know things both earthly and heavenly. This theoretical knowledge of the powers of the planets, then, would have made the more practical knowledge of astrology quite useful and meaningful for an individual soul seeking to know itself as such. The usefulness of astrology for Porphyry, in this regard, probably resided in its ability to permit an individual, through an analysis of his birth chart, to know which planet — and therefore which “power” — exercised the dominant influence on his life. In keeping with the ancient Greek doctrine of the “golden mean,” the task of the individual would then be to work to bring to the fore those other “powers” — each present to a lesser degree in the soul, but still active — and thereby achieve a balance or sôphrosunê that would render the soul more capable of sharing in the divine Mind. The art of astrology, it must be remembered, was in wide practice in the Hellenistic world, and Plotinus’ rejection of it was an exception that was by no means the rule. Plotinus’ views on astrology apparently found few adherents, even among Platonists, for we see not only Porphyry, but also (to an extent) Iamblichus and even Proclus declaring its value — the latter being responsible for a paraphrase of Claudius Ptolemy’s astrological compendium known as the Tetrabiblos or sometimes simply as The Astronomy. In addition to penning a commentary on Ptolemy’s tome, Porphyry also wrote his own Introduction to Astronomy (by which is apparently meant “Astrology,” the modern distinction not holding in Hellenistic times). Unfortunately, this work no longer survives intact.

(For more on this topic, see Hellenistic Astrology.)

b. The Quest for Transcendence

The philosophy of Plotinus was highly discursive, meaning that it operated on the assumption that the highest meaning, the most profound truth (even a so-called mystical truth) is translatable, necessarily, into language; and furthermore, that any and every experience only attains its full value as meaning when it has reached expression in the form of language. This idea, of course, placed the One always beyond the discursive understanding of the human soul, since the One was proclaimed, by Plotinus, to be not only beyond discursive knowledge, but also the very source and possibility of such knowledge. According to Plotinus, then, any time the individual soul expresses a certain truth in language, this very act is representative of the power of the One. This notion of the simultaneous intimate proximity of the One to the soul, and, paradoxically, its extreme transcendence and ineffability, is possible only within the confines of a purely subjective and introspective philosophy like that of Plotinus; and since such a philosophy, by its very nature, cannot appeal to common, external perceptions, it is destined to remain the sole provenance of the sensitive and enlightened few. Porphyry did not want to admit this, and so he found himself seeking, as St. Augustine tells us, “a universal way (universalem viam) for the liberation of the soul” (City of God 10.32, in Fowden, p. 132), believing, as he did, that no such way had yet been discovered by or within philosophy. This did not imply, for Porphyry, a wholesale rejection of the Plotinian dialectic in favor of a more esoteric process of salvation; but it did lead Porphyry (see above) to look to astrology as a means of orienting the soul toward its place in the cosmos, and thereby allowing it to achieve the desired salvation in the most efficacious manner possible. Iamblichus, on the other hand, rejected even Porphyry’s approach, in favor of a path toward the divinity that is more worthy of priests (hieratikoi) than philosophers; for Iamblichus believed that not only the One, but all the gods and demi-gods, exceed and transcend the individual soul, making it necessary for the soul seeking salvation to call upon the superior beings to aid it in its progress. This is accomplished, Iamblichus tells us, by “the perfective operation of unspeakable acts (erga) correctly performed … acts which are beyond all understanding (huper pasan noêsin)” and which are “intelligible only to the gods” (On the Mysteries II.11.96-7, in Fowden, p. 132). These ritualistic acts, and the ‘logic’ underlying them, Iamblichus terms “theurgy” (theourgia). These theurgic acts are necessary, for Iamblichus, because he is convinced that philosophy, which is based solely upon thought (ennoia) — and thought, we must remember, is always an accomplishment of the individual mind, and hence discursive — is unable to reach that which is beyond thought. The practice of theurgy, then, becomes a way for the soul to experience the presence of the divinity, instead of merely thinking or conceptualizing the godhead. Porphyry took issue with this view, in his Letter to Anebo, which is really a criticism of the ideas of his pupil, Iamblichus, where he stated that, since theurgy is a physical process, it cannot possibly translate into a spiritual effect. Iamblichus’ On the Mysteries was written as a reply to Porphyry’s criticisms, but the defense of the pupil did not succeed in vanquishing the persistent attacks of the master. While both Porphyry and Iamblichus recognized, to a lesser and greater extent, respectively, the limitations of the Plotinian dialectic, Porphyry held firm to the idea that since the divinity is immaterial it can only be grasped in a noetic fashion — i.e., discursively (and even astrology, in spite of its mediative capacity, is still an intellectual exercise, open to dialectic and narratization); Iamblichus, adhering roughly to the same view, nevertheless argued that the human soul must not think god on its own terms, but must allow itself to be transformed by the penetrating essence of god, of which the soul partakes through rituals intended to transform the particularized, fragmented soul into a being that is “pure and unchangeable” (cf. On the Mysteries I.12.42; Fowden, p. 133).

i. Theurgy and the Distrust of Dialectic

According to the schema of Plotinian dialectic, the ‘stance’ of the individual soul is the sole source of truth certainty, being a judging faculty dependent always upon the higher Soul. From the perspective of one who believes that the soul is immersed in Nature, instead of recognizing, as Plotinus did, the soul’s status as an intimate governor of Nature (which is the Soul’s own act), dialectic may very well appear as a solipsistic (and therefore faulty) attempt on the part of an individual mind to know its reality by imposing conceptual structures and strictures upon the phenomena that constitute this reality. Iamblichus believed that since every individual soul is immersed in the ‘bodily element,’ no soul is capable of understanding the divine nature through the pure exercise of human reason — for reason itself, at the level of the human soul-body composite, is tainted by the changeable nature of matter, and therefore incapable of rising to that perfect knowledge that is beyond all change (cp. Plato, Phaedrus 247e). Dialectic, then, as the soul’s attempt to know reality, is seen by Iamblichus as an attempt by an already fallen being to lead itself up out of the very locus of its own forgetfulness. Now Iamblichus does not completely reject dialectical reason; he simply requests that it be tempered by an appeal to intermediate divinities, who will aid the fallen soul in its ascent back towards the Supreme Good. The practice of ritualistic theurgy is the medium by which the fallen soul ascends to a point at which it becomes capable of engaging in a meaningful dialectic with the divinity. This dependence upon higher powers nevertheless negates the soul’s own innate ability to think itself as god, and so we may say that Iamblichus’ ideas represent a decisive break with the philosophy of Plotinus.

4. Proclus and Pseudo-Dionysius

Proclus (410-485 CE) is, next to Plotinus, the most accomplished and rigorous of the Neoplatonists. Born in Constantinople, he studied philosophy in Athens, and through diligent effort rose to the rank of head teacher or ‘scholarch’ of that great school. In addition to his accomplishments in philosophy, Proclus was also a religious universalist, who had himself initiated into all the mystery religions being practiced during his time. This was doubtless due to the influence of Iamblichus, whom Proclus held in high esteem (cf. Proclus, Theology of Plato III; in Hegel, p. 432). The philosophical expression of Proclus is more precise and logically ordered than that of Plotinus. Indeed, Proclus posits the Intellect (nous) as the culmination of the productive act (paragein) of the One; this is in opposition to Plotinus, who described the Intellect as proceeding directly from the One, thereby placing Mind before Thought, and so making thought the process by which the Intellect becomes alienated from itself, thus requiring the salvific act in order to attain the fulfillment of Being, which is, for Plotinus, the return of Intellect to itself. Proclus understands the movement of existence as a tripartite progression beginning with an abstract unity, passing into a multiplicity that is identified with Life, and returning again to a unity that is no longer merely abstract, but now actualized as an eternal manifestation of the godhead. What constituted, for Plotinus, the salvific drama of human existence is, for Proclus, simply the logical, natural order of things. However, by thus removing the yearning for salvation from human existence, as something to be accomplished, positively, Proclus is ignoring or overly intellectualizing, if you will, an existential aspect of human existence that is as real as it is powerful. Plotinus recognized the importance of the salvific drive for the realization of true philosophy, making philosophy a means to an end; Proclus utilizes philosophy, rather, more in the manner of a useful, descriptive language by which a thinker may describe the essential realities of a merely contingent existence. In this sense, Proclus is more faithful to the ‘letter’ of Plato’s Dialogues; but for this same reason he fails to rise to the ‘spirit’ of the Platonic philosophy. Proclus’ major works include commentaries on Plato’s Timaeus, Republic, Parmenides, Alcibiades I, and the Cratylus. He also wrote treatises on the Theology of Plato, On Providence, and On the Subsistence of Evil. His most important work is undoubtedly the Elements of Theology, which contains the clearest exposition of his ideas.

a. Being — Becoming — Being

We found, in Plotinus, an explanation and expression of a cosmos that involved a gradual development from all but static unity toward eventual alienation — a moment at which the active soul must make the profound decision to renounce autonomous existence and re-merge with the source of all Being, or else remain forever in the darkness of forgetfulness and error. Salvation, for Plotinus, was relatively easy to accomplish, but never guaranteed. For Proclus, on the other hand, the arkhê or ‘ruling beginning’ of all Life is the ‘One-in-itself’ (to auto hen), or that which is responsible for the ordering of all existents, insofar as existence is, in the last analysis, the sovereign act or expression of this primordial unity or monad. The expression of this One is perfectly balanced, being a trinity containing, as distinct expressions, each moment of self-realization of this One; and each of these moments, according to Proclus, have the structure of yet another trinity. The first trinity corresponds to the limit, which is the guide and reference-point of all further manifestations; the second to the unlimited, which is also Life or the productive power (dunamis); and the third, finally, to the ‘mixture’ (mikton, diakosmos), which is the self-reflective moment of return during which the soul realizes itself as a thinking — i.e., living — entity. Thought is, therefore, the culmination of Life and the fulfillment of Being. Thought is also the reason (logos) that binds these triadic unities together in a grand harmonious plêrôma, if you will. Being, for Proclus, is that divine self-presence, “shut up without development and maintained in strict isolation” (Hegel, p. 446) which is the object of Life’s thinking; this ‘object’ gives rise to that thinking which leads, eventually, to understanding (nous), which is the thought of being, and appears (ekphanôs), always, as ‘being’s begetter’. When the circle is completed, and reflected upon, logically, we are met with the following onto-cosmological schema: thought (noêtos, also known as ‘Being’) giving rise to its “negative” which is thinking (Hegel, p. 393) and the thought ‘it is’ (noêtos kai noêros), produces its own precise reflection — ‘pure thinking’ — and this reflection is the very manifestation (phanerôsis) of the deity within the fluctuating arena of individual souls. Being is eternal and static precisely because it always returns to itself as Being; and ‘Becoming’is the conceptual term for this process, which involves the cyclical play between that which is and is not, at any given time. “[T]he thought of every man is identical with the existence of every man, and each is both the thought and the existence” (Proclus, Platonic Theology III., in Hegel, p. 449). The autonomous drive toward dissolution, which is so germane to the soul as such, is wiped away by Proclus, for his dialectic is impeccably clean. However, he does not account for the yearning for the infinite (as does Plotinus) and the consequent existential desire for productive power falls on its face before the supreme god of autonomous creation — which draws all existents into its primeval web of dissolution.

b. The God Beyond Being

Very little is known about the life of the so-called Pseudo-Dionysius. For many centuries, the writings of this mystical philosopher were believed to have been from the pen of none other Dionysius, the disciple of St. Paul. Later scholarship has shed considerable doubt on this claim, and most modern scholars believe this author to have been active during the late fifth century CE. Indeed, the earliest reference to the Dionysian Corpus that we possess is from 533 CE. There is no mention of this author’s work before this date. Careful study of the Pseudo-Dionysian writings has uncovered many parallels between the theurgical doctrines of Iamblichus, and the triadic metaphysical schema of Proclus. Yet what we witness in these writings is the attempt by a thinker who is at once religiously sensitive and philosophically engaged to bring the highly developed Platonism of his time into line with a Christian theological tradition that was apparently persisting on the fringes of orthodoxy. To this extent, we may refer to the Pseudo-Dionysius as a ‘decadent,’ for he (or she?) was writing at a time when the heyday of Platonism had attained the status of a palaios logos (‘ancient teaching’) to be, not merely commented upon, but savored as an aesthetic monument to an era already long past. It is important to note, in this regard, that the writings of Pseudo-Dionysius do not contain any theoretical arguments or dialectical moments, but simply many subtle variations on the apophatic/kataphatic theology for which our writer is renowned. Indeed, he writes as if his readers already know, and are merely in need of clarification. His message is quite simple, and is manifestly distilled from the often cumbersome doctrines of earlier thinkers (especially Iamblichus and Proclus). Pseudo-Dionysius professes a God who is beyond all distinctions, and who even transcends the means utilized by human beings to reach Him. For Pseudo-Dionysius, the Holy Trinity (which is probably analogous to Proclus’ highest trinity, see above) serves as a “guide” to the human being who seeks not only to know but to unite with “him who is beyond all being and knowledge” (Pseudo-Dionysius, The Mystical Theology 997A-1000A, tr. C. Luibheid 1987). In the expression of the Pseudo-Dionysius the yearning for the infinite reaches a poetical form that at once fulfills and exceeds philosophy.

5. Appendix:`The Renaissance Platonists

After the closing of the Neoplatonic Academy in Athens by the Emperor Justinian in 529 CE, Platonism ceased to be a living philosophy. Due to the efforts of the Christian philosopher Boethius (480-525 CE), who translated Porphyry’s Isagoge, and composed numerous original works as well, the Middle Ages received a faint glimmer of the ancient glories of the Platonic philosophy. St. Augustine, also, was responsible for imparting a sense of Neoplatonic doctrine to the Latin West, but this was by way of commentary and critique, and not in any way a systematic exposition of the philosophy. Generally speaking, it is safe to say that the European Middle Ages remained in the grip of Aristotelianism until the early Renaissance, when certain brilliant Italian thinkers began to rediscover, translate, and expound upon the original texts of Platonism. Chief among these thinkers were Marsilio Ficino (1433-1492) and Pico della Mirandola (1463-1494). Ficino produced fine Latin translations of Plato’s Dialogues, the Enneads of Plotinus, and numerous works by Porphyry, Iamblichus, Proclus, Pseudo-Dionysius, and many others. In addition to his scholarly ability, Ficino was also a fine commentator and philosopher in his own right. His brilliant essay on Five Questions Concerning The Mind is a concise summary of general Neoplatonic doctrine, based upon Ficino’s own view that the lot of the human soul is to inquire into its own nature, and that since this inquiry causes the human soul to experience misery, the soul must do everything it can to transcend the physical body and live a life worthy of the blessed angels (cf. Cassirer, et. al. (ed) 1948, p. 211-212). Giovanni Pico, the Count of Mirandola, was a colorful figure who lived a short life, fraught with strife. He roused the ire of the papacy by composing a voluminous work defending nine-hundred theses drawn from his vast reading of the Ancients; thirteen of these theses were deemed heretical by the papacy, and yet Pico refused to change or withdraw a single one. Like his friend Ficino, Pico was a devotee of ancient wisdom, drawing not only upon the Platonic canon, but also upon the Pre-Socratic literature and the Hermetic Corpus, especially the Poimandres. Pico’s most famous work is the Oration on the Dignity of Man, in which he eloquently states his learned view that humankind was created by God “as a creature of indeterminate nature,” possessed of the unique ability to ascend or descend on the scale of Being through the autonomous exercise of free will (Oration 3, in Cassirer, et. al. (ed) 1948, p. 224). Pico’s view of free will was quite different from that expressed by Plotinus, and indeed most other Neoplatonists, and it came as no surprise when Pico composed a treatise On Being and the One which ended on Aristotelian terms, declaring the One to be coincident with or persisting amidst Being — a wholly un-Platonic doctrine. With Ficino, then, we may say that Platonism achieved a brief moment of archaic glory, while with Pico, it was plunged once again into the quagmire of self-referential empiricism.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Cassirer, Ernst; Kristeller, Paul Oskar; Randall, John Herman Jr. (editors) The Renaissance Philosophy of Man (University of Chicago Press 1948).
  • Cooper, John M. (ed.), Plato: Complete Works (Hackett Publishing 1997).
  • Copleston S.J., Frederick, A History of Philosophy (vol. I, part II): Greece and Rome (Image Books 1962).
  • Dillon, John (1977), The Middle Platonists (Cornell University Press).
  • Eusebius (tr. G.A. Williamson 1965), The History of the Church (Penguin Books).
  • Fowden, Garth, The Egyptian Hermes: A Historical Approach To The Late Pagan Mind (Cambridge University Press 1986).
  • Hadot, Pierre (tr. M. Chase), Plotinus, or The Simplicity of Vision (University of Chicago Press 1993).
  • Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich (tr. E.S. Haldane and Frances H. Simson), Lectures on the History of Philosophy (vol. II): Plato And The Platonists (Bison Books 1995).
  • Jaeger, Werner, Early Christianity and Greek Paideia (Harvard University Press 1961).
  • Layton, Bentley (1987), The Gnostic Scriptures (Doubleday: The Anchor Bible Reference Library).
  • O’Brien S.J., Elmer (1964), The Essential Plotinus: Representative Treatises From The Enneads (Hackett Publishing).
  • Origen of Alexandria, Commentary on John, tr. in The Ante-Nicene Fathers, vol. X. (Eerdmans 1979, reprint).
  • Origen of Alexandria, On First Principles [De Principiis], tr. in The Ante-Nicene Fathers, vol. IV. (Eerdmans 1979, reprint).
  • Philo of Alexandria (tr. F.H. Colson and G.H. Whitaker), On the Creation of the World [De Opificio Mundi], in vol. 1 of The Loeb Classical Library edition of Philo (Harvard University Press 1929).
  • Plotinus (tr. A.H. Armstrong), The Enneads, in seven volumes (Loeb Classical Library: Harvard University Press 1966).
  • Porphyry (tr. K. Guthrie), Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind [Pros ta noeta aphorismoi] (Phanes Press 1988).
  • Porphyry (tr. A. Zimmern), Porphyry’s Letter to His Wife Marcella Concerning the Life of Philosophy and the Ascent to the Gods (Phanes Press 1986).
  • Porphyry (tr. A.H. Armstrong), Life of Plotinus [Vita Plotini], in volume one of the Loeb Classical Library edition of Plotinus (Harvard University Press 1966).
  • Proclus (tr. T. Taylor), Lost Fragments of Proclus (Wizards Bookshelf 1988).
  • Proclus (tr. T. Taylor), Ten Doubts Concerning Providence, and On the Subsistence of Evil (Ares Publishers 1980).
  • Pseudo-Dionysius (tr. C. Luibheid 1987), Pseudo-Dionysius: The Complete Works (Paulist Press).

Author Information

Edward Moore
Email: patristics@gmail.com
St. Elias School of Orthodox Theology
U. S. A.

Last updated: May 2, 2005 | Originally published: