In the minds of most philosophers with a passing familiarity with early-modern philosophy, occasionalism is typically regarded as a laughable ad hoc or ‘for want of anything better’ solution to the mind-body problem, first opened up in Descartes’ Meditations. As typically presented in philosophy textbooks, the doctrine (usually identified exclusively with Nicholas Malebranche) certainly seems laughable: beginning from the assumption that the actual transmission of anything between body and mind is impossible, occasionalism holds that, for example, when my finger is pricked by a needle, no physical effect—neither the puncture of the needle nor the activity of my nerves—reaches my mind, but rather God directly produces the sensation of the prick within my mind on the occasion of the needle’s contact with my finger. Similarly, when I will to retract my finger away from the needle, my incorporeal will is utterly impotent to produce any such corporeal movement, so God again intercedes and directly produces the movement of the finger on the occasion of my willing.
Such supposedly was the doctrine of occasionalism, which, when presented in such a manner, occasions little more than an eye-roll from modern readers. Yet, this “textbook view” of occasionalism (much like the contemporary fixation on Descartes’ Meditations over his Principles of Philosophy) has everything to do with the interests, problems, and concerns of philosophy in the late and post-modern periods, and almost nothing to do with the actual doctrine of occasionalism in its own historical context. Indeed, occasionalism is not peculiar to early-modern philosophy or Cartesianism at all, but was an influential school in both Latin and Islamic medieval philosophy extending back to the tenth century. Moreover, for a strange and systematically theological system of metaphysics, occasionalism is the progenitor of a number of remarkable developments in Western philosophy, some of which laid the foundation for the development of modern science itself.
In spite of its historical deficiencies, the aforementioned “textbook view” of occasionalism was not entirely off the mark. The Cartesian occasionalists generally—but not exclusively—made appeal to the doctrine as a solution to the problem of mind-body interaction. Moreover, this interpretation actually has its origins in the period itself. Both G. W. Leibniz and Bernard le Bovier de Fontenelle notably described occasionalism as primarily a reaction to Descartes’ failure to explain the mind-body union (See Leibniz, “to Arnauld, 9 Oct. 1687,” Philosophical Papers, 522; Fontenelle, Doutes, 1:529-30). Nonetheless, Leibniz and Fontenelle were mistaken in their interpretations. As the first true Cartesian occasionalist, Louis de La Forge, argues:
I think most people would not believe me if I said that it is no more difficult to conceive how the human mind, without being extended, can move the body and how the body without being a spiritual thing can act on the mind, and to conceive how a body has the power to move itself and to communicate motion to another body. Yet there is nothing more true. (Traité, 143)
While the commitments of individual philosophers varied, in its pure form, occasionalism was a global denial of causality outside the direct and immediate volitional activity of God—both between bodies and between minds and bodies.
This is important to note as it forms the locus of the distinction between three classic metaphysical models of the causal relationship between God and his Creation: occasionalism, concurrentism, conservationism. Conservationism can best be described as the common view among the lay followers of the Abrahamic faith, as Malebranche himself notes (Recherche, 677). It holds that God created the world in the beginning, but that since that moment and with the exception of miracles, the world runs causally of its own accord and on the basis of its own powers and principles, without the need for God to be continually and perpetually involved. In spite of its mass appeal, conservationism was almost never taken seriously by Christian or Islamic theologians and was denounced as heretical for a variety of reasons that need not concern us here, for the much more important historical distinction was between concurrentism and occasionalism. Owing it origins to Augustine, concurrentism became the causal metaphysic of St. Thomas Aquinas and his legion followers. It holds that both God and finite created causes contribute to the production of particular effects, namely that God “concurs” or assents to the natural activity of the cause and thereby contributes his potency to the production of its effects, without which such a cause would be impotent and incapable of producing its customary effect. Occasionalism, by contrast, holds that finite creatures are utterly impotent by themselves, contribute nothing metaphysically to the production of any effects to which they may be associated, but instead serve only as merely nominal indicators or occasions for the one sole cause in the universe: God. Thus, while Aquinas’ account of the regular operations of nature is grounded in a grand system of agent causes and their patients, for the occasionalist, the regular operations of nature are governed by a system of occasional causes that cohere only on the basis of the regularity of God’s will concerning them.
This raises the question: What exactly is an occasional cause? One example would be a placebo, a designation that could be applied to almost anything, but is understood as such insofar as it serves as the cause of the “placebo effect.” Yet, as has been noted in clinical analyses of the placebo effect, this causal conception is clearly mistaken insofar as a placebo is typically an inert compound or pointless “therapy” that does not actually cause anything in particular, much less its salutary effect. Nonetheless, without the presence and administration of the placebo, the effect would not follow, or not follow as often as it does, and thus a placebo may be understood as an indispensable cause that serves as the occasion for whatever psycho-physical causality that takes place in the body which produces the placebo effect.
So then, what does an occasionalist metaphysic and account of causality look like? Well, to begin with the classic example of mind-body interaction described in the summary: when I look out the window of my office, there is no real causal connection between the clouds and sky as physical objects and the representative idea I have of them in my mind; rather, God immediately and directly produces such a correspondent image in my mind upon the occasion of me turning my head and looking out the window at them. Similarly, there is no real causal connection between the activity of my will to turn my head to the right and look out my window and the physical action of my head turning; for my head moves on the basis of the physical contraction of opposing muscle groups in my neck, which pull on and rotate my cervical vertebrae, thereby effecting the turn. Moreover, for reasons that will be seen, there is no real causal connection between the contraction of these muscles and the movement of my head; rather, God immediately and directly produces the movement of my head on the occasion of the contraction of the muscles in my neck, which are similarly produced by him on the occasion of my will to turn my head to the right.
This elaborate metaphysical and theological description of such a simple action raises the question: Why would any philosopher advance such a bizarre and counter-intuitive theory to explain such basic phenomena?
Given the customary prejudice of philosophers towards occasionalism (supposing they’ve heard of it at all), it is necessary to consider the motivation(s) underlying such a strange doctrine, which nonetheless attracted many of the greatest minds of medieval and early-modern philosophy.
The main figures behind the development of occasionalist thought in the Middle Ages were, as might be expected, concerned predominantly with theological issues. Numerous passages in the Old and New Testament are ambiguously suggestive of an occasionalist reading, such as Job 38:12-41, 1 Corinthians 12:6, and Isaiah 26:12. To quote one passage, cited by Malebranche in favor of occasionalism: “This is what the Lord, your protector, says, the one who formed you in the womb: ‘I am the Lord, who made everything, who alone stretched out the sky, who fashioned the earth all by myself’” (Isaiah 44:22). The important part of this quote is not the claim of God (even the conservationists accepted that God acted alone in the moment of creation), but rather Isaiah’s claim that, as Malebranche puts it, “only God acts and forms children in their mother’s womb” (Recherche, 677).
However, such Scriptural testimony was far too ambiguous to inspire or justify occasionalism on its own terms. Rather, occasionalism was born of a dispute centered on the deeply problematic relationship between Greek rationalist philosophy and the dogmas of the Abrahamic religions that seemed incommensurable with this tradition, namely the doctrine of creation ex nihilo and the possibility of miracles. There was a pervasive tendency in later antiquity among those educated in Greek philosophy to be embarrassed by the “abominations of reason,” latent in their religious creeds, which impelled them to attempt a synthesis. These attempts to harmonize Abrahamic monotheism with the philosophy of the pagans invariably provoked a reaction from their less philosophically inclined co-religionists who sought to uphold the dogmas of the Faith without intellectual rationalizations or prevarications. These reactions divide into two almost diametrically opposed camps corresponding to the two great bursts of occasionalist thought in the history of philosophy.
In the Islamic tradition, the thought of the Arab polymath and father of Islamic philosophy, al-Kindi (801-873), marks the tentative beginning of a syncretism of Islam and Greek philosophy. This syncretism was further developed in the 9th and 10th centuries by a school of philosophers known as the Mu’tazalites, the premiere representatives of whom were al-Farabi (c. 872-950) and Avicenna (c. 980-1037). The metaphysical system of the Mu’tazalites was a hybrid of Aristotelianism and Neoplatonism typical of late-antiquity. Though al-Farabi and Avicenna remained nominal Muslims, their rationalist philosophical beliefs stood at considerable odds with the depiction of God and his relation to the world in the Qur’an: most notably, their critics accused them of denying the Abrahamic doctrine of creation ex nihilo and being incapable, on account of their necessitarian conception of causality, to explain the existence or possibility of miracles.
This latter issue over miracles in particular attracted the ire of certain Islamic theologians who were followers of a fundamentalist school begun in the early 10th century by al-Ash’ari (874-936), the most illustrious member of whom was al-Ghazali (1058-1111). The Mutazalites held, in customary rationalist manner, that causes are logically sufficient for the production of their effects and thus entail their existence in an essentially logical and syllogistic manner. While any particular cause (for example fire) may not be in-itself sufficient for the production of its effect (namely burning), given the presence of certain necessary conditions (for example air, and combustible substrate), the effect would follow necessarily from the presence and existence of the cause. That is to say, for fire and a combustible material to be brought together in the presence of oxygen, yet fail to produce burning, was regarded as a logical impossibility tantamount to a formal contradiction.
The objection of the Ash’irites to this principle is not difficult to understand: a natural order that operates on the basis of causes that logically necessitate their effects cannot be reconciled with the existence of miracles, which, as attested to in Holy Scripture, often depend on such an “impossible” disjunction between cause and effect. For example, there is the famous example of the “Burning Bush” from Exodus 3:1-21, which describes a combustible material that is on fire, but was not consumed by the flames. Another example is a story from the Book of Daniel of the three youths (Abednego, Meshach, and Shadrach) who were thrown into Nebuchadnezzar’s “Fiery Furnace,” yet miraculously escaped burning due to interference by an angel of God. Miracles such as these were interpreted literally by Ash’irite theologians and regarded as involving the presence of a natural cause but the absence of its customary effect due to a supernatural intervention by God.
This disjunction of causes and effects in instances of miracles was not itself problematic as long as Jews, Christians, and Muslims believed that God could do the impossible. Yet, such an interpretation of the divine omnipotence was strongly resisted by almost every important theologian of the Abrahamic religions and the orthodox conception of the limits of God’s power was identified as coextensive with the logically possible. To quote the Islamic theologian, al-Ghazali: “No one has power over the Impossible. What the Impossible means is the affirmation of something together with its denial…that which is not impossible is within [God’s] power” (Tahafut, 194). This is a very important point for it requires that, if miracles such as the above did indeed happen, they must have been—pace the assertion of ancient philosophers—logically possible on their own terms. Thus, the concession that God cannot do the impossible puts the onus on the believer in miracles to explain how such causal syncopations are possible. That is to say, it requires the believer to do philosophy—critical analytic philosophy—and thereby defeat the ancient philosophers at their own game.
This Islamic dispute was transferred essentially wholesale to the West through Averroës and Maimonidies in the 12th century and formed the basis of the nominalist reaction against Thomistic scholasticism, which they regarded as being similarly necessitarian and incompatible with the divine omnipotence.
By the time of Descartes, the nature of the occasionalist impulse had changed dramatically. Nowhere among the Cartesian occasionalists does one encounter the deep concern over the divine omnipotence or for reconciling philosophy with the testimony of Scripture typical of the Medievals. Even Malebranche, who—alone among his cohort—offered a few (weak) theological arguments in favor of occasionalism, never seemed bothered by the particular theological concerns of his medieval predecessors, even though—again, alone among his cohort—he demonstrated familiarity with them (See LO, 680). Instead, Cartesian occasionalism was a tendency and development organic to Cartesianism itself, which the successors of Descartes were driven to pursue exclusively under the pressure of severe problems in the Cartesian systems of physics and metaphysics and not from any particular religious motivation. These pressures included:
The Mind-Body Problem
This problem, while hardly unique to Descartes, was nonetheless forced by his substance dualism into a more radical and metaphysical framework than had been the case otherwise. Now, as noted in the introduction, the classic textbook view of occasionalism as an ad hoc solution to Descartes’ mind-body problem is almost entirely without warrant. Nonetheless, the mind-body problem was a particular area of concern for Descartes’ successors and occasionalism provided such a convenient solution that this “textbook” view took hold with considerable facility. Nonetheless, Steven Nadler argues that the mind-body problem was not a “specific” problem engendering Cartesian occasionalism and moreover “was not even recognized as a special case of some more general causal problem” (Nadler, 1997, 76). For the Cartesians, the nature of efficient causality was a metaphysical problem in itself.
The Rejection of Scholastic Forms and Causal Powers
Descartes describes the substantial forms of the Scholastics as having been “introduced by philosophers solely to account for the proper actions of natural things, of which they were supposed to be the principles and bases” (CSMK III, 208). Yet, Descartes is adamant that “no natural action at all can be explained by these substantial forms,” insofar as they “account” for the “proper actions of natural things” by metaphysical reification rather than epistemological explanation. They are thus “occult” and inscrutable (CSMK III, 208-9), and moreover otiose and redundant as explanations of phenomena, which, as Descartes is adamant, may be entirely accounted for in terms of local movements (CSM I, 83).
This mechanistic account of causal interaction allowed for a novel argument against the possibility of corporeal efficacy, which follows from Descartes’ rejection of substantial forms combined with his insistence that the qualities of body are exhausted by their mere geometric extension and whatever minimal features may be directly derived from as much. The point is, nowhere contained in the purely quantitative idea of extension is any notion of qualitative powers, forms, disposition, potentialities, and the like, from which it may be concluded that matter was essentially passive and inert.
Unlike the Scholastics who regarded motion to be an accident, the Cartesians regarded motion to be a mode of body—thereby denying the Scholastic presumption of a metaphysically real distinction between a thing and its qualities, and instead insisting that there was no ontological difference between the “modes of being [façons d’ être]” of a thing and the thing itself (Lennon, 1974, 34). Given this, it would be as impossible to conceive a body transferring its motion to another body as it would be possible to conceive a body transferring its shape or divisibility to another body.
Lastly, there is Descartes’ acceptance and advancement of the doctrine that God preserves the world via continual creation (See CSM II, 33; CSM I, 200). This was a customary supposition of occasionalism since al-Ghazali and the Ash’irite occasionalists. While Descartes’ commitment to this doctrine is insufficiently distinct from what might be maintained by a Thomistic concurrentist to qualify incontrovertibly as occasionalism, his successors would interpret the matter more forcefully and in a manner that rendered the concurrence of secondary causes otiose.
Throughout the seven centuries of its history, occasionalist philosophy has been advanced and defended through a plethora of different arguments. Remarkably, there does not seem to be any particular “master argument” that appears across all the figures in this tradition. Certain arguments are more common or carried greater cache than others, but occasionalism was never an axiomatic system of metaphysics, and thus the principles and arguments behind it are more of a liquid coacervate than a structured edifice. Some of the strongest and most common arguments made against the efficacy of secondary causes and in favor of the system of occasional causes shall be examined here.
In observing a particular causal interaction, one does not see the actual causality underlying the interaction, but only a succession of events. This claim is most commonly identified with Hume, but it is actually of considerable antiquity and has often stood as the opening gambit of occasionalism since its very beginning. It was first advanced by al-Baqillani in the 10th century and reiterated by al-Ghazali, who argues:
Fire, which is an inanimate thing, has no action. How can one prove that it is an agent? The only argument is from the observation of the fact of burning at the time of contact with fire. But observation only shows that one is with the other, not that it is by it and has no other cause than it. (Tahafut, 186)
Virtually every philosopher associated with occasionalism would repeat this argument in some form or another. Even after the disappearance of medieval occasionalism in the 15th and 16th centuries, the argument would resurface among the earliest of the Cartesian occasionalists, Louis de La Forge (1632-1666) and Géraud de Cordemoy (1624-1684). La Forge notes:
I will be told, is it not clear and evident that heavy things move downwards, that light things rise upwards, and that bodies communicate their motion to one another? I agree, but there is a big difference between the obviousness of the effect and that of the cause. The effect is very clear here, for what do our senses show use more clearly than the various movements of bodies? But do they show us the force which carries heavy things downwards, light things upwards, and how one body has the power to make another body move? (Traité, 143; emphasis added)
Cordemoy concurs and reformulates the argument in more classically Cartesian terms, namely concerning colliding bodies:
When we say, for example, that body B drives body C away from its place, if we examine well what is acknowledged for certain in this case, we will only see that body B was moved, that it encountered C, which was at rest, and that since this encounter, the first ceased to be moved [and] the second commenced to be. (Discernement, 137; trans. Albondi, 59)
This is the formula of which Hume is typically given credit.
The rejection of ‘forces’ or ‘powers’ internal to a particular piece of matter follows empirically from the above denial that we can actually see causation, as well as rationally from the argument, made in antiquity by Sextus Empiricus: “since…so much divergency is shown to exist in objects, we shall not be able to state what character belongs to the object in respect of its real essence, but only what belongs to it in respect of this particular rule of conduct, or law, or habit, and so on” (Outlines of Pyrrhonism, I. XIV, 163). Avicenna attempted to respond to this point by developing a claim made by Aristotle (See Physics 196b) that postulates an inductive “hidden syllogism” [qiyas khafiyy] tacit within causal judgments that allows for the inference of causal powers:
A tested experience is exemplified by our judgment that scammony purges bile. For when this [observed association] is repeated many times, it no longer belongs to the category of what occurs coincidentally. The mind then judges that it is of the nature of scammony to purge bile, and it acquiesces in it. Thus, purging bile is a necessary accident of scammony…and [scammony] necessitates it [the effect of purging bile] by some proximate power within it, or property in it, or a relation connected with it. It becomes correct [to conclude] through this kind of demonstration that there is a cause in scammony by nature and associated with it, which purges bile. (al-Burhan, 95; trans. Kogan, 87-88)
Avicenna’s ambiguity regarding the correct conclusion of this “demonstration” and the source of necessity between scammony and its purgative power is revealing, particularly in his indecisive conflation of “a cause in scammony by nature” with one merely “associated with it.”
Al-Ghazali seizes on this ambiguity and declares that Avicenna’s “kind of demonstration” underlying causal judgments is not a demonstration at all for it lacks any entailment: “existence with a thing does not prove being by it” (Tahafut, 186). To prove this point, al-Ghazali provides an example:
Suppose there is a blind man whose eyes are diseased, and who has not heard from anyone of the difference between night and day. If one day his disease is cured, and he can consequently see colours, he will guess that the agent of the perception of the forms of colours which has now been acquired by his eyes is the opening of the eyes. (Tahafut, 186)
This particular argument is essentially identical to Hume’s famous example in the Enquiry concerning the causal expectations of Adam when encountering fire and water for the first time (See Enquiry, VI.2, 27).
The Cartesians regarded suppositions of ‘force’ or ‘power’ inhering in bodies as occult properties incapable of being clearly and distinctly understood. Following Descartes, they regarded material bodies as effectively hypostatizations of Euclidian geometry, the qualities of which are exhausted by their mere geometric extension and whatever minimal features may be directly derived from as much. The point is, for the Cartesians, we have a clear and distinct idea of the essence of body as res extensa. Nowhere contained in this purely quantitative idea is any notion of qualitative powers, forms, disposition, potentialities, and the like. As Malebranche asks the reader:
Consult the idea of extension and judge by that idea, which represents bodies if anything does, whether they can have some property other than the passive faculty of receiving various shapes and various motions. Is it not evident to the last degree that properties of extension can consist only in relations of distance? (Dialouges, VII.2 147)
From this minimalist and quantitative conception of matter, the Cartesians concluded that matter was existentially passive and inert and derided the Scholastic-Aristotelian epistemology of causal explanation as fundamentally animistic—a point that seems evident in Aquinas’ claim:
[Real relations exist in] those things which by their own very nature are ordered to each other, and have a mutual inclination…as in a heavy body is found an inclination and order to the centre; and hence there exists in the heavy body a certain respect in regard to the centre and the same applies to other things. (Summa theologica, 1, q. 28, a. 1)
This physics based on internal “inclinations” Descartes categorically rejected, noting that his youthful conception of gravity was based on a (typically Scholastic) equivocation between notions of mind and notions of body:
[W]hat makes it especially clear that my idea of gravity was taken largely from the idea I have of the mind is the fact that I thought that gravity carried bodies towards the centre of the earth as if it had some knowledge of the centre within itself. For this surely could not happen without knowledge, and there can be no knowledge except in a mind. (CSM II, 298. See also: “Letter to Mersenne,” CSMK III 216 and “Letter to Arnauld,” CSMK III 358.)
Descartes’ argument here became a major argument in favor of occasionalism among his successors, particularly by Malebranche, whose mouthpiece in the Dialogues on Metaphysics and on Religion instructs:
Contemplate the archetype of bodies, intelligible extension. This represents them since it is in accordance with it that they all have been made. This idea is entirely luminous…Do you not see clearly that bodies can be moved but they cannot move themselves? You hesitate. Well then, let us suppose that this chair can move itself: Which way will it go? With what velocity? At what time will it take it into its head to move? You would have to give the chair an intellect and a will capable of determining itself…Otherwise, a power of moving itself would be of no use at all to it. (Dialogues, VII, 151; emphasis added)
Malebranche’s claim here is essentially: to ascribe active powers to something that is defined only in terms of geometric extension is like ascribing ‘jealousy’ to a cardboard box. This conclusion is in line with the standard Cartesian accusation against Aristotelianism, namely that, even when stripped of any supposition of final causality, Aristotelian causal explanation inherently projects what are effectively intentional states onto otherwise inanimate objects.
Moreover, the particular argument Malebranche employs to make his point—while novel amongst the Cartesians—is very old indeed. Parmenides famously argued against the possibility of creation by asking: “…what creation wilt thou seek for [what is]? How and whence did it grow? I [shall not] allow thee to say or to think, ‘from that which is not’; for…what need would have driven it on to grow, starting from nothing, at a later time rather than an earlier?” (Simplicus, Commentary on the Physics, 145; Kirk & Raven 347) To this al-Ghazali responded that only inanimate creatures not possessed of a will are strictly subject to the principle of sufficient reason, such “that fire is so created that when it finds two pieces of cotton which are similar, it will burn both of them, as it cannot discriminate between two similar things” (Tahafut, 190). Given their enslavement to the principle of sufficient reason, creatures lacking a will are incapable of self-initiated movement for it would be impossible for them to decide to move in one direction rather than another, or do so at one moment rather than another, given that all points in space and time are qualitatively identical, and thus—in terms of the order of possible reasons—indifferent. Thus al-Ghazali concludes that all change must be initiated by a will with metaphysical capacity to choose and act arbitrarily, thereby distinguishing and picking between identicals differing only by number (Tahafut, 24-7).
This voluntarist reasoning Malebranche weaves into the Cartesian rubric, concluding:
It is clear that no body, large or small, has the power to move itself…We have only two sorts of ideas, ideas of minds and ideas of bodies; and as we should speak only of what we conceive, we should only reason according to these two kinds of ideas. Thus, since the idea we have of all bodies makes us aware that they cannot move themselves, it must be concluded that it is minds which move them. (Recherche, 448)
Yet Malebranche flatly denies that finite human minds have any such capacity to generate movement, insisting that we “have no clear idea of this power soul has over the body” (Ibid., 670). He justifies this claim first on empirical grounds, arguing that, were one to claim:
I know through the inner sensation of my action that I truly have this power…I [would] reply that when they move their arm they have an inner sensation of the actual volition by which they move it; and they are not mistaken in believing that they have this volition…I grant that they have an inner sensation that the arm is moved during the effort; and on this assumption I also agree…that the movement of the arm occurs at the instant we feel this effort…But I deny that this effort, which is only a modification or sensation of the soul…is by itself able to impart motion to the animal spirits, or to determine them. (Ibid.)
The argument that cause and effect share no necessary connection between them began with al-Ghazali’s coruscating insight that “the connection between what are believed to be the cause and the effect is not necessary. Take any two things. This is not That; nor can That be This” (Tahafut, 185). This point has both an epistemological and a logico-ontological prongs. The former hinges on what Hume called the “establish’d maxim”: Supposing we have a complete understanding of the quiddities of, say, fire and cotton, al-Ghazali asks: “how can we conceive that one of them should burn, and the other should not? There is no alternative for the other piece” (Tahafut, 188). That is to say, the very fact that cause and effect are epistemologically distinct means that we can always consider the one without the other; and subject to that mere possibility, no logically necessary relation can exist between the two.
The deeper logico-existential prong of al-Ghazali’s “This is not That” insight, which Hume never truly grasped, hinges on the very nature of identity and logical connection itself. A door had been conveniently opened by Avicenna, who insisted that the hallmark of efficient causes is their ontological distinctness from their effects (Metaphysics, 173). Al-Ghazali follows Avicenna on this point, but then poses the question: what does this ontological distinctness entail? A necessary connection requires that one event is logically bound to another, such that the cause is sufficient (given the fulfillment of certain necessary conditions) to bring about the effect. Yet how is this logical connection possible? “This is not That” precisely because two distinct things, as distinct things, cannot be bound of themselves by any necessary connection: “The affirmation of one does not imply the affirmation of the other; nor does its denial imply the denial of the other. The existence of the one is not necessitated by the existence of the other; nor its non-existence by the non-existence of the other” (Tahafut, 185). For example, it is impossible to conceive of a dog while not also conceiving of an animal precisely because there is a necessary relationship between the two — the antecedent entails the consequent as a modus ponens. This is the type of standard that relations of necessity demand. Yet, the relationship between the concept ‘dog’ and the concept ‘animal’ is not causal but rather definitional, the predicate being contained in the subject. Causation, on the other hand, is not a definitional relationship, but rather one that takes place between two otherwise discrete things, and thus cannot include under it any notion of necessity. The occasionalist conclusion he draws from this is that, if two distinct events are to be necessarily conjoined, they can only be so “as the result of the Decree of God, which preceded their existence. If one follows the other, it is because He has created them in that fashion, not because the connection in itself is necessary and indissoluble” (Tahafut, 185; emphasis added).
This principle of al-Ghazali’s, namely that the logical non-identity of cause and effect logically precludes any necessary connection between them, was rigorously and systematically developed by the fourteenth century nominalists William of Ockham and Nicholaus of Autrecourt, forming the touchstone of their skeptical attacks on the Peripatetic scholasticism that had taken over Western philosophy and theology following the work of William of Auvergne and Aquinas in the previous century. It was the Aristotelian conception of ontology as an active, pluralistic, and substantial structure composed of both things as well as real principles internal to them—principles that define the natural order in a deep, interwoven, and rational way, so as to provide philosophy direct access to this order as well as the possibility of offering a systematic and all-encompassing explanation of its operations—that was the primary object of the nominalists’ ire. By contrast, the nominalists regarded the Real as composed of discrete individual singulars.
Ockham paved new ground in the epistemology of causal explanation due to his almost obsessive concern over the divine omnipotence and the possibility of divine interference in any particular instance of cause and effect. If, as Ockham and the “theologians” declared: “Whatever God can produce by means of secondary causes, He can directly produce and preserve without them” (OTh 9: 604.17-20; Philosophical Writings, 25), then it follows that God can create an effect without any antecedent cause and, more importantly, an antecedent ‘cause’ without any consequent effect. Thus the standard of necessary connection, by which the effect must follow from its cause, collapses, and thus inference from one to the other lacks demonstrative warrant:
Between a cause and its effect is a particularly essential order and dependence; nevertheless, the simple knowledge of some one thing does not entail the simple knowledge of some other thing. This is also something that everyone experiences within himself; however perfectly he may know a particular thing, he will never be able to know, with simple and proper knowledge, another thing which he has never previously experienced, either by sensation or intellect. (OTh 1: 241.15-21; translation is the author’s)
Moreover, it is impossible to know, logically or empirically, if God produces any particular effect directly or through secondary causes. That is to say, using occasionalist terminology, if b can be produced by God directly without a, we can never know in any given instance of a followed by b if a actually caused b, if a was merely the occasion for b, or if the two are even connected at all:
[I]t cannot be demonstrated that any effect is produced by a secondary cause, because even though fire always follows when fire is brought close to combustible material, it is possible that the fire is not the cause. For God could have ordained that he alone caused combustion whenever fire is present to a patient close by, just as he has ordained with the Church that when certain words are spoken grace is caused in the soul. (OTh 5:72.21)
Given such an epistemological gap, the positive metaphysical concept of causation collapses and all we are left with is a phenomenal account resting on repeated observation and the continuity of nature.
Ockham had defined an efficient cause in his Summula philosophiae naturalis as “that at whose real existence something has a new different being completely distinct from that cause” (OPh 6: 218.26). Yet, he failed to appreciate the full logical force of this definition. This was left to his successor, Nicholaus of Autrecourt. Autrecourt was adamant that it is impossible to reason from the existence of causal activity of one thing to the existence or effect receptivity of another thing, for: “‘From the fact that some thing is known to be, it cannot be inferred evidently, by evidentness reduced to the first principle, or to the certitude of the first principle, that there is some other thing’…[for] ‘In such an inference…the consequent would not be factually identical with the antecedent’” (Letter to Bernard, §11). Given such a factual non-identity, “the opposite of the consequent would be compatible with whatever is signified by the antecedent, without contradiction” (Letter to Bernard, §15). Autrecourt applies this logical principle directly to the issue of causal explanation, arguing against Duns Scotus that repeated and infallible experience of a conjunction between two things is not demonstrative of the fact that one is the effect of the other:
[O]nly conjecturative habit [habitus conjecturativus], not certainty, is had concerning things known by experience, in the way in which it is said that rhubarb cures cholera, or that a magnet attracts iron. When it is proven [namely by Scotus] that certitude [comes] from the proposition existing in the mind which states that what is usually produced by a non-free cause is its natural effect, I ask what you call a natural cause. A cause which has produced what has happened usually, and which will still produce in the future if [the cause] lasts and is applied? Then the minor premise is not known. Even if something has been produced usually, it is still not certain whether it must be produced in the future. (Exigit, 237)
While neither Ockham nor Autrecourt pursued their causal skepticism into occasionalism, Autrecourt notably acknowledges occasionalism as a possibility. Among the claims that he was forced to retract by the Papal Curia in Avignon were the assertions that “we do not evidently know that anything other than God can be the cause of some effect,” and “we do not evidently know that any cause which is not God to act as an efficient cause” (Quattor atriculi confessati, §§15-18).
Among the Cartesian occasionalists, Malebranche was the only one to employ the ‘no necessary connection’ argument in favor of occasionalism, which Leibniz deemed his “strongest argument for why God alone acts” (Malebranche et Leibniz, 412; trans. by Sleigh, 171). Malebranche avers: “A true cause as I understand it is one such that the mind perceives a necessary connection [liaison nécessaire] between it and its effect” (Recherche, 450). On this basis he concludes:
It is clear that no body, large or small, has the power to move itself…Thus, since the idea we have of all bodies makes us aware that they cannot move themselves, it must be concluded that it is minds which move them. But when we examine our idea of all finite minds, we do not see any necessary connection between their will and the motion of any body whatsoever. On the contrary, we see that there is none and that there can be none.” (Ibid., 670; emphasis added)
Give the utter impotence of bodies vis-à-vis motion, it is obvious by elimination that, if they are moved, they must get such movement from a mind. Yet, by the same reasoning, Malebranche has also shown that this movement cannot come from any finite human mind, for the dictates of such minds are not necessarily connected with their intended effects. There is only one mind that has the power to forge a necessary connection between that which it wills and the effect the will produces:
But when one thinks about the idea of God, i.e., of an infinitely perfect and consequently all-powerful being, one know there is such a connection between His will and the motion of all bodies, that it is impossible to conceive that He wills a body to be moved and that this body not be moved. We must therefore say that only His will can move bodies if we wish to state things as we conceive them and not as we sense them. (Ibid., 448)
Continual creation is a metaphysico-theological doctrine concerning God’s relation to the Creation which maintains that the ontological permanence of the Creation is derived not from itself, but rather through God’s continual volitional preservation of it via the same power from which he created it ex nihilo in the beginning.
Biblical support for the doctrine of continual creation stemmed primarily from John 5:17 and Acts 17:28. Regarding the former, Jesus was persecuted by the Jews for performing works on the Sabbath, to which he responded: “My Father is always working, and so am I.” This passage was cited by Augustine in support of his argument that the biblical claim that God “rests” on the seventh day of creation should not be taken to mean a complete inactivity vis-à-vis the creation, but only rests “in the sense of not creating any new creature” (De genesi ad lit., 4.12). Thus Augustine concludes that:
[E]ven on the seventh day His power ceased not from ruling heaven and earth and all that He had made, for otherwise they would have perished immediately. For the power and might of the Creator, who rules and embraces all, makes every creature abide; and if this power ever ceased to govern creatures, their essences would pass away and all nature would perish. When a builder puts up a house and departs, his work remains in spite of the fact that he is no longer there. But the universe will pass away in the twinkling of an eye if God withdraws His ruling hand. (Summa contra gentiles, 3.65)
Augustine’s understanding of the metaphysics of divine preservation here is obviously nascent, but he is clear on one matter: God need not act in order for the Creation to be extinguished into non-being, but rather merely cease his continual “work.”
This principle became the foundation of the ‘preservation is but continual creation’ doctrine held by both the Thomistic concurrentists and Islamic occasionalists. In the case of the former, Aquinas approvingly quotes Augustine in defense of the doctrine and reiterates the claim that: “Were God to annihilate, it would not be through some action, but through cessation from action” (Summa theologiae, 1a. 104, 3). On this point Aquinas and the Islamic occasionalists were in full agreement; their main disagreement lay in whether or not God’s “work” in preserving the world was metaphysically continuous or discrete. Aquinas followed the Neoplatonic emanationist tradition in siding with the former conception, while the Islamic occasionalists argued for the latter. As Aquinas himself describes their reasoning: “in order to be able to maintain that the world needs to be preserved by God,” they held “that all forms are accidents, and that no accident lasts for two instants, so that things would always be in the process of formation” (Summa contra gentiles, 3.65). The reason for the divergence is that, while both were in agreement as to the metaphysics of annihilation and maintained that “existence is not the nature or essence of any created thing” (Ibid.), the Islamic occasionalists took this principle (along with the identification of divine preservation with creation ex nihilo) to a much more radical conclusion, arguing that finite creatures are inherently driven to non-being by themselves. (Guide, 109a). God’s will is simple and singular: He wills to create a world of things; these things do not have existence as part of their essence; therefore, they immediately vanish into non-being the moment after their creation, upon which God preserves them by recreating them again from the very nothing into which they had vanished (Ibid.).
The upshot of this metaphysic is a static punctiform ontology in which the very notions of “substance” or “natures,” upon which Aristotelian physics and metaphysics is based, collapse. Finite creatures are rendered fragmented shadows of being whose particular features are utterly contingent and the product of mere temporal congruence rather than from any substance ontology. As Maimonides explains, from this doctrine, the Islamic occasionalists denied that “there is a nature in any respect whatever and that the nature of one particular body may require that this and that accident be attached to that body. Quite the contrary, they wish to say that God…created the accidents in question now, without the intermediary of nature—without any other thing” (Guide, 109b). Under such a cinematographic ontology, then, the notion that particular finite creatures could cause effects in other finite creatures is unintelligible, for the world exists as a seriatim of static time slices, each of which are intersticed by vacua of non-being, and thus the states of affairs in any one instant/iteration is not only logically distinct from its successor, but ontologically so as well.
The doctrine of continual creation was inducted into the Cartesian tradition by Descartes himself, who famously notes in the Meditations:
[A] lifespan can be divided into countless parts, each completely independent of the others, so that it does not follow from the fact that I existed a little while ago that I must exist now, unless there is some cause which as it were creates me afresh at this moment—that is, which preserves me. For it is quite clear to anyone who attentively considers the nature of time that the same power and action are needed to preserve anything at each individual moment or its duration as would be required to create that thing anew if it were not yet in existence. (CSM II, 33)
Descartes’ argument concerning time is designed to occlude Hobbes’ and Gassendi’s conservationist mechanism—as well as the belief of the common person—whereby God creates the universe in the beginning, animates it with motion, then steps back from the machine, which continues to exist and operate of its own accord (See CSM II, 254). Yet Descartes’ conception of continual creation seems to be quite different from that of the Islamic occasionalists. First, as Kenneth Clatterbaugh points out, “Descartes only states that the continued existence of substances requires God’s continuous creation; he says nothing about the need to re-create all its states” (Clatterbaugh, 39). Moreover, nowhere does Descartes argue that a body’s causal capacities are dependent upon such recreation, nor does he advance the Ash’irite claim that the nature of such recreation is metaphysically discrete insofar as creatures lapse back into non-being immediately after the moment of their creation.
Regardless, many of Descartes’ successors saw a radicalization of this doctrine as a perfect justification for their occasionalism. Antione Le Grand, for example, follows Descartes in maintaining that “we must conclude that all Creatures before God’s Decree were nothing, and consequently that of themselves they have no necessity to exist” (Philosophia veterum, I, II, 14, 72). Unlike Descartes, however, he is adamant that God’s concourse preserves things “not only as to the Existence, but as to their Essence also” (Ibid., 12, 70). That is, their particular states. Similarly, La Forge advances a powerful argument for the metaphysical powerlessness of bodies form the continual creation doctrine:
I…claim that there is no creature, spiritual or corporeal, which can cause change in it or in any of its parts, in the second moment of their creation, if the Creator does not do so himself. Since it was He who produced this part of matter in place A, for example, not only must he continue to produce it if he wishes it to continue to exist but also, since he cannot create it everywhere or nowhere, he must put it in place B himself if he wishes it to be there. (Traité, 147)
That is to say, even if a body is set in motion by God, it makes no sense to describe it as possessing motion or anything of the sort, for all motion can be in such a theological framework is the annihilation and recreation of the body in different places at different temporal intervals. This point, which revives the conception of motion held by the Islamic occasionalists, is finally made explicit by Malebranche: “The moving force of a body is, then, simply the efficacy of the volition of God who conserves it successively in different places” (Dialouges, VII.11, 159). Motion then is cinematographic: each successive frame bears no connection to the prior frame, there is no transference of properties among the depicted objects between each frame, and indeed the film itself (as a metaphor for substantiality) is patently incapable of such transmission:
[L]et us imagine that the ball is moved and that, in the line of its motion, it encounters another ball at rest…it is not the first ball that moves the second. That is clear from the [following] principle. One body could not move another without communicating to it some of its moving force. Now, the moving force of a body in motion is simply the volition of the Creator who conserves it successively in different places. It is not a quality that which belongs to the body.” (Dialouges, VII.11, 159)
For such a widely deprecated—if not forgotten—school of philosophy, occasionalism was nonetheless of staggering importance to the development of philosophical modernity. Locke declined to publish two essays he wrote against occasionalism because “he looked upon [occasionalism] to be an opinion that would not spread, but was to die of itself, or at least do no great harm” (Posthumous Works, 210). Locke was undoubtedly prescient in this estimation, but only because the influence of occasionalism was to be felt not in its positive metaphysic, but rather in its skeptical epistemology.
The first casualty of this skepticism was the chimerical Neoplatonism of Ammonius, Plotinus, and their many scions, which was virtually synonymous with philosophy itself in late-antiquity and the Early Middle Ages. It was this philosophy—taken to its apogee by Avicenna—that was the primary target of al-Ghazali’s withering criticism. Neo-Platonism never recovered from this assault (except perhaps in nineteenth-century German idealism) and was instead replaced by the classical Aristotelianism advanced by Muslim philosophers in al-Andalus, most notably Averroës. In the Latin West the order was somewhat reversed as the indigenous Platonism of Eriugena, William of Conches, and Abelard, was replaced by the influx of Aristotelian ideas arriving North from Moorish Spain. Yet, medieval philosophy did not find its “completion” in the Aristotelian scholasticism of William of Auvergne and Aquinas; for, following the condemnations of 1270 and 1277 and the University of Paris, many of which implicated the new Aristotelian theology, skeptical philosophy witnessed a resurgence in Western thought for the first time since antiquity.
Nominalism, the third and final of the great philosophical schools of the Middle Ages, was caustically critical of the pretentions of Thomism; and against such a metaphysic advanced many of the same logical and epistemological arguments made by al-Ghazali and the Islamic occasionalists. Neither Ockham nor Autrecourt were interested in developing a systematic metaphysics and thus refrained from pushing these arguments into an actual espousal of occasionalism. The importance of nominalism lies both in the counter it provided to the domination of Aristotelian scholasticism, as well as the not so minor fact that nominalism was the first rigorously empiricist philosophy in Western history. While certain philosophical schools of antiquity (namely Epicureanism and the Empiric medical school) had exhibited empiricist tendencies, the general inclination of ancient thought was to either combine—to the point of conflation—rational speculative reasoning with empirical observation, or to flatly privilege the former over the latter. No tradition of antiquity had justified empiricism to the same epistemological and metaphysical extent as did Ockham and his followers.
As ironic as it might seem concerning a theocentric metaphysics that regarded God as doing basically everything, the cardinal contribution of occasionalism, then, was to the development of an empiricist epistemology of causal explanation that stood as a cornerstone of modern philosophy and science. The hostility of the occasionalists to secondary causation and the natural potentialities of created things—which had been accepted virtually without question in antiquity—formed the basis of the early-modern attack on the occult forces and powers of scholasticism, not only in spirit but in the particular arguments employed as well. A commonly held belief of ancient metaphysics and natural philosophy was that the inviolable regularity of nature must be predicated on the natural activities of things. Even Sextus Empiricus, the arch-skeptic, warns: “if cause were non-existent everything would have been produced by everything and at random. Horses, for instance, might be born, perchance, of flies, and elephants of ants” (Outlines of Pyrrhonism, iii.18). This is a puzzling claim, for, if causality were indeed non-existent, nothing would produce anything. Yet, this is not how the ancient mind understood the metaphysics of causation: production was an ontological given, “causes” merely directed the power of the demiurge, ensuring that like produces like and so on. Such an understanding remained, in one form or another, down to Aquinas and Suaréz. Occasionalism, in rejecting the efficacy of such natural causes to guide the operations of Nature, was required to posit some principle in its place that would provide for the observed regularity and order therein. The occasionalist response was simple: given that God was the total cause of every event in nature, the regularity of the natural world was a direct extension of the regularity of the divine mind. In this way the ancient understanding of nature as governed by active powers and potentialities was replaced by the modern understanding of nature as governed by immutable laws. Lastly, the occasionalist rejection of the necessity of the connection between cause and effect had a direct and undeniable influence on Hume, who was a studious and astute reader of Malebranche (Treatise, 158-160). Moreover, it was precisely such a skeptical principle—and its obvious upshot that reality is non-deducible—that was to finally nail shut the coffin lid on rationalist-speculative natural philosophy once and for all.
University of Oregon
U. S. A.
Last updated: October 10, 2011 | Originally published: