Nihilism is the belief that all values are baseless and that nothing can be known or communicated. It is often associated with extreme pessimism and a radical skepticism that condemns existence. A true nihilist would believe in nothing, have no loyalties, and no purpose other than, perhaps, an impulse to destroy. While few philosophers would claim to be nihilists, nihilism is most often associated with Friedrich Nietzsche who argued that its corrosive effects would eventually destroy all moral, religious, and metaphysical convictions and precipitate the greatest crisis in human history. In the 20th century, nihilistic themes–epistemological failure, value destruction, and cosmic purposelessness–have preoccupied artists, social critics, and philosophers. Mid-century, for example, the existentialists helped popularize tenets of nihilism in their attempts to blunt its destructive potential. By the end of the century, existential despair as a response to nihilism gave way to an attitude of indifference, often associated with antifoundationalism.
“Nihilism” comes from the Latin nihil, or nothing, which means not anything, that which does not exist. It appears in the verb “annihilate,” meaning to bring to nothing, to destroy completely. Early in the nineteenth century, Friedrich Jacobi used the word to negatively characterize transcendental idealism. It only became popularized, however, after its appearance in Ivan Turgenev’s novel Fathers and Sons (1862) where he used “nihilism” to describe the crude scientism espoused by his character Bazarov who preaches a creed of total negation.
In Russia, nihilism became identified with a loosely organized revolutionary movement (C.1860-1917) that rejected the authority of the state, church, and family. In his early writing, anarchist leader Mikhael Bakunin (1814-1876) composed the notorious entreaty still identified with nihilism: “Let us put our trust in the eternal spirit which destroys and annihilates only because it is the unsearchable and eternally creative source of all life–the passion for destruction is also a creative passion!” (Reaction in Germany, 1842). The movement advocated a social arrangement based on rationalism and materialism as the sole source of knowledge and individual freedom as the highest goal. By rejecting man’s spiritual essence in favor of a solely materialistic one, nihilists denounced God and religious authority as antithetical to freedom. The movement eventually deteriorated into an ethos of subversion, destruction, and anarchy, and by the late 1870s, a nihilist was anyone associated with clandestine political groups advocating terrorism and assassination.
The earliest philosophical positions associated with what could be characterized as a nihilistic outlook are those of the Skeptics. Because they denied the possibility of certainty, Skeptics could denounce traditional truths as unjustifiable opinions. When Demosthenes (c.371-322 BC), for example, observes that “What he wished to believe, that is what each man believes” (Olynthiac), he posits the relational nature of knowledge. Extreme skepticism, then, is linked to epistemological nihilism which denies the possibility of knowledge and truth; this form of nihilism is currently identified with postmodern antifoundationalism. Nihilism, in fact, can be understood in several different ways. Political Nihilism, as noted, is associated with the belief that the destruction of all existing political, social, and religious order is a prerequisite for any future improvement. Ethical nihilism or moral nihilism rejects the possibility of absolute moral or ethical values. Instead, good and evil are nebulous, and values addressing such are the product of nothing more than social and emotive pressures. Existential nihilism is the notion that life has no intrinsic meaning or value, and it is, no doubt, the most commonly used and understood sense of the word today.
Max Stirner’s (1806-1856) attacks on systematic philosophy, his denial of absolutes, and his rejection of abstract concepts of any kind often places him among the first philosophical nihilists. For Stirner, achieving individual freedom is the only law; and the state, which necessarily imperils freedom, must be destroyed. Even beyond the oppression of the state, though, are the constraints imposed by others because their very existence is an obstacle compromising individual freedom. Thus Stirner argues that existence is an endless “war of each against all” (The Ego and its Own, trans. 1907).
Among philosophers, Friedrich Nietzsche is most often associated with nihilism. For Nietzsche, there is no objective order or structure in the world except what we give it. Penetrating the façades buttressing convictions, the nihilist discovers that all values are baseless and that reason is impotent. “Every belief, every considering something-true,” Nietzsche writes, “is necessarily false because there is simply no true world” (Will to Power [notes from 1883-1888]). For him, nihilism requires a radical repudiation of all imposed values and meaning: “Nihilism is . . . not only the belief that everything deserves to perish; but one actually puts one’s shoulder to the plough; one destroys” (Will to Power).
The caustic strength of nihilism is absolute, Nietzsche argues, and under its withering scrutiny “the highest values devalue themselves. The aim is lacking, and ‘Why’ finds no answer” (Will to Power). Inevitably, nihilism will expose all cherished beliefs and sacrosanct truths as symptoms of a defective Western mythos. This collapse of meaning, relevance, and purpose will be the most destructive force in history, constituting a total assault on reality and nothing less than the greatest crisis of humanity:
What I relate is the history of the next two centuries. I describe what is coming, what can no longer come differently: the advent of nihilism. . . . For some time now our whole European culture has been moving as toward a catastrophe, with a tortured tension that is growing from decade to decade: restlessly, violently, headlong, like a river that wants to reach the end. . . . (Will to Power)
Since Nietzsche’s compelling critique, nihilistic themes–epistemological failure, value destruction, and cosmic purposelessness–have preoccupied artists, social critics, and philosophers. Convinced that Nietzsche’s analysis was accurate, for example, Oswald Spengler in The Decline of the West (1926) studied several cultures to confirm that patterns of nihilism were indeed a conspicuous feature of collapsing civilizations. In each of the failed cultures he examines, Spengler noticed that centuries-old religious, artistic, and political traditions were weakened and finally toppled by the insidious workings of several distinct nihilistic postures: the Faustian nihilist “shatters the ideals”; the Apollinian nihilist “watches them crumble before his eyes”; and the Indian nihilist “withdraws from their presence into himself.” Withdrawal, for instance, often identified with the negation of reality and resignation advocated by Eastern religions, is in the West associated with various versions of epicureanism and stoicism. In his study, Spengler concludes that Western civilization is already in the advanced stages of decay with all three forms of nihilism working to undermine epistemological authority and ontological grounding.
In 1927, Martin Heidegger, to cite another example, observed that nihilism in various and hidden forms was already “the normal state of man” (The Question of Being). Other philosophers’ predictions about nihilism’s impact have been dire. Outlining the symptoms of nihilism in the 20th century, Helmut Thielicke wrote that “Nihilism literally has only one truth to declare, namely, that ultimately Nothingness prevails and the world is meaningless” (Nihilism: Its Origin and Nature, with a Christian Answer, 1969). From the nihilist’s perspective, one can conclude that life is completely amoral, a conclusion, Thielicke believes, that motivates such monstrosities as the Nazi reign of terror. Gloomy predictions of nihilism’s impact are also charted in Eugene Rose’s Nihilism: The Root of the Revolution of the Modern Age (1994). If nihilism proves victorious–and it’s well on its way, he argues–our world will become “a cold, inhuman world” where “nothingness, incoherence, and absurdity” will triumph.
While nihilism is often discussed in terms of extreme skepticism and relativism, for most of the 20th century it has been associated with the belief that life is meaningless. Existential nihilism begins with the notion that the world is without meaning or purpose. Given this circumstance, existence itself–all action, suffering, and feeling–is ultimately senseless and empty.
In The Dark Side: Thoughts on the Futility of Life (1994), Alan Pratt demonstrates that existential nihilism, in one form or another, has been a part of the Western intellectual tradition from the beginning. The Skeptic Empedocles’ observation that “the life of mortals is so mean a thing as to be virtually un-life,” for instance, embodies the same kind of extreme pessimism associated with existential nihilism. In antiquity, such profound pessimism may have reached its apex with Hegesis. Because miseries vastly outnumber pleasures, happiness is impossible, the philosopher argues, and subsequently advocates suicide. Centuries later during the Renaissance, William Shakespeare eloquently summarized the existential nihilist’s perspective when, in this famous passage near the end of Macbeth, he has Macbeth pour out his disgust for life:
Out, out, brief candle!
Life’s but a walking shadow, a poor player
That struts and frets his hour upon the stage
And then is heard no more; it is a tale
Told by an idiot, full of sound and fury,
In the twentieth century, it’s the atheistic existentialist movement, popularized in France in the 1940s and 50s, that is responsible for the currency of existential nihilism in the popular consciousness. Jean-Paul Sartre’s (1905-1980) defining preposition for the movement, “existence precedes essence,” rules out any ground or foundation for establishing an essential self or a human nature. When we abandon illusions, life is revealed as nothing; and for the existentialists, nothingness is the source of not only absolute freedom but also existential horror and emotional anguish. Nothingness reveals each individual as an isolated being “thrown” into an alien and unresponsive universe, barred forever from knowing why yet required to invent meaning. It’s a situation that’s nothing short of absurd. Writing from the enlightened perspective of the absurd, Albert Camus (1913-1960) observed that Sisyphus’ plight, condemned to eternal, useless struggle, was a superb metaphor for human existence (The Myth of Sisyphus, 1942).
The common thread in the literature of the existentialists is coping with the emotional anguish arising from our confrontation with nothingness, and they expended great energy responding to the question of whether surviving it was possible. Their answer was a qualified “Yes,” advocating a formula of passionate commitment and impassive stoicism. In retrospect, it was an anecdote tinged with desperation because in an absurd world there are absolutely no guidelines, and any course of action is problematic. Passionate commitment, be it to conquest, creation, or whatever, is itself meaningless. Enter nihilism.
Camus, like the other existentialists, was convinced that nihilism was the most vexing problem of the twentieth century. Although he argues passionately that individuals could endure its corrosive effects, his most famous works betray the extraordinary difficulty he faced building a convincing case. In The Stranger (1942), for example, Meursault has rejected the existential suppositions on which the uninitiated and weak rely. Just moments before his execution for a gratuitous murder, he discovers that life alone is reason enough for living, a raison d’être, however, that in context seems scarcely convincing. In Caligula (1944), the mad emperor tries to escape the human predicament by dehumanizing himself with acts of senseless violence, fails, and surreptitiously arranges his own assassination. The Plague (1947) shows the futility of doing one’s best in an absurd world. And in his last novel, the short and sardonic, The Fall (1956), Camus posits that everyone has bloody hands because we are all responsible for making a sorry state worse by our inane action and inaction alike. In these works and other works by the existentialists, one is often left with the impression that living authentically with the meaninglessness of life is impossible.
Camus was fully aware of the pitfalls of defining existence without meaning, and in his philosophical essay The Rebel (1951) he faces the problem of nihilism head-on. In it, he describes at length how metaphysical collapse often ends in total negation and the victory of nihilism, characterized by profound hatred, pathological destruction, and incalculable violence and death.
By the late 20th century, “nihilism” had assumed two different castes. In one form, “nihilist” is used to characterize the postmodern person, a dehumanized conformist, alienated, indifferent, and baffled, directing psychological energy into hedonistic narcissism or into a deep ressentiment that often explodes in violence. This perspective is derived from the existentialists’ reflections on nihilism stripped of any hopeful expectations, leaving only the experience of sickness, decay, and disintegration.
In his study of meaninglessness, Donald Crosby writes that the source of modern nihilism paradoxically stems from a commitment to honest intellectual openness. “Once set in motion, the process of questioning could come to but one end, the erosion of conviction and certitude and collapse into despair” (The Specter of the Absurd, 1988). When sincere inquiry is extended to moral convictions and social consensus, it can prove deadly, Crosby continues, promoting forces that ultimately destroy civilizations. Michael Novak’s recently revised The Experience of Nothingness (1968, 1998) tells a similar story. Both studies are responses to the existentialists’ gloomy findings from earlier in the century. And both optimistically discuss ways out of the abyss by focusing of the positive implications nothingness reveals, such as liberty, freedom, and creative possibilities. Novak, for example, describes how since WWII we have been working to “climb out of nihilism” on the way to building a new civilization.
In contrast to the efforts to overcome nihilism noted above is the uniquely postmodern response associated with the current antifoundationalists. The philosophical, ethical, and intellectual crisis of nihilism that has tormented modern philosophers for over a century has given way to mild annoyance or, more interestingly, an upbeat acceptance of meaninglessness.
French philosopher Jean-Francois Lyotard characterizes postmodernism as an “incredulity toward metanarratives,” those all-embracing foundations that we have relied on to make sense of the world. This extreme skepticism has undermined intellectual and moral hierarchies and made “truth” claims, transcendental or transcultural, problematic. Postmodern antifoundationalists, paradoxically grounded in relativism, dismiss knowledge as relational and “truth” as transitory, genuine only until something more palatable replaces it (reminiscent of William James’ notion of “cash value”). The critic Jacques Derrida, for example, asserts that one can never be sure that what one knows corresponds with what is. Since human beings participate in only an infinitesimal part of the whole, they are unable to grasp anything with certainty, and absolutes are merely “fictional forms.”
American antifoundationalist Richard Rorty makes a similar point: “Nothing grounds our practices, nothing legitimizes them, nothing shows them to be in touch with the way things are” (“From Logic to Language to Play,” 1986). This epistemological cul-de-sac, Rorty concludes, leads inevitably to nihilism. “Faced with the nonhuman, the nonlinguistic, we no longer have the ability to overcome contingency and pain by appropriation and transformation, but only the ability to recognize contingency and pain” (Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity, 1989). In contrast to Nietzsche’s fears and the angst of the existentialists, nihilism becomes for the antifoundationalists just another aspect of our contemporary milieu, one best endured with sang-froid.
In The Banalization of Nihilism (1992) Karen Carr discusses the antifoundationalist response to nihilism. Although it still inflames a paralyzing relativism and subverts critical tools, “cheerful nihilism” carries the day, she notes, distinguished by an easy-going acceptance of meaninglessness. Such a development, Carr concludes, is alarming. If we accept that all perspectives are equally non-binding, then intellectual or moral arrogance will determine which perspective has precedence. Worse still, the banalization of nihilism creates an environment where ideas can be imposed forcibly with little resistance, raw power alone determining intellectual and moral hierarchies. It’s a conclusion that dovetails nicely with Nietzsche’s, who pointed out that all interpretations of the world are simply manifestations of will-to-power.
It has been over a century now since Nietzsche explored nihilism and its implications for civilization. As he predicted, nihilism’s impact on the culture and values of the 20th century has been pervasive, its apocalyptic tenor spawning a mood of gloom and a good deal of anxiety, anger, and terror. Interestingly, Nietzsche himself, a radical skeptic preoccupied with language, knowledge, and truth, anticipated many of the themes of postmodernity. It’s helpful to note, then, that he believed we could–at a terrible price–eventually work through nihilism. If we survived the process of destroying all interpretations of the world, we could then perhaps discover the correct course for humankind:
I praise, I do not reproach, [nihilism's] arrival. I believe it is one of the greatest crises, a moment of the deepest self-reflection of humanity. Whether man recovers from it, whether he becomes master of this crisis, is a question of his strength. It is possible. . . . (Complete Works Vol. 13)
U. S. A.
Last updated: May 3, 2005 | Originally published: