Novalis (Georg Philipp Friedrich von Hardenberg) (1772-1801)

"Novalis" was the pseudonym of Georg Philipp Friedrich Freiherr von Hardenberg, an early German Romantic philosopher, poet, and novelist. Born into a Pietistic family of minor, slightly cash-strapped, Saxon nobility in 1772, he died of tuberculosis in 1801 at the age of 28. Novalis is sometimes seen as the paradigmatic figure of German Romanticism: His early death, the illness and death of his young fiancée Sophie a few years earlier—which inspired one of his most famous works, Hymns to the Night—and the sometimes mystical style of his writing have contributed to his reputation as an otherworldly, even morbid poet. However, Novalis was also a trained philosopher working within the post-Kantian Idealist tradition, with a concern for the problems that occupied this tradition: the possibility of freedom and the nature of the human vocation, the basis of knowledge, the relationship between nature and science, the significance of religion, and the best way to promote a thriving and ethical community.

Novalis was a central figure in the Jena circle of early German Romantics, which was influenced by the work of Fichte, Herder, Goethe, and the Christian mystic Jakob Boehme, and which included Friedrich and August Wilhelm Schlegel, Ludwig Tieck, Caroline Schlegel, Dorothea Veit-Schlegel, and others. During his short life, Novalis wrote philosophical fragments (some of which were published in the Schlegel brothers’ journal Athenaeum), as well as poetry, novels (The Novices of Saïs and Henry of Ofterdingen), philosophical essays (including “Christendom or Europe” and “Faith and Love or The King and Queen”), and notes and short essays on science, medicine, religion, history, language, art, and nature, including many intended for an encyclopedia, which are available in translation as Notes for a Romantic Encyclopaedia. Most of these works were only published after Novalis’s death, with the collection of his writings by Ludwig Tieck and Friedrich Schlegel.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Cosmology
  3. Novalis’s Account of History
  4. Subjectivity and the Vocation of Humankind
  5. Romanticization and Poetry
  6. The Artist as Genius
  7. Language and the Fragment
  8. The Mediator
  9. Relation to Christianity
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Novalis in German
    2. Works by Novalis in English Translation
    3. Works About Novalis and Early German Romanticism in English

1. Life and Works

Georg Philipp Friedrich Freiherr von Hardenberg, better known by his pen name Novalis, was born on May 2nd, 1772, at his family’s home at Schloss Oberwiederstedt in the Harz Mountains, about 80 kilometers from Leipzig. Friedrich was the oldest son of eleven children born to Heinrich Ulrich Erasmus Freiherr von Hardenberg (1738-1814) and Auguste Bernhardine von Hardenberg (née von Bölzig; 1749-1818). Hardenberg’s family belonged to the Saxon nobility, although of a relatively low rank, and financial worries feature in many of Hardenberg’s letters as a young man. Financial concerns also motivated the family to move from Schloss Oberwiederstedt to a smaller home in Weißenfels in 1784. Hardenberg’s father was a follower of the pietistic Herrnhuter (Moravian) church founded by Zinzendorf, and attempted to raise his family in strict adherence to his pietistic beliefs. This upbringing had a lasting effect on Hardenberg’s thought.

From 1783 to 1784, Hardenberg lived with his wealthy, aristocratic uncle, Friedrich Wilhelm Freiherr von Hardenberg, who exposed the young Hardenberg to his extensive library and interest in Enlightenment thought. Hardenberg subsequently moved with his family to their home in Weißenfels, situated between Leipzig and Jena, and until 1790 studied at the gymnasium in Eisleben, where the curriculum emphasized literature and rhetoric.

In 1790, Hardenberg began his studies in jurisprudence in Jena before moving to Leipzig and then Wittenberg. Despite beginning his time at university by devoting most of his attention to having fun and flirting with women, when he completed his studies in 1794 he obtained the highest possible grade. During this time, Hardenberg met and studied with or befriended many notable figures who were to have a profound influence on his thought, including Fichte, Schiller, Reinhold, Jean Paul, Schelling, and August and Friedrich Schlegel. Friedrich Schlegel, whom he met in Leipzig, became a particularly close friend and interlocutor, and was a central figure of the Jena circle of early German Romantics. Also during this time, in 1791, Hardenberg published his first piece, a poem dedicated to his friend and mentor Schiller, titled “Klagen eines Jünglings” (“A Youth’s Lament”), in Der Neue Teutsche Merkur.

In 1794, Hardenberg took a job as an assistant to the district official in Tennstedt, Coelestin Augustin Just, who became his friend and, after his death, his biographer. It was while working for Just that Hardenberg travelled to Grüningen, where he met the twelve-year-old Sophie von Kühn at the home of her parents. According to his own account, Hardenberg was immediately captivated by Sophie, and they became engaged the following spring, when Sophie was just thirteen. However, in 1795 Sophie became ill with consumption, from which, after several painful surgeries, she died in 1797 at the age of 15. Sophie’s death came just a few weeks before that of Hardenberg’s closest brother Erasmus, and Hardenberg’s diary entries following their deaths reveal a deep depression from which he gradually emerged over the following months. During this time, he had a vision on Sophie’s grave that he recorded in his diary; with only minor modifications this became the first hymn of his famous Hymns to the Night, which were published in 1800.

From 1795, Hardenberg was employed as a salt-mine inspector for his father. Hardenberg took this apparently mundane role very seriously, and some of his writings, including the novel Henry of Ofterdingen, give rocks and mines an important place as analogies for various aspects of the universe and the self. In 1795 and 1796 Hardenberg studied Fichte intensively, and his notes from this time are published as his Fichte Studies.

In 1797, Hardenberg entered the Mining Academy of Freiberg. He also immersed himself in the study of biology, history, medicine, and the philosophy of Schelling, Kant, Spinoza, Hemsterhuis, and others. In 1798, he published one of his influential pieces, a set of fragments called “Blüthenstaub,” or “Pollen,” in the Schlegel brothers’ journal Athenaeum. The fragments were worked on to some extent by Friedrich Schlegel, reflecting the early Romantic idea of “symphilosophy,” or performing philosophy together. In the same year, Hardenberg published “Faith and Love or the King and Queen” in Yearbooks of the Prussian Monarchy. In this piece, he praises the new King and Queen of Prussia, Friedrich Wilhelm III and Luise, while using them as metaphors to outline his ideas on the ideal state. The essay was not well understood or received at the time, with the monarchs as well as Friedrich Schlegel expressing strong disapprobation. Hardenberg’s pen name “Novalis” first appears as the author of these texts. The name means “new land” and recalls the name “de Novali,” which was used by some of Hardenberg’s ancestors. Hardenberg’s notes for an encyclopedia project, available in German as Das Allgemeine Brouillon and in English translation as Notes for a Romantic Encyclopedia, also date from this period.

In 1798, Hardenberg met Julie von Charpentier, the daughter of a minerology professor at Freiberg. They became engaged the following year. However, like his engagement to Sophie, Hardenberg’s betrothal to Julie was never fulfilled, as he fell ill later that year with the tuberculosis that was to kill him in 1801. The last years of Hardenberg’s life were extremely busy: He worked again as a salt-mine inspector and was promoted to director, and was also appointed a magistrate of Thuringia. In 1799 he met Ludwig Tieck, who immediately became a close friend, with whom he absorbed himself in the study of Jakob Boehme. During this time, Hardenberg wrote his essay “Christendom or Europe” as well as the short novel The Novices of Saïs, the poems collected as Geistliche Lieder (Spiritual Songs), and The Hymns to the Night, which were published in 1800, and worked on Henry of Ofterdingen, a bildungsroman that Hardenberg never completed. In late 1799 the Jena circle of early German Romantics, including Hardenberg, Tieck, the Schlegel brothers and their spouses Dorothea Veit-Schlegel and Caroline Schlegel, and others, met regularly.

Throughout the last part of 1800 and the early months of 1801, Hardenberg’s health worsened, and on March 25th, 1801, he died at Weißenfels. Friedrich Schlegel was by his bedside while his brother Karl played piano for him, and his death was described as very peaceful.

After Hardenberg’s death, Ludwig Tieck and Friedrich Schlegel edited and published the first edition of his collected works, which appeared in two volumes in 1802 (a third volume was added in 1846). Tieck and Schlegel promulgated the myth of Novalis as the otherworldly arch-Romantic, which was unfortunately taken up uncritically by commentators and has shaped his reputation, and that of Romanticism, ever since. Hegel, in particular, contributed to a popular conception of Romanticism in general and Novalis in particular as morbid, overly emotional, and pathologically introspective. This conception does not do justice to Novalis’s rigorous and sophisticated engagement with the philosophical, political, scientific, religious, and literary thought of his time.

2. Cosmology

Novalis’s cosmology is pantheistic; that is, it explains the world as a manifestation of the divine. Novalis presents the universe, including human beings, as the self-development of an originally infinite, undifferentiated, unconscious unity into finite individual entities, for the purpose of self-knowledge, or self-consciousness. While the starting point for this idea was the philosophy of Fichte, Novalis was concerned that Fichte’s emphasis on the development of the subject, or “I,” through positing the object—that is, the real, physical world, or the “not-I” —stripped the physical world of freedom and selfhood: Novalis wonders whether Fichte had “stuffed too much into the I.” Novalis, by contrast, views the world outside the subject as an active interlocutor—as, effectively, another subject. The difference is often summed up by saying that Novalis turned Fichte’s “not-I” into a “you.” Underlying this attribution of selfhood to the world at large is Novalis’s claim that the universe is divine: It is the comprehensible realization of an infinite God, unfolding in space and time.

For both Novalis and Fichte, the self-differentiation of an original absolute into individual beings allows it to perceive and reflect on itself, by creating the subject-object distinction that, like Fichte, Novalis asserts is essential for cognition, and even consciousness. On this model, the reflection on each other of finite elements within the universe is also the self-knowledge of the universe. However, the nature of the universe as originally infinite, whole, and undifferentiated can never be perfectly known. This is because all knowledge and consciousness depends on the subject-object distinction, and so is necessarily mediated by the particular finite entities that make up the world: Thus, Novalis claims, “We seek the unconditioned everywhere, and find only things” (“Pollen,” Schriften II, p.412 #1). Perfect knowledge of the universe is, therefore, a regulative ideal.

While Novalis acknowledges the reality of the world of everyday experience comprised of particular entities, he claims that underneath these divisions the universe is whole, unified, and divine. Thus, Novalis situates human beings in two realities that, he maintains, are in fact two aspects of one and the same world: the everyday universe of individuated entities (including individual human beings), and a spiritual universe of undifferentiated unity. Novalis’s analysis of this model is sophisticated, identifying the limitations of understanding the world based on particular, finite, material things while recognizing its reality, necessity, and value within experience. He acknowledges that the categories and divisions of our everyday perspective on the world have value, expressing gratitude for “scientists” and “scholars” who have measured and calculated the physical world, advancing the self-knowledge of the universe even while they obscure its essential nature as a single spiritual whole; but he also points out some damaging consequences of espousing this worldview, and insists on the importance of moving beyond it. His philosophy and poetry are largely attempts to demonstrate how (and to what extent) we can, first, have epistemological access to the underlying divine unity of the universe; second, articulate this access and communicate it to others; and third, make the relationship between these worlds closer, moving towards a regulative ideal of a perfect correspondence, or unity, in which the material realm manifests its divine inner nature.

As part of this project, Novalis attempts to find ways of overcoming the divisions between individual entities as well as several dichotomies that characterize the way we tend to experience and understand the universe. These include those between subject and object, the divine and the mundane, the rational or spiritual and the emotional or sensuous, the conscious and the unconscious, activity and passivity, and freedom and determinism. Novalis maintains that the segregation of existence into these dualities is a source of unhappiness and alienation. The terms of the dichotomies are usually understood to be mutually exclusive, leading to a fragmentation of both the world at large and, specifically, human identity, and often a rejection and/or devaluation of one or other of the terms. In particular, Novalis is concerned that this dualism often results in devaluation of the physical, emotional, sensuous, unconscious, and mundane aspects of the universe. According to Novalis, this fragmenting and alienating tendency also divides human beings from important parts of themselves, which on this model are construed as external to them—these parts include the natural world, other human beings, and God. In Novalis’s cosmology, while we currently experience these things as existing outside ourselves, at a more fundamental level they and we form a single whole.

For Novalis, the divisions and categories under which we usually perceive our environment obscure the unity of the cosmos and conceal its divine nature by presenting it as purely physical, rather than as a manifestation of spirit. The spiritual seems to be separate from the physical and their relation mysterious. This applies not only to God, but also to aspects of human existence thought to transcend physical processes, such as freedom, thought, and the will—the possibility of these aspects of existence manifesting themselves in a material realm becomes hard to explain. Many of Novalis’s contemporaries, including Kant and Schelling, struggled with this difficulty, and Novalis attempts to resolve this problem by overturning the dualism that lies at its root. Much of Novalis’s writing is concerned with revealing the inherent spirituality and rationality of the frequently devalued material elements of existence, as well as the superficiality of the divisions between human beings, nature, and God.

3. Novalis’s Account of History

Novalis claims that the world that modern human beings inhabit, in which the universe is a system of separate, finite entities and in which human beings are individual subjects, does not reflect the essential nature of the universe. Rather, this state of affairs is a development that began at the start of time, with an initial self-differentiation of an originally unitary cosmos that has become more pronounced through history. According to Novalis, the universe tends to move from an original state of undifferentiated, unconscious unity towards a community of conscious individuals who are aware of their nature as emanations of the divine whole. Novalis’s account of history aims to describe this development, which he presents as taking place through a repeated dialectical process that moves from a state of relatively undifferentiated, unconscious existence, through a state of individuated but fragmented conscious existence, to a state of more unified and harmonious “organic” consciousness, eventually approaching an ideal community of conscious individuals aware of their nature as parts of the same greater whole: “Before abstraction everything is one, but one like chaos; after abstraction everything is unified again, but this unification is a free interconnection of independent, self-determined beings. From a heap, a community has emerged” (“Pollen,” Schriften II p.455 #95). Although human beings epitomize this conscious awareness, Novalis indicates that plants, animals, and other aspects of the natural world also form parts of this ideal community.

Novalis often depicts earlier states of the manifestation of spirit in the world in order to convey this process and, through extrapolation, point both forwards in time to the ideal coming age of communion and backwards to the original position of absolute unity and non-self-awareness that preceded the origination of the world. Novalis has been criticized for creating sentimental idealizations of historical periods, particularly the medieval Europe described in “Christendom or Europe”; however, it is fairer to interpret him as presenting these images not as factual accounts, but as abstracted views of history meant to exemplify the progression from unconscious unity through conscious disunity to conscious unity. He depicts periods in which, prior to the emergence of the modern worldview of the universe as material, atomistic, and causally regulated and of the human being as an individual, conscious subject, human beings, God, and nature existed in closer relation to each other but also with less rational or discursive awareness. The Hymns to the Night describe an ancient time in which human beings lived in communion with nature and saw the spiritual essence of the world in mythical form in all things. “Christendom or Europe” presents a later period in a fictionalized medieval Europe, still before the advent of an Enlightenment worldview, in which education, trade, and communication flourished, but the people still lived in harmony, united under one spiritual goal (Catholicism). Although these examples are from different works, the period described in “Christendom or Europe” can be understood to represent a state of greater development of the self-knowledge of the universe than the pagan age described in the Hymns. While both periods described above seem idyllic because, according to Novalis’s poetic descriptions, the entities that make up the world at these times exist in greater harmony than they do now, the lower intellectual development at these times means they do not manifest consciousness, rationality, and spirit to as high a degree as modernity. However, “Christendom or Europe” suggests that greater differentiation and intellectual development can still be harmonious and unified if these occur within a community working towards a common spiritual goal. Thus, in addition to describing a past stage of the development of the universe, this piece points to the possibility of a future higher synthesis of society into a spiritual community, calling its readers to overcome the relatively fragmented and spiritless situation in which Novalis believes they currently exist.

According to Novalis’s outline of history, the beginning of the Enlightenment marked the emergence of a highly developed cognition of particular entities, but also the loss of the original community that he describes, as well as of the ability to see spiritual significance in physical objects and mundane events: “The gods disappeared with their following—nature stood forlorn and lifeless. Arid count and strict measure bound her with iron chains” (“Hymns to the Night,” in Schriften I, p.145 s.5). The result is the world as it appears to a mentality that emphasizes an intellectual and categorizing approach to experience: a mechanistic, material universe, which permits a detailed understanding of physical processes, but lacks deeper meaning and is unimbued by spirit.

The categorizing and individuating activity of reason is, for Novalis, instrumental in achieving the self-reflective unity that he views as the divine purpose of the universe. Without the fragmentation engendered by division and categorization, spirit would be unable to reflect on itself and would remain in a state of blind self-identity. However, not just greater individuation, but also greater integration with the whole is necessary for knowledge of the universe as essentially unified and divine, rather than just according to its appearance as a set of particular entities and events. Thus, Novalis sees an overemphasis on discursive reason, with its divisive and alienating tendencies, as an antithesis to a preceding state of the world that was less rational and more unified, and as also preparing the ground for a subsequent synthesis into a more complex and self-conscious harmonious whole. At each level, the universe’s consciousness of its essential nature is, at least ideally, enhanced.

4. Subjectivity and the Vocation of Humankind

Novalis is a pantheist, maintaining that what we perceive as particular entities, including individual human beings, are not, in fact, most essentially distinct objects related externally and physically to one another, but are more fundamentally parts of a divine whole, connected internally through their shared spiritual nature. The individual human being is, therefore, a manifestation of God, who is present in all particular entities: “Only pantheistically does God appear wholly—and only in pantheism is God wholly everywhere, in every individual. Thus for the great I the ordinary I and the ordinary you are only supplements” (“Allgemeine Brouillon,” Schriften III, p.314 #398). This means that, on Novalis’s model, parts of the world that seem external to the individual subject—other human beings, animals, plants, objects, and even God—are in fact essential parts of the self, that is, of the “great I.” Overidentification with ourselves as individuals, in particular with ourselves as conscious, active individuals, makes us experience ourselves as fragmented in this way, set over and against a “you” that is, more fundamentally, another part of ourselves. For Novalis, the vocation of humankind is to realize our true nature as part of the divine whole, simultaneously developing closer connections with that “you” and fostering the self-understanding of the universe as a divine absolute: “We are not at all I—but we can and shall become I. We are seeds for becoming I. We shall all transform into a you—into a second I—only thereby do we raise ourselves to the Great I—which is one and all together” (“Allgemeine Brouillon,” Schriften III, p.314 #398).

Novalis’s model of the self reflects the post-Kantian Idealist separation of the everyday, empirical or individual I from the absolute I, often identified with God and sometimes described as “the Absolute” or “spirit,” terms whose relation to each other was at issue for Fichte and Schelling, among others. Novalis’s response to this problem is to claim that, with regard not just to the individual but also to the universe as a whole, we have access to both kinds of existence, although imperfectly, and can combine them, although never completely. The task of doing so is, on Novalis’s account, the human vocation. Taking up this task not only allows human beings to integrate into their selves aspects of their greater self (or God) from which they are currently alienated, but also facilitates the original purpose of the world as the gradual development from an absolute, undifferentiated, blind unity, to a community of individuated entities conscious of their true spiritual nature.

Because the universe, as divine, is both one and infinite, Novalis maintains that the task of uniting oneself with one’s greater self can never be completed while one exists as a finite, conscious individual, and the aim is therefore to draw increasingly close to this union without ever fully attaining it. The approach is characterized by spirit’s increasingly adequate self-expression and self-knowledge in and through the physical world, in particular through human beings and their understanding of and actions in the world. Novalis thus situates the human being within the world as both a part of it and at a special place where it becomes self-aware, and where its essential freedom, rationality, and spirituality are epitomized.

The development of the self-awareness of the universe through the activities of human beings occurs through a process in which the individual both comes to understand that the world is a reflection of him- or herself, indeed at a deeper level part of him- or herself, and shapes the world so as to more closely reflect the spiritual nature that lies within both world and self. Because of their shared spiritual nature, the self and the apparently external world are, on Novalis’s account, analogues of each other. The mind reflects the world in the form of representations, and the world correspondingly manifests the mind in a physical medium, in what Novalis calls “figures” or “hieroglyphs” or “ciphers” —the shapes of objects and events, which form a secret language that we can learn to read. The better we can read this language, the more closely our representations—that is, our minds—reflect the world, and the more we work to interpret the world in this way, the more we invest it with spirit. Thus, Novalis claims, “We are on a mission: our vocation is the cultivation of the earth” (“Pollen,” Schriften II p.427 #32). Novalis maintains that this double process of interpretation begins to mend the fragmentation between minds and bodies and between the spiritual and the physical, allowing a closer mirroring of these at first apparently incommensurate elements, in the process spiritualizing the physical.

It should be noted that the mediation of the spiritual to the world is for Novalis only possible because the world is fundamentally already divine. Thus, human beings do not accomplish a union of two originally or inherently different realms, but the realization of a pre-existing spiritual inner essence of the world. By revealing this spiritual nature, human beings take up their vocation, and the world becomes readable as a symbol and manifestation of the divine.

5. Romanticization and Poetry

Novalis claims that the “cultivation of the earth” that he describes as the vocation of humankind is to be achieved through a form of “poetic” or “Romantic” creativity. The activity of interpreting the world as embodying the divine partially overcomes the separations between the physical and the spiritual and between the self, as subject, and the rest of the world, as object. Novalis refers to this spiritualization of the world as “raising,” “raising to a higher power,” or “romanticizing”: “Insofar as I give the common a high sense, the usual a secret aspect, the known the worth of the unknown, the finite an infinite appearance, I romanticize it” (“Logological Fragments [II],” Schriften II, p.545 #105). The shaping of the physical world to reflect the spiritualized vision of it created by the poet, artist, or genius is the crux of Novalis’s concept of “magical idealism.”

According to Novalis, there are two ways of interpreting and relating to the world: one that perpetuates and even exacerbates the fragmentation of self, nature, and spirit that modern human beings experience in their everyday lives, and one that undermines this fragmentation. The first reflects the excessive rationality epitomized by science, and sees the representations formed by a categorizing and divisive form of discursive thought as more or less accurate reflections of an external world. The second is a “Romantic” attitude epitomized by poetry (although also potentially present in conversation, translation, art, art criticism, and many other practices), which recognizes that one’s representations of the objects of one’s knowledge are based on intuitive connections with these objects, and acknowledges the contingency, subjectivity, and partiality of any attempt to articulate these intuitions or conceptualize the universe. This approach therefore employs emotions and intuitions to inform attempts to understand the world, and those who adopt it are motivated to continually improve on these attempts, thereby fulfilling the human vocation of developing the increasing self-knowledge of the universe.

Although Novalis, like other Romantics, often seems to stress the intuitive aspect of this process, Romantic interpretation is not supposed to be of a raw emotional or intuitive nature, but is rather articulate and rational, being informed, shaped, and mediated by consciousness. Novalis views as relatively undeveloped the “raw, discursive thinker” who interprets the world as atomistic and mechanistic and the “raw, intuitive poet,” whose interpretations have no fixed form (“Logological Fragments [I],” Schriften II pp.524–55 #13); these tendencies are united in the Romantic poet, novelist, philosopher, or artist, who can switch back and forth between these modes and give form to her or his visions of the living, dynamic world of nature. The means by which Romanticization is achieved, therefore, is the synthesis of reason and emotion (or science and imagination, or philosophy and poetry). This synthesis is reflected in the literary and allegorical forms in which Novalis (and other early German Romantics) chose to write as well as in the content of his writings.

Novalis maintains that the world is in principle epistemologically accessible, although a complete understanding of the universe as a divine whole and of oneself as a part of that whole is a regulative ideal. Insofar as individuals encounter their own nature and the rest of the world through mental representations, they experience these things as individual and particular, and the essential nature of the universe as a divine unity eludes them. However, one can partially overcome these separations and glimpse the nature of reality through intuition, imagination, and creative interpretation. It is only when one’s unconscious physical and affective nature participates in constructing interpretations of one’s environment that one can really understand that environment. Thus, for Novalis, an interpretation of the world that raises it towards the divine begins by circumventing narrowly rational categories for acquiring knowledge and allowing one’s intuitions to reveal the way things are.

It is not enough, however, merely to have these intuitions; they must be articulated, that is, as best as possible reproduced in the medium of discursive thought, in order to bring them to consciousness. For Novalis, Romantic creativity does not entail abandoning conscious representation, but rather integrating it with intuitions. A poetic representation is not simply an intellectual model of reality, aiming to adequately describe particular events and objects; nor is it raw intuition of the spiritual wholeness of the universe. Rather, emotions and intuitions let the poet read the world as divine and use language in an imaginative and symbolic way to represent this divine nature. Thus, Romantic interpretation reveals the spiritual unity that underlies all seemingly particular things.

On Novalis’s account, by revealing the spiritual nature of the world in this way, Romantic interpretations actually allow us to inhabit a more spiritual world. According to Novalis, the spiritual essence of things is not given in phenomena but is imparted to phenomena through interpretation, as he explains using the example of music: “All tones that nature brings forth are raw—and spiritless—often only to the musical soul does the sound of the forest—the piping of the wind, the song of the nightingale, the plashing of the brook seem melodious and meaningful” (“Anecdotes,” Schriften II, pp.573–74 #226). By creating order and meaning for objects and events, or in other words by perceiving naturally occurring objects and events in a spiritualized, rational form, the poet or artist invests them with spirit, allowing their inner nature and significance to shine forth.

6. The Artist as Genius

Novalis’s theory of the genius reflects how he thinks interpreting physical objects and events as spiritual actually invests these objects and events with spirit, creating a real physical world that manifests the divine. According to Novalis, the activity of the artist or genius is an exemplification and intensification of what human beings always do. Human beings do not exist in a world that is simply given, but rather project a world on the basis of their understanding or interpretation of their experiences. This, Novalis claims, is the essence of genius: “When we speak of the external world, when we portray real objects, then we act like genius. Thus genius is the ability to act towards imaginary objects like real ones, and also to treat them like these” (“Miscellaneous Remarks,” Schriften II, pp.418–20 #22). The way people interpret and understand their experiences is, therefore, the way in which they create the world that they inhabit. The artist has this capacity to a much higher degree than most people: Novalis refers to the artist as “the genius of genius” (p.420 #22). In other words, artistic activity is a raised form of the everyday human way of being.

Although Novalis describes the world-creating activity of the genius as “spontaneous,” he envisions this activity not as a generation ex nihilo or an imposition of an interpretation on an inert world, but as the way the world expresses itself in a more conscious and articulate, and therefore more spiritual, form. The world the genius creates is, due to her or his intuition and greater connections with the rest of the world, a free expression of the spirit, unity, and life of the universe, including of the genius her- or himself as the place where these characteristics are epitomized and come to expression. The actions of the genius are shaped and informed by the world of which she or he is a part, so that the spontaneous expression of the genius’s spirit that occurs in artistic creation is also a response to what is given. Novalis takes as the archetype of this activity the novelist, who “from his given crowd of accidents and situations—makes a well-ordered, lawlike series” (“Anecdotes,” Schriften II, p.580 #242). The freedom and creativity of the author are restricted by the terms given to him or her, while he or she draws objects and events together into a coherent, meaningful whole. This process can be extended to the task of understanding and acting towards the events of one’s experiences generally: Novalis claims, “All the accidents of our lives are materials out of which we can make what we want” (“Pollen,” Schriften II, pp.437–39 #66).

In other words, the genius is engaged in creative dialogue with his or her surroundings. For Novalis, nature is a language, if one that modern human beings have forgotten how to read and respond to. The beings and events that make up the world, including but not restricted to human beings and their activity, are symbols of the divine. While these symbols are now hidden to most people, the genius can both read and respond to this language of nature, like a participant in a conversation, and in doing so bring this world to a higher, more spiritual expression.

7. Language and the Fragment

According to Novalis, language, the mind, the world, and the divine have analogous structures that allow them to reflect each other. Furthermore, some uses of language bring the world and the mind closer together by allowing them to reflect each other more closely. The kinds of language that do this are not those that give the most accurate descriptions of their objects, but those that stimulate listeners to use their imaginations to intuit something about the world that cannot be captured in discursive categories.

Novalis believes that language signifies, not on the basis of semantic rules for connecting terms to objects, but through association, imagination, and creative interpretation. Like the relationship between the human being and its world, and between these and the divine, the connection between linguistic utterances and the things they signify is one of analogy between realms that at a deeper level share a common structure or essence. One of the clearest sources for Novalis’s account of language is his short essay, “Monologue,” in which he states, “If one could only make it comprehensible to people that it is with language like with mathematical formulae—they constitute a world for themselves—they play only with themselves, embody nothing but their wonderful nature, and just for that reason they are so expressive—just for that reason they reflect in themselves the same play of relations as things” (Schriften II, p.672). In other words, language does not denote particular objects and events, but creates a new world that mirrors or has the same structure, and therefore the same meaning, as these objects and events. Ultimately, both the material world and language have as their object the divine which they, like the human being itself, reflect and embody, and can therefore reveal.

For Novalis, the nature of the relationship between sign and signified entails a degree of separation between them, meaning that the objects of language always escape full articulation. The search to conceptualize and convey the divine essence of things can therefore never be finished, and progress in this search depends on openness and readiness for revision. Language can serve this purpose when it is used in forms that prompt the audience to take an active role and rework what has been said. Novalis attempts to embody this practice in “Monologue,” undermining the claims of his essay to provide an accurate description of how language works: “If I thereby think to have indicated the essence and function of poetry in the clearest way, still I know that no one can understand it” (Schriften II, p.672). By pointing to the inadequacy of his speech, taken literally, Novalis invites his audience to reach beyond the words to grasp his meaning, and provide a better representation of it.

As a result, irony and poetic techniques like metaphor, suggestion, and association emerge as the best tools for understanding the world and oneself, revealing these to others, and constructing more spiritual versions of these things through creative dialogue. Novalis’s use of the fragment for many of his writings is supported by this concept: Because fragments are incomplete, their readers must use their imaginations to complete them, and are thereby called to participate in their vocation. Fragments thus function as “seeds” for developing insights into the true nature of the universe: “Fragments of this kind are literary seeds. There may admittedly be some deaf grains among them: however, if only some bear fruit!” (“Pollen,” Schriften II, p.463 #114). Novalis claims that not just language, but everything we encounter can play this role, intimating a spiritual meaning that we are invited to explore and complete: “Everything is seed” (“Logological Fragments [II],” Schriften II, p.563 #189).

The invitation to others to participate in constructing meaning is an important aspect of Novalis’s account of Romantic interpretation. Rather than a finished or complete system of philosophy, Novalis advocates a continuous activity of “philosophizing” (which he also sometimes called “Fichtesizing”) which gradually reveals the spiritual nature of the world. In part, Novalis’s refusal to find a final form for his philosophy is motivated by his rejection of the demands of Fichte and Karl Leonhard Reinhold for a first principle as a foundation for philosophy. Novalis emphasized the importance of the activity of seeking a ground for knowledge and experience over the ground itself. Furthermore, this activity is not, for Novalis, performed in isolation by a single subject, but is carried forward within a community—this is the “symphilosophy” advocated and to an extent embodied by the Jena Romantics. Fichte’s call to his reader in the revised version of his Wissenschaftslehre to “think the I” is thus altered, in Novalis’s work, to become a call not to an individual but to a community to think the I and its world together.

On Novalis’s account, an imaginative and intuitive use of language contributes to the human vocation of creating a raised or Romanticized world. Because it has been worked on by the human mind, especially where the human mind in question is informed by intuitions of the divine nature of the world, the new world established through language is a raised, spiritualized version of the physical world that it reflects. But in addition, this process can be repeated and refined by working on the constructions created by others. Following a first speaker’s utterance, an audience is called to create a yet more spiritualized version of the world by investing the objects and events described with their own thoughts and feelings. By retracing the meaning of the first speaker’s utterance, a second participant combines three elements in a higher synthesis: the objects and events described by the speaker; the speaker’s spirit as imparted to these objects and events in her words; and his or her own spirit in his interpretation of this picture. The same process of joint, mutually reflective creation characterizes the poetic interpretation of nature, which Novalis understands as like a conversation, as well as the creation of art, art criticism, translation, and potentially many other endeavors.

8. The Mediator

Interactions with other human beings and objects and events in nature are important in Novalis’s account for realizing the inner spiritual unity of the world. In addition, particular figures stand out as especially important for this goal, acting as precursors for unification with the rest of existence and indeed as means to establishing this union. Novalis describes these figures as “mediators,” claiming that “Nothing is more essential to true religiosity than a mediator, who unites us with the Godhead. Unmediated, the human being can absolutely not be in relation to the latter” (“Pollen,” Schriften II, pp.443–45 #74). In particular human beings we see the highest manifestation of spirit in the world, and when we engage imaginatively with them as symbolic figures, we can see how the divine is embodied in the world and draw closer to that divinity.

Novalis’s work includes numerous examples of this kind of relationship. For instance, the teacher in The Novices of Saïs initiates the novices into the secrets of the universe, as an exemplar and tutor in the search for the meaning of nature’s language. In Henry of Ofterdingen, Zulima, who shows Henry how to construct a meaningful narrative out of chance events and gives him a musical instrument with which to begin his life as a poet, provides an axial moment in Henry’s development. Later, the sage Klingsohr and his daughter Mathilde initiate Henry into further pieces of wisdom required to become aware of his unity with existence, and Mathilde and Henry, who marry, share a union that Novalis describes as prefiguring the unification of all things. The same prefiguration occurs in the relationship between the narrator and the beloved in Hymns, in which the bond between the narrator and his dead beloved initiates the narrator’s release from the limits of space, time, and individuation.

Novalis maintains that any object can reveal one’s union with the rest of existence and mediate the divine. What is important is not the object through which one perceives the divinity of existence, but one’s relationship or attitude to that object. However, while the whole world can reveal the divine, other human beings do so more easily, because they more clearly manifest the spiritual within the physical than do other objects. Thus, Novalis claims that as human beings become more sophisticated they tend to choose a more limited range of objects to hold religious significance and to select other human beings as those mediating objects: “The more independent the human being becomes, the more the quantity of mediators shrinks, the quality is refined, and his relationships to these become more various and cultured: fetishes, stars, animals, heroes, idols, gods, one God-man” (“Pollen,” Schriften II, p.443 #74). This seems to imply that Christianity, with its God-man Christ, is a more rational, raised form of religion than earlier or other religions or systems of thought. However, Novalis also suggests that as time goes on individual human beings tend to choose a mediator who is of personal importance to them, making Jesus Christ just one potential mediator among many.

9. Relation to Christianity

Novalis was raised in the pietistic tradition, attending a Lutheran school and having a strictly religious father who attempted to raise his children in line with the precepts of the Herrnhuter church. This background influenced the vocabulary, imagery, and some of the content of Novalis’s philosophy, in particular: his claim that the mundane can be spiritualized by attention to the divine; his emphasis on the need to improve one’s community in order to transform the earth; and his rejection of radical sin. Novalis’s work also incorporates modified versions of central ideas of Christianity more generally, particularly the narrative of Fall and salvation as alienation from and reconciliation with the divine, the role of Christ as an exemplary mediator of the divine, the idea that the world embodies the divine and can be interpreted analogically to reveal this spiritual essence, and the idea of union through love after death. Some commentators, notably William Arctander O’Brien, have argued that Novalis’s work stretches Christian doctrine too far to be considered Christian: O’Brien points to Novalis’s pantheism and his rejection of Jesus Christ’s special status as the son of God as fundamental departures from Christian tradition. However, whether we see Novalis’s philosophy as remaining within a Christian paradigm or moving outside it, several of its central themes take their starting point from Christian models.

Novalis assimilates the Christian narrative of Fall and salvation, in which union with God is lost and sought, to the Fichtean account of the self-differentiation of the absolute into finite entities in space and time in order to achieve self-knowledge. Novalis’s model also reflects the ideas of the Christian mystic Jakob Boehme, whom he studied in detail from 1800. Like Novalis, Boehme claimed that the differentiation of God into particular entities in the world is necessary for the development of self-awareness and a higher form of harmonious existence.

Novalis avoids a puritanical interpretation of the Fall as due to the temptations of the flesh, and to an extent follows an opposite stream within Christian thought, in which consciousness, reason, and knowledge on the one hand, and individuation on the other, are responsible for the alienation of the human being from its true self, the rest of existence and God. For Novalis, an original communion with nature and God was lost through the development and enhancement of consciousness and individuality, which require division and separation. However, Novalis also grants individual existence and discursive reason a positive place in his narrative as essential for realizing the imperative of the universe to know itself. Without these, the universe would remain an unconscious, blind unity.

Novalis does not take from Christianity the moral notion that alienation from the divine is a result of sin, claiming that “To true religion nothing is sin” (“Fragments and Studies,” Schriften III, p.589 #228). However, this rejection or reduction in emphasis on radical sin is a characteristic of pietism, which may have influenced Novalis in this respect. Although Novalis exhorts his audience to take steps to overcome the fragmentation of their existence, he describes the consequences of the approach to the divine in utilitarian, rather than moral, terms, providing a vision of the benefits that attend a closer relationship with the divine, including a deeper connection with the rest of existence, a sense of meaning for one’s life, control over one’s destiny, and the elimination of the fear of death as one realizes that one is part of a greater whole, and therefore that one’s selfhood is, more essentially than existence as an individual, the selfhood of the absolute. These benefits are direct consequences of learning to view the universe in a new way. Novalis does not distinguish between the eventual fate of sinners and saved; all human beings and all of nature will return to unity with the divine when they die, and no one is fully integrated with the divine while a living individual, although some individuals may experience greater connections with the divine nature of existence while alive.

Novalis has sometimes been seen as life-denying and morbid, in part based on his writings on death, in which he famously uses erotic imagery of longing for union with dead loved ones and with the unconditioned. It is true that Novalis wrote some of these passages, at least the vision on the grave of the beloved found in the Hymns to the Night, while very depressed. However, Novalis attempts to give death a positive value as promising union with the divine and some form of eternal life. These concepts have resonance within a Christian context, and in particular his use of the imagery of marriage to prefigure union with the divine has pietistic parallels, but in Novalis’s case these concepts are also shaped by his philosophical commitments. For Novalis, individuated existence is an obstacle to realizing the divine unity of the world, and as a result, the unification with the divine that he calls us to work towards realizing can only be completed in death. Thus, he claims, “Life is the beginning of death. Life is for the sake of death” (“Pollen,” in Schriften II, p.417 #14). Novalis’s emphasis on the value of the process rather than the goal of the human vocation means that this should not devalue life, with its characteristic individuation and consciousness; these are required in order for the universe to become self-consciousness. Furthermore, Novalis’s pantheism means that human beings, like all other particular entities, are manifestations of the divine, with the result that death is not annihilation, but the final transformation of the individual person, or the “ordinary I,” into the “great I” of the divine absolute. Thus, Novalis claims that we will awaken after death into a new state, for which we may be prepared by our Romantic vocation.

Novalis’s attitude towards Jesus Christ provides one of the clearest places where his account modifies Christianity. Christ is a relatively important figure for Novalis, mentioned explicitly several times as an ideal mediator of the divine and spiritual to the world, and in the Hymns to the Night his teachings are described as spreading the word of the overcoming of death in mystical union. However, Novalis does not present Christ as different in kind from other human beings or the rest of the world. Although Christ exemplifies the integration of divine and mundane that Novalis claims it is the human vocation to bring about, and although as a result Christ is an ideal mediator of this spiritualized world to others, Novalis maintains that all entities can potentially play this role—what matters in this respect is the individual’s attitude to these entities, rather than who or what they are.

Novalis’s idea that things in the world can be interpreted as having a divine meaning also has parallels in Christianity. Medieval Christian scriptural exegesis could be applied not only to the Bible itself, but also to physical objects and events, in order to discover doctrinal, moral, and metaphysical and eschatological meanings. Novalis’s work reflects an interest in the fourth or “anagogical” form of interpretation, which was supposed to give knowledge of the heavenly or the spiritual and to initiate the interpreter into hidden knowledge of metaphysics and the afterlife. For Novalis, the beings and happenings of the world form “figures” or “hieroglyphs” that signify the divine and allow those who can read them to function as “prophets.”

10. References and Further Reading

a. Works by Novalis in German

  • Schriften. Zweite, nach den Handschriften ergänzte, erweiterte und verbesserte Auflage in vier Bänden, edited by Paul Kluckhohn and Richard Samuel. Stuttgart: Kohlhammer, 1960.
    • The authoritative edition of Novalis’s collected works, including notes, diary entries, and letters.

b. Works by Novalis in English Translation

  • Fichte Studies, edited by Jane Kneller. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
    • Novalis’s critical reception of Fichte. Includes an informative introduction by Kneller.
  • Henry of Ofterdingen, translated by Palmer Hilty. Long Grove, Illinois: Waveland Press, Inc., 1992. This translation first published in 1964.
    • An unfinished bildungsroman in which Henry, with the aid of various mediating figures, develops towards his vocation as a poet.
  • Hymns to the Night, translated by Dick Higgins. Many editions. This translation first published in 1978.
    • A bilingual edition. The Hymns use Christian, mystical, and Romantic imagery to describe longing for union with loved ones after death.
  • Notes for a Romantic Encyclopaedia: Das Allgemeine Brouillon, translated, edited, and with an Introduction by David W. Wood. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2007.
    • Novalis’s writings on science, religion, art, and nature, intended for an encyclopedia.
  • The Novices of Saïs, translated by Ralph Manheim. Brooklyn, NY: Archipelago Books, 2005.
    • Describes the novices’ mystical search for an understanding of nature, under the guidance of their teacher, who leads them to discover the hidden connections between all things.
  • Philosophical Writings, translated and edited by Margaret Mahony Stoljar. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1997.
    • An abridged, introduction to many of Novalis’s most influential pieces, including “Pollen,” “Monologue,” “Christendom or Europe,” and “Faith and Love or The King and Queen.”

c. Works About Novalis and Early German Romanticism in English

  • Behler, Ernst. German Romantic Literary Theory. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993.
    • An influential account of the literary theory of the early German Romantics, situating Novalis’s work in the context of his study of Fichte and the work of close contemporaries such as the Schlegel brothers and Tieck.
  • Haywood, Bruce. Novalis, The Veil of Imagery: A Study of the Poetic Works of Friedrich von Hardenberg, 1772–1801. Gravenhage: Mouton, and Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1959.
    • An introduction to Novalis’s use of imagery.
  • Von Molnár, Géza. Romantic Vision, Ethical Context: Novalis and Artistic Autonomy. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1987.
    • An influential study emphasizing a central theme of Novalis’s work: the vocation of the individual to work towards the realization of the unity of the universe.
  • O’Brien, William Arctander. Signs of Revolution. Durham: Duke University Press, 1995.
    • Investigates Novalis’s work on language and symbols in relation to his contemporary political, ethical, religious, and scientific context.
  • Seyhan, Azade. Representation and its Discontents: The Critical Legacy of German Romanticism. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1992.
    • Presents the work of Romantic writers, including Novalis, as explorations of new ways of thinking in the light of political and scientific change, and as important precursors to modern critical theory.
  • Strand, Mary. I/You: Paradoxical Constructions of Self and Other in Early German Romanticism. New York: Peter Lang, 1998.
    • On the work of Romantics, including Novalis, on otherness, particularly women and the Orient.


Author Information

Anna Ezekiel
McGill University