The terms “objectivity” and “subjectivity,” in their modern usage, generally relate to a perceiving subject (normally a person) and a perceived or unperceived object. The object is something that presumably exists independent of the subject’s perception of it. In other words, the object would be there, as it is, even if no subject perceived it. Hence, objectivity is typically associated with ideas such as reality, truth and reliability.
The perceiving subject can either perceive accurately or seem to perceive features of the object that are not in the object. For example, a perceiving subject suffering from jaundice could seem to perceive an object as yellow when the object is not actually yellow. Hence, the term “subjective” typically indicates the possibility of error.
The potential for discrepancies between features of the subject’s perceptual impressions and the real qualities of the perceived object generates philosophical questions. There are also philosophical questions regarding the nature of objective reality and the nature of our so-called subjective reality. Consequently, we have various uses of the terms “objective” and “subjective” and their cognates to express possible differences between objective reality and subjective impressions. Philosophers refer to perceptual impressions themselves as being subjective or objective. Consequent judgments are objective or subjective to varying degrees, and we divide reality into objective reality and subjective reality. Thus, it is important to distinguish the various uses of the terms “objective” and “subjective.”
Many philosophers would use the term “objective reality” to refer to anything that exists as it is independent of any conscious awareness of it (via perception, thought, etc.). Common mid-sized physical objects presumably apply, as do persons having subjective states. Subjective reality would then include anything depending upon some (broadly construed) conscious awareness of it to exist. Particular instances of colors and sounds (as they are perceived) are prime examples of things that exist only when there are appropriate conscious states. Particular instances of emotions (e.g., my present happiness) also seem to be a subjective reality, existing when one feels them, and ceasing to exist when one’s mood changes.
“Objective knowledge” can simply refer to knowledge of an objective reality. Subjective knowledge would then be knowledge of any subjective reality.
There are, however, other uses of the terminology related to objectivity. Many philosophers use the term “subjective knowledge” to refer only to knowledge of one’s own subjective states. Such knowledge is distinguished from one’s knowledge of another individual’s subjective states and from knowledge of objective reality, which would both be objective knowledge under the present definitions. Your knowledge of another person’s subjective states can be called objective knowledge since it is presumably part of the world that is “object” for you, just as you and your subjective states are part of the world that is “object” for the other person.
This is a prominent distinction in epistemology (the philosophical study of knowledge) because many philosophers have maintained that subjective knowledge in this sense has a special status. They assert, roughly, that knowledge of one’s own subjective states is direct, or immediate, in a way that knowledge of anything else is not. It is convenient to refer to knowledge of one’s own subjective states simply as subjective knowledge. Following this definition, objective knowledge would be knowledge of anything other than one’s own subjective states.
One last prominent style of usage for terms related to objectivity deals with the nature of support a particular knowledge-claim has. “Objective knowledge” can designate a knowledge-claim having, roughly, the status of being fully supported or proven. Correspondingly, “subjective knowledge” might designate some unsupported or weakly supported knowledge-claim. It is more accurate to refer to these as objective and subjective judgments, rather than knowledge, but one should be on guard for the use of the term “knowledge” in this context. This usage fits with the general connotation for the term “objectivity” of solidity, trustworthiness, accuracy, impartiality, etc. The general connotation for many uses of “subjectivity” includes unreliability, bias, an incomplete (personal) perspective, etc.
“Objective judgment or belief” refers to a judgment or belief based on objectively strong supporting evidence, the sort of evidence that would be compelling for any rational being. A subjective judgment would then seem to be a judgment or belief supported by evidence that is compelling for some rational beings (subjects) but not compelling for others. It could also refer to a judgment based on evidence that is of necessity available only to some subjects.
These are the main uses for the terminology within philosophical discussions. Let’s examine some of the main epistemological issues regarding objectivity, presuming the aforementioned definitions of “objective reality” and “subjective reality.”
The subjective is characterized primarily by perceiving mind. The objective is characterized primarily by physical extension in space and time. The simplest sort of discrepancy between subjective judgment and objective reality is well illustrated by John Locke’s example of holding one hand in ice water and the other hand in hot water for a few moments. When one places both hands into a bucket of tepid water, one experiences competing subjective experiences of one and the same objective reality. One hand feels it as cold, the other feels it as hot. Thus, one perceiving mind can hold side-by-side clearly differing impressions of a single object. From this experience, it seems to follow that two different perceiving minds could have clearly differing impressions of a single object. That is, two people could put their hands into the bucket of water, one describing it as cold, the other describing it as hot. Or, more plausibly, two people could step outside, one describing the weather as chilly, the other describing it as pleasant.
We confront, then, an epistemological challenge to explain whether, and if so how, some subjective impressions can lead to knowledge of objective reality. A skeptic can contend that our knowledge is limited to the realm of our own subjective impressions, allowing us no knowledge of objective reality as it is in itself.
Measurement is allegedly a means to reach objective judgments, judgments having at least a high probability of expressing truth regarding objective reality. An objective judgment regarding the weather, in contrast to the competing subjective descriptions, would describe it as, say, 20°C (68°F). This judgment results from use of a measuring device. It is unlikely that the two perceiving subjects, using functioning thermometers, would have differing judgments about the outside air.
The example of two people giving differing reports about the weather (e.g., “chilly” vs. “pleasant”) illustrates that variation in different subjects’ judgments is a possible indicator of the subjectivity of their judgments. Agreement in different subjects’ judgments (20°C) is often taken to be indicative of objectivity. Philosophers commonly call this form of agreement “intersubjective agreement.” Does intersubjective agreement prove that there is objective truth? No, because having two or three or more perceiving subjects agreeing, for example, that it is very cold does not preclude the possibility of another perceiving subject claiming that it is not at all cold. Would we have a high likelihood of objective truth if we had intersubjective agreement among a large number of subjects? This line of reasoning seems promising, except for another observation from Locke about the possible discrepancies between subjective impressions and objective reality.
According to Locke’s distinction between primary and secondary qualities, some of our subjective impressions do not correspond to any objective reality in the thing perceived. Our perception of sound, for example, is nothing like the actual physical vibrations that we know are the real cause of our subjective experience. Our perception of color is nothing like the complex combinations of various frequencies of electromagnetic radiation that we know cause our perception of color. Locke asserts that we can, through science, come to know what primary characteristics the object has in itself. Science teaches us, he says, that sound as we perceive it is not in the object itself whereas spatial dimensions, mass, duration, motion, etc. are in the object itself.
In response to this point, one can assert that, through science, we discover that those subjective impressions corresponding to nothing in the object are nonetheless caused by the truly objective features of the object. Thus, Locke’s approach leads to optimism regarding objective knowledge, i.e., knowledge of how things are independent of our perceptions of them.
In response to Locke’s line of thinking, Immanuel Kant used the expression “Ding an sich” (the “thing-in-itself”) to designate pure objectivity. The Ding an sich is the object as it is in itself, independent of the features of any subjective perception of it. While Locke was optimistic about scientific knowledge of the true objective (primary) characteristics of things, Kant, influenced by skeptical arguments from David Hume, asserted that we can know nothing regarding the true nature of the Ding an sich, other than that it exists. Scientific knowledge, according to Kant, is systematic knowledge of the nature of things as they appear to us subjects rather than as they are in themselves.
Using Kant’s distinction, intersubjective agreement would seem to be not only the best evidence we can have of objective truth but constitutive of objective truth itself. (This might require a theoretically perfect intersubjective agreement under ideal conditions.) Starting from the assumption that we can have knowledge only of things as they appear in subjective experience, the only plausible sense for the term “objective” would be judgments for which there is universal intersubjective agreement, or just for which there is necessarily universal agreement. If, alternately, we decide to restrict the term “objective” to the Ding an sich, there would be, according to Kant, no objective knowledge. The notion of objectivity thus becomes useless, perhaps even meaningless (for, say, a verificationist).
Facing any brand of skepticism regarding knowledge of objective reality in any robust sense, we should note that the notion of there being an objective reality is independent of any particular assertion about our prospects for knowing that reality in any objective sense. One should, in other words, agree that the idea of some objective reality, existing as it is independent of any subjective perception of it, apparently makes sense even for one who holds little hope for any of us knowing that there is such a reality, or knowing anything objectively about such a reality. Perhaps our human situation is such that we cannot know anything beyond our experiences; perhaps we are, each one of us individually, confined to the theater of our own minds. Nonetheless, we can conceive what it means to assert an objective reality beyond the stream of our experiences.
Opposing skepticism regarding objective reality, it is conceivable that there are “markers” of some sort in our subjective experiences distinguishing the reliable perceptions of objective truth from the illusions generated purely subjectively (hallucinations, misperceptions, perceptions of secondary qualities, etc.). Descartes, for example, wrote of “clear and distinct impressions” as having an inherent mark, as it were, attesting to their reliability as indicators of how things are objectively. This idea does not have many defenders today, however, since Descartes asserted certainty for knowledge derived from clear and distinct ideas. More acceptable among philosophers today would be a more modest assertion of a high likelihood of reliability for subjective impressions bearing certain marks. The marks of reliable impressions are not “clear and distinct” in Descartes’ sense, but have some connection to common sense ideas about optimal perceptual circumstances. Thus, defenders of objective knowledge are well advised to search for subjectively accessible “marks” on impressions that indicate a high likelihood of truth.
A defender of the prospects for objective knowledge would apparently want also to give some significance to intersubjective agreement. Assertions of intersubjective agreement are based, of course, on one’s subjective impressions of other perceiving subjects agreeing with one’s own judgments. Thus, intersubjective agreement is just one type of “mark” one might use to identify the more likely reliable impressions. This is simple common-sense. We have much more confidence in our judgments (or should, anyway) when they are shared by virtually everyone with whom we discuss them than when others (showing every sign of normal perceptual abilities and a sane mind) disagree. A central assumption behind this common pattern of thought, however, is that there are indeed many other perceiving subjects besides ourselves and we are all capable, sometimes at least, of knowing objective reality. Another assumption is that objective reality is logically consistent. Assuming that reality is consistent, it follows that your and my logically incompatible judgments about a thing cannot both be true; intersubjective disagreement indicates error for at least one of us. One can also argue that agreement indicates probable truth, because it is unlikely that you and I would both be wrong in our judgment regarding an object and both be wrong in exactly the same way. Conversely, if we were both wrong about some object, it is likely that we would have differing incorrect judgments about it, since there are innumerable ways for us to make a wrong judgment about an object.
Despite plausible ways of arguing that intersubjective disagreement indicates error and agreement indicates some probability of truth, defenses of objective knowledge all face the philosophically daunting challenge of providing a cogent argument showing that any purported “mark” of reliability (including apparent intersubjective agreement) actually does confer a high likelihood of truth. The task seems to presuppose some method of determining objective truth in the very process of establishing certain sorts of subjective impressions as reliable indicators of truth. That is, we require some independent (non-subjective) way of determining which subjective impressions support knowledge of objective reality before we can find subjectively accessible “markers” of the reliable subjective impressions. What could such a method be, since every method of knowledge, judgment, or even thought seems quite clearly to go on within the realm of subjective impressions? One cannot get out of one’s subjective impressions, it seems, to test them for reliability. The prospects for knowledge of the objective world are hampered by our essential confinement within subjective impressions.
In metaphysics, i.e., the philosophical study of the nature of reality, the topic of objectivity brings up philosophical puzzles regarding the nature of the self, for a perceiving subject is also, according to most metaphysical theories, a potential object of someone else’s perceptions. Further, one can perceive oneself as an object, in addition to knowing one’s subjective states fairly directly. The self, then, is known both as subject and as object. Knowledge of self as subject seems to differ significantly from knowledge of the self as object.
The differences are most markedly in evidence in the philosophy of mind. Philosophers of mind try to reconcile, in some sense, what we know about the mind objectively and what we know subjectively. Observing minded beings as objects is central to the methods of psychology, sociology, and the sciences of the brain. Observing one minded being from the subjective point of view is something we all do, and it is central to our ordinary notions of the nature of mind. A fundamental problem for the philosophy of mind is to explain how any object, no matter how complex, can give rise to mind as we know it from the subjective point of view. That is, how can mere “stuff” give rise to the rich complexity of consciousness as we experience it? It seems quite conceivable that there be creatures exactly like us, when seen as objects, but having nothing like our conscious sense of ourselves as subjects. So there is the question of why we do have subjective conscious experience and how that comes to be. Philosophers also struggle to explain what sort of relationship might obtain between mind as we see it embodied objectively and mind as we experience it subjectively. Are there cause-and-effect relationships, for example, and how do they work?
The topic of seeing others and even oneself as an object in the objective world is a metaphysical issue, but it brings up an ethical issue regarding the treatment of persons. There are, in addition, special philosophical issues regarding assertions of objectivity in ethics.
First, the dual nature of persons as both subjects (having subjective experience) and objects within objective reality relates to one of the paramount theories of ethics in the history of philosophy. Immanuel Kant’s ethics gives a place of central importance to respect for persons. One formulation of his highly influential Categorical Imperative relates to the dual nature of persons. This version demands that one “treat humanity, in your own person or in the person of any other, never simply as a means, but always at the same time as an end” (Groundwork, p. 96). One may treat a mere object simply as a means to an end; one may use a piece of wood, for example, simply as a means of repairing a fence. A person, by contrast, is marked by subjectivity, having a subjective point of view, and has a special moral status according to Kant. Every person must be regarded as an end, that is as having intrinsic value. It seems that the inherent value of a person depends essentially on the fact that a person has a subjective conscious life in addition to objective existence.
This ethical distinction brings out an aspect of the term “object” as a “mere object,” in contrast to the subjectivity of a person. The term “objectivity” in this context can signify the mere “object-ness” of something at its moral status.
Despite widespread agreement that being a person with a subjective point of view has a special moral status, there is a general difficulty explaining whether this alleged fact, like all alleged moral facts, is an objective fact in any sense. It is also difficult to explain how one can know moral truths if they are indeed objective.
Philosophical theories about the nature of morality generally divide into assertions that moral truths express subjective states and assertions that moral truths express objective facts, analogous to the fact, for example, that the sun is more massive than the earth.
So-called subjectivist theories regard moral statements as declaring that certain facts hold, but the facts expressed are facts about a person’s subjective states. For example, the statement “It is wrong to ignore a person in distress if you are able to offer aid” just means something like “I find it offensive when someone ignores a person in distress….” This is a statement about the subject’s perceptions of the object, not about the object itself (that is, ignoring a person in distress). Objectivist theories, in contrast, regard the statement “It is wrong to ignore….” as stating a fact about the ignoring itself.
Subjectivist theories do not have to regard moral statements as statements about a single subject’s perceptions or feelings. A subjectivist could regard the statement “Torture is immoral,” for example, as merely expressing the feeling of abhorrence among members of a certain culture, or among people in general.
In addition to objectivism and subjectivism, a third major theory of morality called non-cognitivism asserts that alleged moral statements do not make any claim about any reality, either subjective or objective. This approach asserts that alleged moral statements are just expressions of subjective feelings; they are not reports about such feelings. Thus the statement “Torture is immoral” is equivalent to wincing or saying “ugh” at the thought of torture, rather than describing your feelings about torture.
Among objectivist theories of morality, the most straightforward version declares that is it an objective fact, for example, that it is wrong to ignore a person in distress if you are able to offer aid. This sort of theory asserts that the wrongness of such behavior is part of objective reality in the same way that the sun’s being more massive than the earth is part of objective reality. Both facts would obtain regardless of whether any conscious being ever came to know either of them.
Other objectivist theories of morality try to explain the widespread feeling that there is an important difference between moral assertions and descriptive, factual assertions while maintaining that both types of assertion are about something other than mere subjective states. Such theories compare moral assertions to assertions about secondary qualities. The declaration that a certain object is green is not merely a statement about a person’s subjective state. It makes an assertion about how the object is, but it’s an assertion that can be formulated only in relation to the states of perceiving subjects under the right conditions. Thus, determining whether an object is green depends essentially on consulting the considered judgments of appropriately placed perceivers. Being green, by definition, implies the capacity to affect perceiving humans under the right conditions in certain ways. By analogy, moral assertions can be assertions about how things objectively are while depending essentially on consulting the considered judgments of appropriately placed perceivers. Being morally wrong implies, on this view, the capacity to affect perceiving humans under the right conditions in certain ways.
For either sort of objectivist approach to morality, it is difficult to explain how people come to know the moral properties of things. We seem not to be able to know the moral qualities of things through ordinary sense experience, for example, because the five senses seem only to tell us how things are in the world, not how they ought to be. Nor can we reason from the way things are to the way they ought to be, since, as David Hume noted, “is” does not logically imply an “ought.” Some philosophers, including Hume, have postulated that we have a special mode of moral perception, analogous to but beyond the five ordinary senses, which gives us knowledge of moral facts. This proposal is controversial, since it presents problems for verifying moral perceptions and resolving moral disputes. It is also problematic as long as it provides no account of how moral perception works. By contrast, we have a good understanding of the mechanisms underlying our perception of secondary qualities such as greenness.
Many people assert that it is much less common to get widespread agreement on moral judgments than on matters of observable, measurable facts. Such an assertion seems to be an attempt to argue that moral judgments are not objective based on lack of intersubjective agreement about them. Widespread disagreement does not, however, indicate that there is no objective fact to be known. There are many examples of widespread disagreement regarding facts that are clearly objective. For example, there was once widespread disagreement about whether the universe is expanding or in a “steady state.” That disagreement did not indicate that there is no objective fact concerning the state of the universe. Thus, widespread disagreement regarding moral judgments would not, by itself, indicate that there are no objective moral facts.
This assertion is apparently an attempt to modify the inference from widespread intersubjective agreement to objective truth. If so, it is mistaken. Assuming that the inference from intersubjective agreement to probable objective truth is strong, it does not follow that one can infer from lack of intersubjective agreement to probable subjectivity. As previously indicated, intersubjective disagreement logically supports the assertion that there is an error in at least one of the conflicting judgments, but it does not support an assertion of the mere subjectivity of the matter being judged. Further, the vast areas of near-universal agreement in moral judgments typically receives too little attention in discussions of the nature of morality. There are seemingly innumerable moral judgments (e.g., it is wrong to needlessly inflict pain on a newborn baby) that enjoy nearly universal agreement across cultures and across time periods. This agreement should, at least prima facie, support an assertion to objectivity as it does for, say, judgments about the temperature outside.
Any serious study of the nature of objectivity and objective knowledge should examine the central metaphysical and epistemological positions of history’s leading philosophers, as well as contemporary contributions. The following very brief survey should give readers some idea of where to get started.
Plato is famous for a distinctive view of objective reality. He asserted roughly that the greatest reality was not in the ordinary physical objects we sense around us, but in what he calls Forms, or Ideas. (The Greek term Plato uses resembles the word “idea,” but it is preferable to call them Forms, for they are not ideas that exist only in a mind, as is suggested in our modern usage of the term “idea.”) Ordinary objects of our sense experience are real, but the Forms are a “higher reality,” according to Plato. Having the greatest reality, they are the only truly objective reality, we could say.
Forms are most simply described as the pure essences of things, or the defining characteristics of things. We see many varied instances of chairs around us, but the essence of what it is to be a chair is the Form “chair.” Likewise, we see many beautiful things around us, but the Form “beauty” is the “what it is to be beautiful.” The Form is simply whatever it is that sets beautiful things apart from everything else.
In epistemology, Plato accordingly distinguishes the highest knowledge as knowledge of the highest reality, the Forms. Our modern usage of the terms “objective knowledge” and “objective reality” seem to fit in reasonably well here.
Aristotle, by contrast, identifies the ordinary objects of sense experience as the most objective reality. He calls them “primary substance.” The forms of things he calls “secondary substance.” Hence, Aristotle’s metaphysics seems to fit better than Plato’s with our current understanding of objective reality, but his view of objective knowledge differs somewhat. For him, objective knowledge is knowledge of the forms, or essences, of things. We can know individual things objectively, but not perfectly. We can know individuals only during occurrent perceptual contact with them, but we can know forms perfectly, or timelessly.
Descartes famously emphasized that subjective reality is better known than objective reality, but knowledge of the objective reality of one’s own existence as a non-physical thinking thing is nearly as basic, or perhaps as basic, as one’s knowledge of the subjective reality of one’s own thinking. For Descartes, knowledge seems to start with immediate, indubitable knowledge of one’s subjective states and proceeds to knowledge of one’s objective existence as a thinking thing. Cogito, ergo sum (usually translated as “I think, therefore I am”) expresses this knowledge. All knowledge of realities other than oneself ultimately rests on this immediate knowledge of one’s own existence as a thinking thing. One’s existence as a non-physical thinking thing is an objective existence, but it appears that Descartes infers this existence from the subjective reality of his own thinking. The exact interpretation of his famous saying is still a matter of some controversy, however, and it may not express an inference at all.
We have already looked at some of John Locke’s most influential assertions about the nature of objective reality. Bishop Berkeley followed Locke’s empiricism in epistemology, but put forth a markedly different view of reality. Berkeley’s Idealism asserts that the only realities are minds and mental contents. He does, however, have a concept of objective reality. A table, for example, exists objectively in the mind of God. God creates objective reality by thinking it and sustains any objective reality, such as the table, only so long as he continues to think of it. Thus the table exists objectively for us, not just as a fleeting perception, but as the totality of all possible experiences of it. My particular experience of it at this moment is a subjective reality, but the table as an objective reality in the mind of God implies a totality of all possible experiences of it. Berkeley asserts there is no need to postulate some physical substance underlying all those experiences to be the objective reality of the table; the totality of possible experiences is adequate.
We have looked briefly at some of Kant’s claims about the nature of objective reality. More recent philosophy continues these discussions in many directions, some denying objectivity altogether. Detailed discussion of these movements goes beyond the purview of this essay, but interested readers should specially investigate Hegel’s idealism, as well as succeeding schools of thought such as phenomenology, existentialism, logical positivism, pragmatism, deconstructionism, and post-modernism. The philosophy of mind, naturally, also continually confronts basic questions of subjectivity and objectivity.
Dwayne H. Mulder
Sonoma State University
U. S. A.
Last updated: September 6, 2004 | Originally published: