Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Nyāya

Nyāya (literally “Logic”) is a leading school of philosophy within the “Hindu umbrella”—those communities which saw themselves as the inheritors of the ancient Vedic civilization and allied cultural traditions. Epistemologically, Nyāya develops of a sophisticated precursor to contemporary reliabilism (particularly process reliabilism), centered on the notion of “knowledge-sources” (pramāṇa), and a conception of epistemic responsibility which allows for default, unreflective justification accorded to putatively veridical cognition. It also extensively studies the nature of reasoning in the attempt to map pathways which lead to veridical inferential cognition. Nyāya’s methods of analysis and argument resolution influenced much of classical Indian literary criticism, philosophical debate, and jurisprudence. Metaphysically, Nyāya defends a robust realism, including universals, selves, and substances, largely in debate with Buddhist anti-realists and flux-theorists. Nyāya thinkers were also India’s most sophisticated natural theologians. For at least a millennium, Nyāya honed a variety of arguments in support of a baseline theism in constant engagement with sophisticated philosophical atheists, most notably Buddhists and Mīmāṁsakas (Hindu Ritualists).

Nyāya’s prehistory is tied to ancient traditions of debate and rules of reasoning (vāda-śāstra). The oldest extant Nyāya text is the Nyāya-sūtra attributed to Gautama (c. 200 C.E.). Throughout much of Nyāya’s formative period the philosophical development of the school took place through commentaries on the sūtras (with important exceptions including works of Jayanta, c. 875, Udayana, c. 975, and the somewhat heterodox Bhāsarvajña, c. 875). Leading commentators include Vātsyāyana (c. 450), Uddyotakara (c. 600) Vācaspati Miśra (c. 900) and Udayana. The school would enter its “new” phase (navya-nyāya) in the work of the eminent epistemologist Gaṅgeśa Upādhyāya (c. 1325). This article focuses on the older tradition of Nyāya, beginning with the sūtras, with occasional gestures toward developments within the new school.  Given the breadth of Nyāya thought, this discussion has to exclude some important topics for the sake of economy, such as aesthetics, philosophy of language, and theory of value. The article’s primary focus is on epistemology and metaphysics. There is a brief consideration of Nyāya’s philosophy of religion.

Table of Contents

  1. Epistemology
    1. Perception
      1. The Characteristics of Perception
      2. Extraordinary Perceptual States
      3. Introspection
    2. Inference
      1. The Characteristics of Inference
      2. The Structure of Inference
      3. Inferential Defeaters or Fallacies
      4. Suppositional Reasoning
    3. Analogical Reasoning
    4. Testimony
    5. Non-pramāṇa Epistemic Capacities
    6. General Theory of Knowledge
      1. A Causal Theory of Knowledge
      2. Internalist Constraints
      3. A Relational Theory of Cognition
      4. Response to Skepticism
  2. Metaphysics
    1. Substance
    2. Quality
    3. Action
    4. Universal
    5. Inherence
    6. Individuator
    7. Absence
    8. Causation
  3. Philosophy of Religion
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Sanskrit Source Materials
    2. Primary Texts in English Translation
    3. Studies of Nyāya Epistemology, Metaphysics, and Philosophy of Religion in English
    4. General Studies

1. Epistemology

The Nyāya-sūtra opens with a list of its primary topics, sixteen items which may be grouped into the following four categories: epistemology, metaphysics, procedures and elements of inquiry, and debate theory. That Nyāya’s initial topic is epistemology (pramāṇas, “knowledge-sources”) is noteworthy. Both the sūtras and the commentarial tradition argue that epistemic success is central in the search for happiness, since we must understand the world properly should we desire to achieve the goods it offers.Vātsyāyana claims that while Nyāya’s metaphysical concerns overlap with other, more scripturally-based Hindu schools, what distinguishes Nyāya is a reflective concern with evidence, doubt and the objects of knowledge. He further defines Nyāya’s philosophical method as the “investigation of a subject by means of knowledge-sources” (NB 1.1.1). Importantly, the pramāṇas are not simply the means by which individuals attain veridical cognition. They are also the final court of appeals in philosophical dispute. Uddyotakara thus claims the best kind of demonstrative reasoning occurs when the pramāṇas are deployed in concert in order to establish a fact.

The four pramāṇas are perception, inference, analogical reasoning, and testimony. We will discuss them in order. Then, we will consider Nyāya’s theory of knowledge in general.

a. Perception (pratyakṣa)

i. The Characteristics of Perception

Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.4 defines perceptual cognition as follows.

A perceptual cognition arises by means of the connection between sense faculty and object, is not dependent on words, is non-deviating, and is determinate.

This sūtra provides four conditions which must be met for cognition to be perceptual. The first, that cognition arises from the connection between sense faculty and object, evinces Nyāya’s direct realism. It is such connection, the central feature of the causal chain which terminates in perceptual cognition, which fixes the intentionality of a token percept. Uddyotakara enumerates six kinds of connection (sannikarṣa) to account for the fact that that we perceive not only substances, but properties, absences, and so on: (i) conjunction (samyoga), the connection between a sense faculty and an object; (ii) inherence in what is conjoined (saṁyukta-samavāya), the connection between a sense faculty and a property-trope which inheres in an object; (iii) inherence in what inheres in what is conjoined (saṁyukta-samaveta-samavāya), the connection between a sense faculty and the universal which is instantiated in a property-trope; (iv) inherence (samavāya), the kind of connection which makes auditory perception possible; (v) inherence in what inheres (samaveta-samavāya), the connection between the auditory faculty and universals which inhere within sounds; (vi) qualifier-qualified relation (viśeṣya-viśeṣaṇa-bhāva), the connection which allows for the perception of inherence and absence in objects. In all cases, the perceptual cognition is born of connection between a sense faculty and an occurrent fact or object.

The second condition, that the cognition produced is not dependent on words, has a somewhat complicated interpretive history. Generally, Nyāya holds that ordinary perception involves concept deployment. Therefore, this restriction does not endorse a view held by the Buddhist Dignāga and his followers, that genuine perception is non-conceptual (kalpanā-apodha). Still, the meaning of avyapadeśya is disputed amongst Naiyāyikas. On one reading, this qualification serves the purpose of distinguishing between perceptually and testimonially generated cognitions. The latter also require information provided by the senses but further require the deployment of semantic and syntactic knowledge. An allied reading suggests that while involving the application of concepts, perception of an object is often causally prior to speech acts involving it.

The third, “non-deviating” condition blocks false cognitions, like the misperception that an oyster shell is a piece of silver, from the ranks of pramāṇa-born. This is tied to the Nyāya notion that pramāṇas are by definition inerrant, and that false cognitive presentations are not truly pramāṇas but pseudo-pramāṇas (pramāṇa-ābhāsa). Though we may mistakenly take a pseudo-pramāṇa, like the illusion of a person in the distance, to be the real thing, it is not. “Perception” and similar pramāṇa-terms have success grammar for Nyāya.

The fourth, “determinate” condition blocks cognitions which are merely doubtful from the ranks of the pramāṇa-born. Dubious cognitions, like that of a distant person at dusk, do not convey misleadingly false information, but being unclear, they do not properly apprehend the object in question. It could be a person or a post. As such, one neither correctly grasps its character nor falsely takes it to represent accurately a certain object. Later Naiyāyikas, most notably Vācaspati Miśra, read the qualifiers “notdependent on words” and “determinate” disjunctively, in order to say that perception may be non-propositional or propositional. However anachronistic this may be as an interpretation of the Nyāya-sūtra, this division is accepted by later Nyāya.

ii. Extraordinary Perceptual States

Nyāya admits of certain kinds of extraordinary perception in order to account for cognitive states that are perceptual in character, but distinct from those commonly experienced. They involve modes of sense-object connection other than the six kinds noted above. Later Nyāya (beginning at least with Jayanta) recognizes three kinds of extraordinary perception: (i) yogic perception, (ii) perception of a universal through an individual which instantiates it, and (iii) perception of an object’s properties as mediated by memory.

Yogic perception includes experiential states reported by contemplatives in deep mediation. Their cognitive objects (usually the deep self or God) are taken to be experienced in a direct and unmediated way, but generally without the operation of the external senses. Given their experiential character and their putative agreement with other sources of knowledge like scripture and inference, yogic experiences are prima facie taken to be veridical, produced by non-normal perception.

Perception of a universal through an individual which instantiates it is Nyāya’s response to the problem of induction. Nyāya holds that universals are perceptually experienced as instantiated in individuals (see the third of Uddyotakara’s six kinds of connection above). But the notion that we may have apprehension of all of the individuals which instantiate a universal, qua their being instantiations of the universal, is further accepted by Nyāya in order to explain how we attain to knowledge of vyāpti, or invariable relation between universals, which undergirds causal regularities of various sorts. Unless one’s experience of some particular smoke instance as conjoined with a fire instance allows him to experience all instances of smoke qua smoke as being conjoined with all instances of fire qua fire, through the natural tie between the universals smokiness and fieriness, inductive extrapolation would be impossible. Nyāya thus solves the problem of induction by appeal to extraordinary perception. This does not imply that we are always able to recognize such relations. It may take repeated experience for us to notice the ever-present connection. But when such recognition arises, it is due to perceptual experience, not an extrapolative projection of past experience.

Perception of the properties of an object mediated by memory involves the visual experience of unpresented properties of an object which is currently seen. Standard examples include seeing a piece of sandalwood as fragrant or seeing a piece of ice as cold. Here, there is a standard kind of sense object connection, but some of the phenomenal features of the experience, while veridical, are not generated by the ordinary connection. They are rather mediated by a special connection grounded in memory. What distinguishes this kind of perception from straightforward inference is that the property in question is experienced with a phenomenal character lacking in inference. This suggests that what may be considered inference for some may take the form of perception for others, depending on their familiarity with the conceptual connection between the properties in question.

iii. Introspection

Nyāya holds that while cognitions reveal or present their intentional objects, they rarely present themselves directly. When they are directly cognized, cognitions are grasped by other, apperceptive cognitions. As apperceptive awareness reveals a cognition along with its predication content or “objecthood” (that is, my cognition of a red truck is apperceptively cognized as having the predication content “red” and “truck-hood”), it is practically indefeasible. But, as Gaṅgeśa notes, this indefeasibility does transfer to the content of the original cognition (which is itself object of the apperceptive awareness). I may have mistaken a purple truck for a red truck, forgetting that my eyewear distorts certain colors. Apperception is subsumed by Nyāya into the category of perception. In this case, the operative sense faculty is the “inner organ” (manas) and the object is a cognition conceived of as a property of a self. Gaṅgeśa argues at length with a Prābhākara Mīmāṁsaka (a representative of another leading Hindu school), defending Nyāya’s version of apperception against the Mīmāṁsā view that each cognition itself has a component of reflectively self-awareness.

A few words on manas (the inner organ): NS 1.1.16 argues that the absence of simultaneous cognition from all of the senses indicates the presence of a faculty which governs selective attention. The manas is identified as this faculty, an insentient psychological apparatus which processes the information of the senses. A formulation of perception by the Vaiśeṣika school (Vaiśeṣika-sūtra 3.1.18), accepted by Nyāya, is that it normally consists in a chain of connection between four things: a self and its manas, the manas and a sense organ, and the sense organ and an object. Manas also is the faculty which governs mnemonic retrieval and, as noted above, apperceptive awareness of mental states. Selves, in the Nyāya view, are fundamentally loci of awareness, cognition, and mnemonic dispositions (saṁskāra). But just as they rely on the five senses to experience the world, they rely on manas for the functioning of memory and apperception.

To conclude, we may note that perception is commonly called the jyeṣṭapramāṇa (the “eldest” knowledge source) by Nyāya, since other pramāṇas depend on perceptual input, while perception operates directly on the objects of knowledge. Indeed, Gaṅgeśa suggests the following definition of a perceptual cognition: “a cognition that does not have another cognition as its proximate instrumental cause.” Inference, analogy, and testimony, on the other hand, depend on immediately prior cognitions to trigger their functioning. The normative status accorded to veridical perceptual cognition is primarily a matter of causation and intentionality (viṣayatā). If a cognition is caused by the appropriate causal chain, starting with the contact of a sense faculty and an external object (or, in the case of apperception, the internal organ and an immediately prior cognition), and the cognition produced has an “objecthood” or intentionality which accurately targets the object in question, the cognition is veridical and has the status prāmāṇya (pramāṇā-derived).

b. Inference (anumāna)

i. The Characteristics of Inference

Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.5 defines inference as follows.

[An inferential cognition] is preceded by that [perception], and is threefold: from cause to effect, from effect to cause or from that which is commonly seen.

This definition is somewhat elliptical. But it focuses on the fundamental character of inference: it is a cognition which follows from another cognition owing to their being conceptually connected in some way. Etymologically, anumāna means “after-cognizing”. Inference follows from an earlier cognition, “that” in the sūtra above. Vātsyāyana interprets “that” (tat) to refer to a perceptual cognition, and suggests that perceptual cognition precedes inference in two ways: (i) to engage in inference requires having perceptually established a fixed relationship between an inferential sign and the property to be inferred, and (ii) perceptual input triggers inference in that one must cognize the inferential sign as qualifying the locus of an inference. He provides a more explicit definition of inference as “a ‘later cognition’ of an object by means of cognition of its inferential sign” (NB 1.1.3).

Uddyotakara reasonably broadens the scope of “that” in NS 1.1.5 to refer to pramāṇa-produced cognitions of any kind which may trigger inference (NV 1.1.5). The meaning of reasoning from cause to effect and from effect to cause should be clear. Uddyotakara interprets reasoning from what is “commonly seen” as that which is grounded in non-causal correlations that have proven invariable. Vātsyāyana offers another reading: when the relationship between an inferential sign and the inferential target is not perceptible, the target may be inferred owing to the similarity of the unseen prover with something known. The classic example of this kind of inference is as follows: Desire, aversion, and knowledge are properties. Properties require substances which instantiate them. Therefore there is anunseen substance which instantiates desire, aversion, and knowledge: the inner self (NB 1.1.5). Though the connection between mental states like desire and the self which supports them is unseen, the similarity between mental states and other, commonly seen properties (like the color green) is enough to allow for the inference to a property-bearer.

The history of Nyāya’s logical theory is extensive. Here, we will note a few salient points and focus on inference as understood in the period most important to this study (the final great creative period of what is normally known as “Old Nyāya”). First, in Nyāya, logic is subsumed within epistemology, and therefore tends to have a strong informal and cognitive flavor, mapping paths of reasoning that generate veridical cognitions and noting the common ways that reasoning goes wrong. Fundamentally, one makes inferences for oneself. Formal proofs are meant to mirror the kind of reasoning that takes place internally, for didactic or polemical purposes. The first explicit recognition of this dual nature of inference is commonly attributed to the Buddhist Dignāga, who coined the terms svārthānumāna (inference for oneself) and parārthānumāna (inference for another). Such a division is implicit, however, in the Nyāya-sūtra’s distinction between inference as an individual’s source of knowledge (NS 1.1.5) and as a systematic method of proof meant to convince another (NS 1.1.32-39).

Second, inference is triggered by the recognition of a sign or mark, whose relationship with some other object (property or fact) has been firmly established. The primary cause of an inferential cognition is an immediately prior “subsumptive judgment” (parāmarśa) which grasps an inferential sign as qualifying an inferential subject (the locus of the inference), while recollecting the sign’s invariable concomitance with some other fact or object. The two fundamental requirements for inference are, therefore, awareness of pakṣadharmatā, the inferential mark’s qualifying the locus of the inference, and vyāpti, the sign’s invariable concomitance with the target property or probandum. A paradigmatic act of inference to oneself is: “There is fire on that mountain, since there is smoke on it,” which is supported by the awareness that fire is invariably concomitant with smoke. Naiyāyikas examine and standardize the conditions under which invariable concomitance (vyāpti) between a probans and a target fact is established.

Third, as logic’s function is to generate veridical cognition, Nyāya does not stress the distinction between soundness and validity in respect to the quality of an argument. Both formal fallacies and the inclusion of false premises lead to hetv-ābhāsa (“pseudo provers” or logical defeaters), since they engender false cognition.

ii. The Structure of Inference

Concerning inference for polemical or didactic purposes, Nyāya employs a formal five-step argument illustrated by the following stock example.

  1. There is fire on the hill (the pratijñā, thesis).
  2. Because there is smoke on the hill (the hetu, reason or probans).
  3. Wherever there is smoke, there is fire; like a kitchen hearth and unlike a lake (the udāharaṇa, illustration of concomitance).
  4. This hill is likewise smoky (the upanaya, application of the rule).
  5. Thus, there is fire on the hill (the nigamana, conclusion).

In practice, the five-membered “syllogism” is often truncated into three steps as follows.

A is qualified by S,
because it is qualified by T
(whatever is qualified by T is qualified by S) like (Tb&Sb).

Again, the stock example:

The hill is qualified by fieriness
because it is qualified by smokiness
(whatever is qualified by smokiness is qualified by fieriness) like a kitchen hearth and unlike a lake.

The basic components of the argument are:

  • the inferential subject (pakṣa), the locus of the inferential sign; the hill in our example. The general conditions for something to be taken up as a subject for inference, are that it be under dispute or currently unknown, with no reports from other knowledge sources available to definitively settle the issue.
  • the “prover” or inferential sign (hetu); smoke (more precisely, smokiness)
  • the probandum (sādhya), the property to be proved by the inference; fire (more precisely, fieriness)
  • the “pervasion” or concomitance (vyāpti) that grounds the inference, which is implicit in the step: “wherever there is smoke, there is fire
  • a corroborative instance (sapakṣa); a locus known to be qualified by both the prover (hetu) and the probandum (sādhya); this is a token of inductive support for the vyāpti; a kitchen hearth. There are also known negative examples, (vipakṣa) of something that lacks both the prover property and the probandum; where there is no fire, there is no smoke, like a lake. Obviously, an instantiation of the prover property in the vipakṣa class vitiates the argument.

This stock inference asserts that there is fire on the mountain (the mountain is qualified by the property of fieriness, Fm). Why?  Because the mountain is qualified by the property of smokiness, Sm. There is an implied concomitance which grounds the inference: “Whatever is qualified by smokiness is qualified by fieriness,” ∀x(Sx–>Fx). In the language of Nyāya, fire “pervades” smoke. This is an epistemic pervasion: we never find smoke instances without fire instances. As such, smoke is a prover property that allows us to infer the presence of fire. Finally, an example must be included in the syllogism to illustrate the inductive grounding which undergirds the invariable concomitance. In kitchen hearth k, fire is known to be concomitant with smoke, (Sk&Fk). In some instances, negative examples are used to indicate the vyāpti through contraposition. Wherever there is no fire there is no smoke, as illustrated in a lake, (~Fl& ~Sl).

Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.25 defines an example (dṛṣṭānta) as “something about which experts and laypersons have the same opinion (buddhi-sāmyam).” Vātsyāyana (NB Intro.; translation in Gangopadhyaya 1982: 5) elaborates:

Corroborative instance is an object of perception—an object about which the notions (buddhi) of the layman as well as the expert are not in conflict. . . It is also the basis of the application of nyāya (reasoning). By (showing) the contradiction of the dṛṣṭānta the position of the opponent can be declared as refuted. By the substantiation of the dṛṣṭānta, one’s own position is well-established. If the skeptic (nāstika) admits a corroborative instance, he has to surrender his skepticism. If he does not admit any, how can he silence his opponent?

Regarding agreement between laypersons and experts, the basic idea, of course, is that supporting examples should be non-controversial. A good illustration of this is found in Uddyotakara’s Nyāya-vārttika (2.1.16). Debating with a Buddhist interlocutor over the existence of property-bearing substances, he claims “there is no example whatever (na hi kaściddṛṣṭāntaḥ) . . . about which both parties agree (ubhaya-pakṣa-sampratipannaḥ).”

In another interpretation of the three kinds of inference in the sūtra, Uddyotakara introduces three kinds of argument: wholly-positive, wholly-negative, and positive-negative. Wholly-positive inference occurs when there are attested cases of sapakṣa but no vipakṣaknown. From a Buddhist perspective, the inference “whatever exists is momentary, like a cloud” would require this kind of inference, since there would be no available vipakṣato illustrate the non-presence of the prover. In cases where the property to be proven is entirely subsumed within the pakṣa, a wholly-negative form is employed. The vyāpti is contraposed, as in the following inference: “A living body has a self because it breathes. Whatever does not have a self does not breathe, like a pot.” Most inferences are in principle amenable to the positive-negative form, like “There is fire on that hill, since there is billowing smoke over it. Wherever there is smoke, there is fire, like a kitchen hearth, and unlike a lake.”

iii. Inferential Defeaters or Fallacies

Naiyāyikas provide various typologies of inferential fallacies and defeaters (hetv-ābāsa, “pseudo provers”). We may note five common kinds: (i) fallacies of deviation occur when the prover or inferential sign is not reliably correlated with the inferential target. To argue that “my mother must be visiting, since there is a Mazda parked outside” would involve the fallacy of deviation, since “Owning a Mazda” is a property that tracks not only my mother but many other drivers. It cannot, therefore, reliably indicate her presence. (ii) fallacies of contradiction occur when the prover in fact establishes a conclusion opposed to the thesis that someone defends. This would occur should someone argue that “Jones was not a kind man, since he gave his life for others,” as giving one’s life for others is an indicator of kindness or compassion. (iii) fallacies of unestablishment occur when a supposed prover is not actually the property of the inferential subject. Should someone argue “I know that your mother is in town, since I saw a Prius parked outside your home,” the prover is unestablished, since my mother does not in fact own a Prius. (iv) argumentsare rebutted, when their conclusions are undermined by information gleaned by more secure knowledge sources. Someone may argue that my friend must be out of town, since he hasn’t answered his phone all week. But if I just saw the friend in question at the local coffee shop, my perceptual knowledge rebuts his prover, invalidating it. Similarly, (v) arguments are counterbalanced when counterarguments of equal or greater force are put forth in support of an opposing conclusion. Disputant a argues that the inherent teleology of biological processes proves the existence of God. Disputant b argues that the existence of gratuitous evil proves that there is no God. Pending further philosophical work, argument b neutralizes the conclusion of argument a.

iv. Suppositional Reasoning

Tarka, suppositional or dialectical reasoning, is crucial to Nyāya’s philosophical program. Still, according to Vātsyāyana, it is not a full-fledged independent pramāṇa. Rather it is an “assistant to the pramāṇas” (pramāṇa-anugrahaka) (NB Introduction). Tarka is commonly employed as a form of reductio argument for the sake of judging competing claims or arguments, a reductio which depends not only on logical inconsistency, but on incoherence with deeply-held beliefs or norms. In the face of competing claims x and y about subject s, tarkais employed to show that x violates such norms, thereby shifting the presumptive weight to alternative y. Vātsyāyana (NB1.1.40) offers the example of competing claims about the nature of the self. Some say that the self is a product which comes to exist within time while others claim that it is unproduced and eternal. The Naiyāyika deploys tarkaby arguing that a consequence of the former view is that one’s initial life circumstances would not be determined by his karmic inheritance from previous lives, a severe violation of fundamental metaphysical positions held by almost every Indian school. As such, strong presumptive weight should be given to the latter view. This example illustrates the way in which considerations of negative coherence govern tarka’s deployment.

Vātsyāyana notes that the reason tarkais not an independent pramāṇa is that it does not independently establish the nature of the thing in question (anavadhāranāt). It provides consent (anujānāti) for one of two alternatives independently supported by apparent pramāṇas, by illustrating problems with the competing view. Uddyotakara (NV 1.1.1) adds that it is excluded from the ranks of pramāṇa because it does not provide definitive cognition (pramāṇamparicchedakaṁnatarkaḥ).

Later Naiyāyikas extol tarka as a means to test dubious inferential concomitances (vyāpti) by testing them against more fundamental holdings of various sorts. Tarka also has a crucial role in the management of philosophical doubt. Against the skeptic, Nyāya argues that doubt is not always reasonable. Tarka helps to distinguish legitimate doubt from mere contentiousness by illustrating which claims are better motivated and hence deserving of presumptive weight.

c. Analogical Reasoning (upamāna)

Nyāya-sūtra1.1.6 defines analogyas follows.

Analogy makes an object known by similarity with something already known.

Naiyāyikas commonly frame analogy as a means of vocabulary acquisition, and it has a severely restricted scope compared with the other pramāṇas. The standard example involves a person who is told that a water buffalo looks something like a cow and that such buffalo are present in a certain place in the countryside. Later, when out in the countryside, he recognizes that the thing he is seeing is similar to a cow, and therefore is a water buffalo. The cognition “That thing is a water buffalo,” born of the recollection of testimony regarding its similarity with a cow and the perception of such common features, is paradigmatically analogical. Though most of the other schools either reduce analogy to a more fundamental pramāṇaor conceive of it in very different terms (Mīmāṁsā conceives of it as the capacity by which we apprehend similarity itself), Nyāya contends that the cognition in question is sui generis analogical, though it incorporates information from other pramāṇas.

d. Testimony (śabda)

NS1.1.5 defines testimony as follows.

Testimony is the assertion of a qualified speaker.

The semantic range of āpta (“authority,” “credible person”) includes expertise, trustworthiness, and reliability. Vātsyāyana claims that an āpta possesses direct knowledge of something, and a willingness to convey such knowledge without distortion (NB 1.1.7). It is clear, though, that Nyāya does not require any kind of special expertise from such a speaker in normal situations. Nor does a hearer need positive evidence of trustworthiness. Mere absence of doubt in the asserter’s ability to speak authoritatively about the issue at hand is enough. Testimony is thus thought of as a transmission of information or content. A person attains an accurate cognition through some pramāṇatoken. In a properly functioning testimonial exchange, she bestows the information apprehended by the initial cognition to an epistemically responsible hearer. On such grounds, Uddyotakara notes that testimonial utterances may be divided into those whose contents are originally generated by perception or by inference. Jayanta likewise claims that the veridicality or non-veridicality of a testimonial cognition is dependent on the speaker’s knowledge of the content of her statement and her honesty in relating it.Vātsyāyana (NB 2.1.69) illustrates a levelheaded frankness about testimony’s importance, noting that “in accord with knowledge gained by testimony, people undertake their common affairs.” Uddyotakarasimilarlyrecognizes that testimony has the widest range of any source of knowledge, far outstripping what one may know from personal perception, inference or analogy.

e. Non-pramāṇa Epistemic Capacities

From the sūtra period, Nyāya recognizes a number of epistemic capacities which are nevertheless considered non-pramāṇa (NS 2.2.1-12). They are not considered independent pramāṇas for one of two reasons: (i) they are reducible to subspecies of other pramāṇas, or (ii) they do not produce the specific kind of cognitions which a pramāṇa must deliver. A core locus of debate amongst classical Indian thinkers is the nature and number of pramāṇas. Nyāya contends that the above four are the only irreducible sources of knowledge, which subsume all other kinds.

f. General Theory of Knowledge

i. A Causal Theory of Knowledge

Naiyāyikas speak of cognitive success in causal terms. “Pramāṇa” normally refers to a means or process by which veridical awareness-episodes (pramā) are generated, as seen above. Vātsyāyana glosses the meaning of pramāṇaas “that by which something is properly cognized (pramītyateanena)” (NB1.1.3).  Uddyotakara concurs: “what is spoken of as a pramāṇa? A pramāṇais the cause of a [veridical] cognition” (upalabdhi-hetupramāṇam) (NV1.1.1). Moreover, despite its focus on reflective consideration of belief and valid cognition, Nyāya argues that the simple,unreflective functioning of a pramāṇa like perception or testimony is enough to generate knowledge in the absence of countervailing evidence.

ii. Internalist Constraints

Nyāya does maintain an internalist constraint: Once doubt arises—by adversarial challenge, peer disagreement, inconsistency between differentcognitions, and so forth —a cognition must be validated in order to maintain the status of being “pramāṇa-produced.” Doubt triggers a second-order concern with reflective inquiry and certification. The sūtras state that “Where there is doubt, there must be ongoing examination” (NS 2.1.7). Uddyotakara therefore claims that doubt is an essential component of investigation (vicāra-aṅga) (NV 1.1.23). Validation involves consciously reflecting on the etiology of a cognition to ensure that it is the product of a properly-functioning pramāṇa. It may also involve the deployment of other pramāṇasin the hopes for a convergence of knowledge-sources (pramāṇa-saṁplava) in support of the doubted cognition. In his opening comments on the Nyāya-sūtra, Vātsyāyana famously provides a pragmatic test (but not definition) of truth: cognitions which guide us to successful action are likely veridical.

iii. A Relational Theory of Cognition

Nyāya epistemologists speak of cognition (jñāna, buddhi, upalabdhi, pratyaya): generally immediate awareness states of what Nyāya understands to be a mind-independent external reality. In the case of apperception, one cognizesher own mental states. Ontologically, cognitions are considered properties (guṇas) of individual selves (ātmans). Memory dispositions, when triggered, generate cognition about the past. With a few exceptions, cognitions target things other than themselves.

For Nyāya, cognitions target their objects by means of a relation called “objecthood” (viṣayatā). Nyāya’s theory is thus not exactly representational, but relational. “Objecthood” minimally has a threefold structure (with the possibility of iteration) corresponding to three features of the external object in question: a portion of the cognition targets an object itself, a portion of the cognition targets a property of the object, and finally, a portion of the cognition targets the relationship between the object and its property. In cases of veridical cognition (pramā), the portion of cognition which targets a substantive and the portion which targets its property match up. Gaṅgeśa famously defines veridical cognition as “a cognitive state with predication content x about something in fact qualified by x” (Tattvacintāmaṇi, pramā-lakṣaṇa-vāda). Seeing a male human being as qualified by “man” would be a paradigm case of veridical cognition. Error is generally classified as a misfire of the property-scoping portion of cognition. In error, a substantive is indeed cognized, but the property which is targeted does not actually qualify the substantive in question. The cognition’s intentionality is bifurcated, so to speak, simultaneously scoping a substantive and a property which is in fact alien to it.

iv. Response to Skepticism

Nyāya is a staunchly anti-skeptical tradition of epistemology. While it does give an important role to doubt, which, as seen above, triggers reflection and philosophical review, it rejects the notion that doubt should be the starting place in philosophical reflection. Doubt itself should be motivated, as trust is a better default starting place in both ordinary life and philosophy. Pragmatically, Nyāya argues that the role of epistemology is to better hone our cognitive abilities in order to succeed in our life aims. But unrestricted doubt would undermine our ability to function on a basic level, and it therefore militates against the very point of epistemological inquiry. Theoretically, Nyāya argues that error and indeed doubt itself are conceptually parasitical on true cognition. Error and doubt only make sense against a background of true belief, and therefore reflection must start by taking putatively veridical cognition at face value. Allied to this is a strain of criticism that even the simple act of giving voice to skeptical arguments belays a philosopher’s dependence on knowledge sources, including the inductively-supported tie between words and their meanings, which a skeptic relies on to speak his case. Given that everyone, the skeptic included, relies on pramāṇas, they are to be given the lion’s share of default entitlement.

2. Metaphysics

Nyāya defends a realist and pluralist metaphysics of categories (padārthas, lit. “things denoted by words”), largely adapted, with some modifications, from its sister school Vaiśeṣika. The categories are substance, quality, action, universal, individuator, inherence and absence. They will be discussed individually below.

a. Substance (dravya), Including Self (ātman)

Substances are the bedrock of Nyāya/Vaiśeṣika metaphysics (hereafter, simply “Nyāya Metaphysics”), as other categories generally inhere within substances or are nested within properties that inhere within substances. Paradigmatic substances include the indestructible atoms of earth, water, air and fire; composite substances like pots and trees; inner “selves” (ātman) which are the eternal, reincarnating souls; and God, a unique ātman.

Naiyāyikas provide a number of arguments in support of a non-material self. A standard argument runs as follows: Things like desire, cognition, experiences of pleasure and pain and volition are qualities. All qualities inhere in substances. Therefore, there is a substance to which desire and the rest belong. This conclusion is then followed by an argument from elimination. None of the material elements like earth or water are the bearers of desire and the rest. Therefore, there must be a special, non-material substance, namely a self (see various commentaries on NS 1.1.10). This argument is bolstered by others meant to illustrate that the physical body, as a product of material elements cannot be the fundamental locus of conscious states.

Some of the richest debates in classical India take place between Nyāya and Buddhists over the reality of substances. The central concern of such debates is often the statusof individual selves—an important substance, to say the least. Famously, the Buddha declared that reality is “lacking a self” (anātman), and his followers develop a number of arguments which purport to illustrate this in two ways. (i) Diachronically: moment by moment, things are destroyed and new things arise, such that no substance (including selves) endures for longer than a moment. (ii) Synchronically: in a single moment, what we take to be wholes (including selves) are nothing more than heaps of micro-properties (illustrated by the famous chariot metaphor in The Questions of King Milinda.) The Buddhist position is that although there is no such thing as an enduring self, the need for moral continuity and other desiderata may be satisfied merely by the causal connections between events in a single causal stream which we refer to as a “person.”

Nyāya’s response is to defend the existence of substances generally and selves in particular. In defense of substances, it argues that composite substances have capacities beyond the mere collection of their parts (NS 2.1.35). Moreover, Nyāya argues that the Buddhist reduction, if carried out consistently, would lead to an absurdity. We can see composite substances, but we cannot seeentities like atoms, which exist below our perceptual threshold. But if substances are nothing but heaps of micro objects/properties, which themselves can be reduced, and so on, then we should not be able to perceive substances at all. Thus, there must be a unified identity for individual substances which undergirds their availability for perceptual experience (NS 2.1.36).

In defense of the diachronic existence of individual selves, Nyāya argues that our experience of recollection (“that is the very man I saw a week ago”) requires a locus of memory which spans the time between the initial experience and the re-experience of an object (NS 1.1.10 and allied commentaries). In this spirit, Uddyotakara, following Vātsyāyana, argues that if I am now a different self than the “me” of yesterday, I should not be able to recollect things which that “me” experienced, since one self is unable to recollect the content of another’s experience. In defense of the synchronic identity of selves, Nyāya argues that cross-modal recognition (“that thing I see is the same thing I am touching”) requires a single experiencer with the ability to synthesize data from various senses (NS 3.1.1-3). Early Nyāya’s arguments for the self find their apex in Udayana’s monograph Determining the Truth of the Self.

b. Quality

Qualities (guṇa), are property tropes which qualify substances. Unlike universals they are not repeatable. The red color of some particular fire hydrant is a quality. Like other instances of the color red it is inhered by the universal redness, but it is as particular as the hydrant which it qualifies. Qualities include color, number (which is thought to inhere in objects), spatial location, contact, disjunction, and so forth, along with qualities which are unique to selves, like desire, cognition, and karmic merit.

c. Action

Like qualities, actions (karma) inhere in substances and are non-repeatable tropes. But they have causal capacities which qualities lack, particularly the ability to engender conjunction and disjunction between substances.

d. Universal

Universals (sāmānya or jāti) inhere in substances (for examplepot-hood), qualities (redness) or motions (contraction-hood). Naiyāyikas argue that universals are required to account for common experiences of a recurring character, for the functioning of language, andto undergird causal regularities in nature (which are held to be relations between universals). As its theory of universals is developed, Nyāya recognizes entities which are like universals, but which are, for theoretical reasons, excluded from their ranks (upādhi). Udayana would famously chart the reasons for such exclusion. These are: (i) A true universal must be capable of more than one instance. Spacehood would not be a true universal, as it can only have one instance. (ii) Two universals which have the same exact instances are in fact the same universal, simply under two designations. (iii) Should two apparent universals share an instance, while one is not entirely subsumed within the other, both are mere upādhis. This criterion, which is the most controversial of the “universal-blockers,” suggests that the operative notion of universal here is something akin to natural kinds. (iv) Any supposed universal that would, if accepted, lead to an infinite regress (for example universal-hood), is not accepted. (v) There is no universal for individuators (see below), as their ontic function is to introduce primitive differentiation. (vi) There is no universal for inherence (see below), as this would engender a vicious infinite regress: inherence would require further inherence between it and its universal “inherencehood”, and so on.

e. Inherence

Inherence is a relation which is central to Nyāya’s ontology, by which qualities, actions, universals, and individuators relate to substances, by which universals relate to qualities and actions, and by which wholes relate to their parts. In the first instance, the brown color of a cow inheres in the cow. In the second, the universal brownness inheres in the quality trope brown. In the third, my car, a substance, is a single entity, which inheres in its various parts. Thus, your touching just one part of my car is enough to justify the claim “you touched my car” simpliciter. Nyāya contends that inherence is a self-linking property. It does not rely on other instances of inherence in order to “glue” it to the two elements which it relates. Thus it seeks to rebut regress arguments of the type advanced by recently by F. H. Bradley and by the classical Vedāntin Śaṅkarācārya (c. 9th century C.E.) in classical India.

f. Individuator

Individuators are the finest-grained causes of ontological distinction. They are the means by which individual atoms within the basic kinds “earth”, “water”, and so forth, and by which individual selves are ultimately particularized. Individuators for Nyāya’s ontology may be conceived as roughly analogous to haecceities within Western philosophical discourse.

g. Absence

The ontological reality of absence, however attenuated, isaccepted by Nyāya in order to account for both linguistic practice involving negation and cognitive states which correctly ascertain non-existence of some kind.Vātsyāyana argues that the positive knowledge produced by a knowledge sourcegives immediate rise to knowledge of an absence insofar as one can reflect that if something was not made manifest at the time of the initial cognition (and provided that the thing in question is ordinarily cognizable), it was absent. Uddyotakara famously argues that negation is often perceptible: looking at my desk, I see the absence of a coffee mug, and such absence is “located” on the surface my desk. In this spirit, absence is generally thought of as a qualifier (viśeṣana) of some object or property, which is the qualificand (viśeṣya). The four basic kinds of absences accepted by Nyāya in its mature period are prior absence (of something before it is created), absence-by-destruction (of an object after it is destroyed), absolute absence (of something for some locus where it could never exist), and mutual absence (between two separately existing objects).

h. Causation

Naiyāyikas speak of a cause or causal condition as something which is necessarily antecedent to aspecific kind of effect without being “causally irrelevant”. Such causes are threefold. The (i) inherence cause, akin to a material cause, is the substratum out of which (or within which) an effect is made (the threads which together make up a cloth). The (ii) non-inherence cause includes properties of the inherence cause which influence the properties of the effect (the property of contact which inheres within the threads which make up a cloth). Finally, (iii), the instrumental/agential cause(s). This third category is a kind of catch-all which includes everything aside from the substratum and its properties. Central in this category are agents, their activities, and instruments used by then to produce effects. Out of the nexus of causal conditions which come together in the production of an effect, Naiyāyikas tend to speak of a most important factor as the trigger cause (for example the striking of a match against a rough surface which produces a lit match).

In order to weed out unnecessary or unimportant factors from the causal nexus which produces an effect, Nyāya includes the caveat that a proper cause must not be “causally irrelevant”. Causal irrelevance occurs in various ways. For example, something x which universally precedes a certain effect y, but whose relationship with the effect is mediated by some other factor z upon which it subsists is causally irrelevant. For example, a certain artist may create a unique kind of sculpture, and she is thus identified as a causal factor in its production. She may have certain properties (hair color, eye color, height) which also, by means of their subsisting in her, invariably precede the production of her sculptures. But since their participation in the causal event is derivative, they are deemed causally irrelevant and unworthy of being specified as causes.

3. Philosophy of Religion

Nyāya expressly conceives of itself as a rational defender of classical Hindu religious and theistic culture. Nyāya-sūtra begins by claiming that ascertainment of the ultimate good (niḥśreya) requires correct apprehension of reality, which gives rise to a sustained epistemological/metaphysical investigation of the kind the sūtras provide.Vātsyāyanaargues that as a discipline of inquiry, Nyāya is the support of all practices of legitimate dharma. Jayanta claims that amongst the various research programs in the umbrella of classical Vedic culture, Nyāya is of chief importance, since it aims to defend Vedic tradition and its manifold subdivisions of study from the attacks of rival, anti-Vedic philosophers. Though the Nyāya-sūtra overwhelmingly focuses on theoretical issues and not praxis, it nonetheless recommends that students of Nyāya engage in yogic practice (4.2.42) and defends the possibility of enlightenment (4.2.44-5).

From fairly early in its history, Nyāya specifically takes it upon itself to defend the existence of God (Īśvara). Nyāya primarily employs versions of the design inference. Paradigmatic arguments include:

Primordial matter, atoms and karma function when guided by a conscious agent because they are insentient (acetaṇatvāt) like an axe. As axes, due to insentience, operate only when directed by a sentient agent, so too do things like primordial nature, atoms and karma. Therefore, they too are directed by a cause possessed of intelligence. (Uddyotakara, NV 4.1.21)

Things like the earth have a maker as their cause, because they are products (kāryatvāt). (Udayana Nyāyakusumāñjali, Fifth Chapter)

With various formulations like the above, and extensive supporting arguments, Nyāya defends a version of the argument from design. Buddhist, Mīmāṁsā (and later, Jain) philosophers respond by charging Nyāya with violations of inferential boundaries: only by extrapolating far beyond the correlation between ordinary products and makers is Nyāya able to argue for a unique God-like maker of the world. A standard response, as seen in Vācaspati (NVT 4.1.21) is that even in straightforward general-to-particular inductive reasoning, we employ some degree of inference to the best explanation. This allows enough flexibility to infer new kinds of entities while appealing to correlations generated from ordinary experience.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Sanskrit Source Materials

  • JayantaBhaṭṭa. Nyāya-mañjarī. Critically Edited by Vidvan, K. S. Varadacarya.Vol 1. Mysore: Oriental Research Institute 1969.
  • JayantaBhaṭṭa. Nyāya-mañjarī. Critically Edited by Vidvan, K. S. Varadacarya.Vol 2. Mysore: Oriental Research Institute 1983.
  • Nyāya-Tarkatirtha, Taranatha and Amarendramohan Tarkatirtha, eds. Nyāyadarśanamwith Vātsyāyana’sBhāṣya [cited as NB above], Uddyotakara’s Vārttika[cited as NV], Vācaspati Miśra’s Tātparyaṭīkā [cited as NVT] & Viśvanātha’s Vṛtti. Calcutta: Munshiram Manoharlal 2003.
  • Udayana. Nyāyavārttikatātpāryaśuddhi of Udayanācārya. Edited by Anantalal Thakur. New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research.

b. Primary Texts in English Translation

  • Gangopadhyaya, Mrinalkanti, trans. Nyāya: Gautama’s Nyāya-sūtra with Vātsyāyana’s Commentary. Calcutta: Indian Studies 1982.
  • Iyer, S. R., Editor and Translator, Tarkabhāṣā of Keśava Miśra. Varanasi: Chaukhambha Orientalia, 1979.
  • JayantaBhaṭṭa. Nyāya-mañjarī. Translated by JanakiVallabhaBhattacaryya.Vol. 1. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass 1978.
  • Jha, Sir Ganganatha, trans. The Nyāya-sūtras of Gautama.Vols 1-4. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass 1999.
  • Phillips, Stephen and N. S. Ramanuja Tatacharya. Epistemology of Perception: Gaṅgeśa’s Tattvacintāmaṇi Jewel of Reflection on the Truth (About Epistemology), The Perception Chapter (pratyakṣa-khaṇḍa). New York: American Institute of Buddhist Studies 2004. [This also contains the Sanskrit text.]
  • Potter, Karl H., ed. Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies.Vol. 2. Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass 1977. [This volume contains summary translations and helpful historical and conceptual introductions to early Nyāya and its individual philosophers.]
  • Udayana. Ātmatattvaviveka. Translation and commentary by N. S. Dravid.  Shimla: Indian Institute of Advanced Study 1995. [This also contains the Sanskrit text.]
  • Udayana. Nyāyakusumāñjali. Translation and commentary by N. S. Dravid. New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research 1996. [This also contains the Sanskrit text.]

c. Studies of Nyāya Epistemology, Metaphysics, and Philosophy of Religion in English

  • Bhattacaryya, Gopikamohan. Studies in Nyāya-vaiśeṣika Theism. Calcutta: Sanskrit College 1961.
  • Chakrabarti, Kisor Kumar. Classical Indian Philosophy of Mind: The Nyāya Dualist Tradition. Albany: State University of New York Press 1999.
  • Chemparathy, George. An Indian Rational Theology: Introduction to Udayana’s Nyāyakusumāñjali. Publications of the De Nobili Research Library, Vol. 1. Vienna: Gerold& Co.; Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass 1972.
  • Ghokale, Pradeep P. Inference and Fallacies Discussed in Ancient Indian Logic (with special reference to Nyāya and Buddhism). Bibliotheca Indo-Buddhica Series, Sunil Gupta, ed.Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications 1992.
  • Halbfass, Wilhelm. On Being and What There Is: Classical Vaiśeṣika and the History of Indian Ontology. Albany: State University of New York Press 1992. [Though this text focuses on Vaiśeṣika, it is relevant given the great overlap between Nyāya and Vaiśeṣika in metaphysical theory.]
  • Matilal, B. K. Perception. Oxford: Clarendon Press: Oxford 1986.
  • Matilal, B. K. The Character of Logic in India. Albany: SUNY Press 1998.

d. General Studies

  • Ganeri, Jonardon. Philosophy in Classical India: The Proper Work of Reason. London and New York: Routledge 2001.
  • Matilal, B. K. Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika. A History of Indian Literature, Vol. 6, Fasc. 2. Edited by Jan Gonda. Weisbaden: Otto Harrassowitz 1977.
  • Mohanty, J.N. Classical Indian Philosophy. Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc., 2000.
  • Phillips, Stephen. Classical Indian Metaphysics: Refutations of Realism and the Emergence of “New Logic.” Chicago: Open Court 1995.

Author Information

Matthew R. Dasti
Email: mdasti@bridgew.edu
Bridgewater State University
U. S. A.

Last updated: April 18, 2012 | Originally published: