Neo-Stoicism (or Neostoicism) is the name given to a late Renaissance philosophical movement that attempted to revive ancient Stoicism in a form that would be acceptable to a Christian audience. This involved the rejection or modification of certain parts of the Stoic system, especially physical doctrines such as materialism and determinism. The key text founding this movement was Justus Lipsius’s De Constantia (“On Constancy”) of 1584. After Lipsius the other key exponent of Neostoicism was Guillaume Du Vair. Other figures that have been associated with this movement include Pierre Charron, Francisco de Quevedo, and Michel de Montaigne.
The term ‘Neostoicism’ appears to have been coined by Jean Calvin. In his Institutio Religionis Christianae (‘Institutes of the Christian Religion’) of 1536, Calvin made reference to ‘new Stoics’ (novi Stoici) who attempted to revive the ideal of impassivity (apatheia) instead of embracing the properly Christian virtue of heroically enduring suffering sent by God (Inst. 3.8.9). While the true Christian acknowledges the test sent to him by God, these modern ‘Neostoics’ pretend to deny the existence of such suffering altogether.
Whatever its origins, the term ‘Neostoicism’ has come to refer to the sixteenth and seventeenth century intellectual movement which attempted to revive ancient Stoic philosophy in a form that would be compatible with Christianity. As Calvin’s objection attests, this was often seen by others to be a very difficult, if not impossible, task. It is also important to stress that this attempt was not merely to revive scholarly interest in ancient Stoic thought (although it often involved this as well) but rather to revive Stoicism as a living philosophical movement by which people could lead their lives.
The central figure in the Neostoic movement was Justus Lipsius. Lipsius’s De Constantia (‘On Constancy’) may be credited as the inspiration for this movement. This work was first published in 1584, well after Calvin’s reference to contemporary ‘Neostoics’. Whomever Calvin had in mind in his polemic, they did not form part of what is now known as the Neostoic movement. The term’s use now reflects modern scholarly classification rather than Renaissance self-description.
Attempts to reconcile Stoicism with Christianity are almost as old as Christianity itself. The earliest attempts can be seen in the works of a number of the Latin Church Fathers. St. Augustine showed sympathy towards the Stoic doctrine of apatheia, while Tertullian was drawn towards Stoic pantheistic materialism. However none of these Christian authors wholly endorsed the Stoic philosophical system. Indeed, they often conflicted with regard to which parts of Stoic philosophy they thought could be reconciled with orthodox Christian teaching. Later Neostoics, especially Justus Lipsius, often drew upon the authority of the Church Fathers, citing their endorsements of certain Stoic ideas, but remaining silent about their doubts.
Stoicism continued to exert influence throughout the Christian Middle Ages. Adaptations of Epictetus’s Enchiridion (‘Handbook’) were made for use in monasteries (references to ‘Socrates’ were altered to ‘St. Paul’), highlighting the perceived affinity between the Christian and the Stoic way of life. Seneca’s Epistulae (‘Letters’) circulated and appear to have been read by many. Stoic ethical ideas can be seen in the moral works of Peter Abelard, especially in the Dialogus inter Philosophum, Iudaeum et Christianum (‘Dialogue Between a Philosopher, a Jew, and Christian’), and his pupil John of Salisbury.
In each of these instances Stoic moral ideas were taken out of the broader context of the Stoic philosophical system and placed with a Christian context. It is sometimes claimed that this practice simply reflected the predominance of moral themes within the available sources, namely the Latin works of Seneca and Cicero. However, at least some knowledge of Stoic physics was readily accessible in works such as Cicero’s De Natura Deorum (‘On the Nature of the Gods’), De Divinatione (‘On Divination’), and De Fato (‘On Fate’). The existence of a forged correspondence between Seneca and St. Paul, accepted as genuine by St. Augustine and St. Jerome, may well have contributed to the thought that it was possible to combine Stoic ethics with Christian teaching.
In marked contrast, the attempt to revive Stoic pantheistic physics by David of Dinant ended with declarations of heresy and the burning of books. His identification of God with primary matter led to his condemnation in 1210 and he was forced to flee France. Consequently none of his works survive except as brief quotations in the hostile polemics of St. Albert the Great and St. Thomas Aquinas. Although medieval Christian authorities were apparently open to the use of Stoic ethics as a supplement to Christian teaching, they certainly remained suspicious of Stoic physics, which was at best pantheistic and at worst materialist and atheistic.
This, then, was the background to the late Renaissance attempt to revive Stoicism. Stoic ethics was thought to contain much that could be commended to the Christian, but only if carefully disentangled from Stoic physics. In attempting this careful operation, the remarks of the Church Fathers proved to be especially influential. These impeccable Christian authorities could be cited without fear of reproach from the Church.
Although early Renaissance figures such as Petrarch and Politian displayed an interest in and sympathy for Stoic philosophy, the first concerted attempt to resurrect Stoicism as a living philosophical movement must be credited to the Belgian classical philologist and Humanist Justus Lipsius (1547-1606). Lipsius’s fame today rests primarily upon his important critical editions of Seneca and Tacitus. While Seneca taught Lipsius some of the details of Stoic doctrine, Tacitus recorded for him that doctrine ‘in action’ in the lives of a number of Roman Stoics.
Lipsius’s principal philosophical work, De Constantia (‘On Constancy’) of 1584, outlines the way in which a Christian may, in times of trouble, draw upon a Stoic inspired ethic of constancy (constantia) in order help him endure the evils of the world. As Lipsius makes clear in a prefatory letter to the work, he was the first to “have attempted the opening and clearing of this way of wisdom [i.e. Stoicism], so long recluded and overgrown with thorns”. Yet in order to do this, Lipsius had to present this pagan philosophy in a form that could be reconciled with Christianity. Thus he makes clear in the same letter that it is only in conjunction with holy scriptures (cum divinis litteris conjuncta) that this ancient way of wisdom (Sapientiae viam) can lead to tranquillity and peace (ad Tranquillitatem et Quietem). In particular, Lipsius draws attention to those parts of Stoic philosophy that the devout Christian must reject (Const. 1.20). These are the claims that (a) God is submitted to fate; (b) that there is a natural order of causes (and thus no miracles); (c) that there is no contingency; (d) that there is no free will. All four of these depend upon the Stoic theory of determinism which, in turn, is based upon Stoic materialism.
Another Stoic doctrine that aroused some controversy was the ideal of impassiveness (apatheia). As we have already seen, it was with reference to this notion that Calvin criticised the ‘new Stoics’ (novi Stoici) of his day. Christian discussion of this Stoic idea dates back at least to St. Augustine who initially appears to have been sympathetic (e.g. De Ordine) but later became more critical. The issue is closely bound with judgements concerning the power of reason. For the Stoics, the wise man or sage (sophos) can overcome all unwanted emotions by rational analysis of his judgements. For a Christian, however, this should only be possible with the help of God’s grace. It is the love of God, rather than the exercise of philosophical reason, that frees the Christian from mental disturbances. This is the position that St. Augustine affirms in his later works (e.g. De Civitate Dei). It is thus possible, using St Augustine alone, to cite a Church Father both for and against this Stoic doctrine.
The Neostoic must be careful here. Lipsius’s entire project in De Constantia is primarily philosophical. His concern is to promote rational reflection concerning emotional distress in order overcome it. Following the Stoic Epictetus, Lipsius affirms that the philosopher’s school should be conceived as a doctor’s surgery (Const. 1.10), a place where one can find medicine for the soul. Thus Lipsius affirms the power of philosophical analysis to enable one to overcome the emotions. This conflicts with the attitudes of both the mature St. Augustine and Calvin. Although Neostoicim includes numerous concessions to Christian teaching, this affirmation of the power of reason shows that its philosophical commitment to Stoicism took priority over a strict adherence to the Christian faith. Neostoics were later criticised for precisely this by Christian authors such as Pascal.
Despite these difficulties, Neostoicism could point to the Stoic affirmation of virtue over pleasure (in opposition to unquestionably heretical Epicureanism) and to the Stoic attitude of indifference towards material possessions. Thus it became commonplace for Christians with Neostoic leanings to affirm the benefit that could be gained from the study of Stoic texts. The first translation of Epictetus’s Enchiridion (‘Handbook’) into English (in 1567) was prefaced with the remark that “the authoure whereof although he were an ethnicke, yet he wrote very godly & christianly”. Similarly, a translation of a Neostoic text into English began with the claim that “philosophie in generall is profitable unto a Christian man, if it be well and rightly used: but no kinde of philosophie is more profitable and neerer approaching unto Christianitie than the philosophie of the Stoicks”.
Neostoicism was never an organized intellectual movement. Thus modern scholars do not always agree upon a fixed list of ‘Neostoics’. When used in its most restricted sense, the term is reserved only for Justus Lipsius and Guillaume Du Vair (see below). When used in its widest sense, it is applied to almost any sixteenth or seventeenth century author whose works display the influence of Stoic ideas. The following are some of the more obvious candidates after Lipsius himself.
Guillaume Du Vair was a French statesman, onetime clerk councillor to the Paris parliament, and later Bishop of Lisieux. Du Vair was an admirer of Lipsius and produced his own treatise De la Constance (‘On Constancy’) in 1594. While Lipsius had been inspired by Seneca, Du Vair drew his inspiration from Epictetus. He translated the latter’s Enchiridion (‘Handbook’) into French (c. 1586) and characterized his own treatise, the Philosophie morale de Stoïques (‘Moral Philosophy of the Stoics’), as merely a reconstructed version of the Enchiridion, rewritten and reorganized in order to make its doctrines more accessible to the public.
In Philosophie morale de Stoïques Du Vair treads a very careful path indeed in his attempt to combine Christianity with his admiration for Epictetus. He suggests that, although it would be improper for anyone to prefer the profane and puddle water of the pagan philosophers to the clear and sacred fountain of God’s word, nevertheless the Stoics must be acknowledged as the greatest reproach to Christianity, insofar as they managed to live the noblest and most virtuous lives without the true light of the Christian God to guide them.
Following Epictetus, Du Vair argues that one should not concern oneself with external possessions. In particular, he suggests that the desire for great wealth is often the cause of great unhappiness. If one can free oneself from the passions of hope, despair, fear, and anger, then it will become possible to confront the trials and misfortunes of life without any great concern. Of particular interest, however, is the way in which Du Vair synthesises the Stoic doctrine of apatheia with his Christian belief. For Du Vair, complete mastery of one’s passions, achieved via the application of Stoic principles, does not contradict Christian teaching but rather can form the basis for a truly Christian way of life. Only one who has overcome the passions of fear and anger can, for instance, practice true Christian forgiveness towards one’s enemies.
Pierre Charron was a French churchman and associate of Michel de Montaigne. He has been characterized as a figure in the Pyrrhonist revival and thus as much of a Neosceptic as a Neostoic, if not more so. His principal philosophical work, De la Sagesse (‘On Wisdom’), was first published in 1601. This text focuses upon the image of the Stoic ethical ideal, the wise man or sage (sophos), and the task of progressing towards that ideal. It is not merely a treatise on ethics but primarily a guide to the life of wisdom, a guide to ‘making progress’ (prokopê), following the form of Epictetus’s Enchiridion.
In the first book of De la Sagesse Charron focuses upon self-knowledge and self-examination; in the second book he focuses upon behaviour; in the third he outlines the traditional virtues of prudence, justice, fortitude, and temperance. Charron’s text was incredibly popular in its day, having appeared in thirty-six editions by 1672. Yet it is less an original treatise and more a compendium of existing material, drawing upon a variety of other authors both ancient and modern. In particular, Charron has often been accused of plagiarising from Montaigne on a grand scale. He also openly acknowledges his debt to Neostoicism. In one of his prefaratory notes, Charron writes that, “this subject has indeed had a great right done to it by Lipsius already, who wrote an excellent treatise, in a method peculiar to himself, but the substance of it you will find all transplanted here” (Sag. 3.2.Pref.). Charron also acknowledges his debt to Du Vair, “to whom I have been much beholding, and from whom have borrowed a great deal of what I shall say upon this subject of the passions” (Sag. 1.18.Pref).
Francisco de Quevedo was a Spanish author who held positions at the royal court. He also produced a Spanish translation of Epictetus and a short work entitled Doctrina Estoica (‘Stoic Doctrine’) which were published together in 1635. The latter work was the second Neostoic text to appear in Spanish, pre-dated only by a translation of Lipsius’s De Constantia, which appeared in 1616. Here, and throughout his works, Quevedo draws upon both Seneca and Epictetus and quotes both of these Stoic authorities often.
In the Doctrina Estoica (the full title is Nombre, Origen, Intento, Recomendación y Descendencia de la Doctrina Estoica) Quevedo attempted to connect Stoic thought with the Bible. Noting that the founder of Stoicism, Zeno, was of Semitic origin, Quevedo claimed that the biblical account of Job’s heroic endurance in the face of adversity was the inspiration behind Stoic philosophy. The doctrines of Epictetus are thus, suggests Quevedo, simply formal ethical principles extrapolated from the actions of Job. Yet despite this bold, if untenable, vindication of Stoicism, Quevedo remains wary of calling himself a Stoic. Thus he concludes the essay by saying “I would not myself boast of being a Stoic, but I hold them in high esteem”.
Although it would probably be incorrect to call the famous French essayist Michel de Montaigne a ‘Neostoic’, nevertheless a Neostoic tendency can certainly be discerned in his work. He certainly admired Justus Lipsius, describing him as one of the most learned men then alive (Essais 2.12). His general admiration of Seneca can be seen in Essai 2.10, ‘On Books’, and is repeated in Essai 2.32, ‘In Defence of Seneca and Plutarch’. In Essai 1.33 he draws attention to a parallel between Seneca and early Christians with regard to their attitudes towards death, while Essai 1.14 is devoted to an explication of a saying by Epictetus (that men are upset not by things, but by their judgements about things). However, Montaigne’s mature view doubted the rational abilities of man and certainly would not have endorsed the ambitious Stoic ideal of the superhuman sage (sophos). Nevertheless he remained drawn to it, writing that, “if a man cannot attain to that noble Stoic impassibility, let him hide in the lap of this peasant insensitivity of mine. What Stoics did from virtue I teach myself to do from temperament” (Essais 3.10). Montaigne’s engagement with Stoicism thus forms an important part of the revival in interest in Stoic philosophy surrounding Neostoicism.
Neostoicism was an important intellectual movement at the end of the sixteenth and beginning of the seventeenth centuries. Yet it is little known to many historians of philosophy. The themes with which it dealt can be seen to form the background to a number of themes in seventeenth century philosophy, especially the accounts of the passions in Descartes and Spinoza.
Moreover, the term ‘Neostoicism’ is useful to refer to Christian authors inspired by Stoic ethical ideas, for ‘Christian Stoicism’ is, strictly speaking, a contradiction in terms. Although Stoicism may be characterized as a pantheist philosophy, it is also a materialist and determinist philosophy. The orthodox Christian can never, at the same time, be a Stoic. However he can admire certain parts of Stoic ethics and the Neostoic movement indicates that in the late Renaissance many indeed did.
The principal text for Neostoicism is Justus Lipsius’s De Constantia. It was translated into English a number of times in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries and one of these was reprinted in 1939:
References to other works by Lipsius and studies concerned directly with him can be found at the end of the IEP article Justus Lipsius.
Email: john.sellars (at) wolfson.ox.ac.uk
University of the West of England
Last updated: January 8, 2010 | Originally published: