William of Ockham, also known as William Ockham and William of Occam, was a fourteenth-century English philosopher. Historically, Ockham has been cast as the outstanding opponent of Thomas Aquinas (1224-1274): Aquinas perfected the great “medieval synthesis” of faith and reason and was canonized by the Catholic Church; Ockham destroyed the synthesis and was condemned by the Catholic Church. Although it is true that Aquinas and Ockham disagreed on most issues, Aquinas had many other critics, and Ockham did not criticize Aquinas any more than he did others. It is fair enough, however, to say that Ockham was a major force of change at the end of the Middle Ages. He was a courageous man with an uncommonly sharp mind. His philosophy was radical in his day and continues to provide insight into current philosophical debates.
The principle of simplicity is the central theme of Ockham’s approach, so much so that this principle has come to be known as “Ockham’s Razor.” Ockham uses the razor to eliminate unnecessary hypotheses. In metaphysics, Ockham champions nominalism, the view that universal essences, such as humanity or whiteness, are nothing more than concepts in the mind. He develops an Aristotelian ontology, admitting only individual substances and qualities. In epistemology, Ockham defends direct realist empiricism, according to which human beings perceive objects through “intuitive cognition,” without the help of any innate ideas. These perceptions give rise to all of our abstract concepts and provide knowledge of the world. In logic, Ockham presents a version of supposition theory to support his commitment to mental language. Supposition theory had various purposes in medieval logic, one of which was to explain how words bear meaning. Theologically, Ockham is a fideist, maintaining that belief in God is a matter of faith rather than knowledge. Against the mainstream, he insists that theology is not a science and rejects all the alleged proofs of the existence of God. Ockham’s ethics is a divine command theory. In the Euthyphro dialogue, Plato (437-347 B.C.E.) poses the following question: Is something good because God wills it or does God will something because it is good? Although most philosophers affirm the latter, divine command theorists affirm the former. Ockham’s divine command theory can be seen as a consequence of his metaphysical libertarianism. In political theory, Ockham advances the notion of rights, separation of church and state, and freedom of speech.
Very little biographical information about Ockham survives. There is a record of his ordination in the year 1306. From this, we infer that he was born between 1280 and 1285, presumably in the small town of Ockham, twenty-five miles southwest of London, England. The medieval church in this town, All Saints, recently installed a stained glass window of Ockham because it is probably the church in which he grew up. Nevertheless, we know nothing of Ockham’s childhood or family. Most likely, he spoke Middle English and wrote exclusively in Latin.
Because Ockham joined the Franciscan order (known as the Order of the Friars Minor or OFM), he would have received his early education at a Franciscan house. From there, he pursued a degree in theology at Oxford University. He never completed it, however, because in 1323 he was summoned to the papal court, which had been moved from Rome to Avignon, to answer to charges of heresy.
Ockham remained in Avignon under a loose form of house arrest for four years while the papacy carried out its investigation. Through this ordeal Ockham became convinced that the papacy was corrupt and finally decided to flee with some other Franciscans on trial there. On May 26, 1328 they escaped in the night on stolen horses to the court of Louis of Bavaria, a would-be emperor, who had his own reasons for opposing the Pope. They were all ex-communicated and hunted down but never captured.
After a brief and unsuccessful campaign in Italy, Louis and his entourage settled in Munich. Ockham spent the rest of his days there as a political activist, writing treatises against the papacy. Ockham died sometime between 1347 and 1349, unreconciled with the Catholic Church. Because he never returned to his academic career, Ockham acquired the nickname “Venerable Inceptor”—an “inceptor” being one who is on the point of earning a degree. Ockham’s other nickname is the “More than Subtle Doctor” because he was thought to have surpassed the Franciscan philosopher John Duns Scotus (1265/6-1308), who was known as the Subtle Doctor.
Methodologically, Ockham fits comfortably within the analytic philosophical tradition. He considers himself a devoted follower of Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.), whom he calls “The Philosopher,” though most Aristotle scholars would find many of his interpretations dubious. Ockham may simply have a unique understanding of Aristotle or he may be using Aristotle as cover for developing views he knew would be threatening to the status quo.
Aside from Aristotle, the French Franciscan philosopher Peter John Olivi (1248 – 1298) was the single most important influence on Ockham. Olivi is an extremely original thinker, pioneering direct realism, nominalism, metaphysical libertarianism, and many of the same political views that Ockham defends later in his career. One notable difference between the two, however, is that, while Ockham loves Aristotle, Olivi hates him. Ockham never acknowledges Olivi because Olivi was condemned as a heretic.
Ockham published several philosophical works before losing official status as an academic. The first was his Commentary on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, a standard requirement for medieval theology students. The philosopher and archbishop Peter Lombard (1100–1160/4) composed a book of opinions (sententia) for and against various controversial claims. By commenting on this book, students would learn the art of argumentation while at the same time developing their own views. As a student, Ockham also wrote several commentaries on the works of Aristotle. In addition, he engaged in public debates, the proceedings of which were published under the titles Disputed Questions and Quodlibetal Questions—“quodlibet” meaning “whatever you like.” Ockham’s opus magnum, however, is his Suma Logicae, in which he lays out the fundamentals of his logic and its accompanying metaphysics. We do not know exactly when it was written, but it is the latest of his academic works. After the Avignon affair, Ockham wrote and circulated several political treatises unofficially, the most important of which is his Dialogue on the Power of the Emperor and the Pope. All of Ockham’s works have been edited into modern editions but not all have been translated.
Ockham’s Razor is the principle of parsimony or simplicity according to which the simpler theory is more likely to be true. Ockham did not invent this principle; it is found in Aristotle, Aquinas, and other philosophers Ockham read. Nor did he call the principle a “razor.” In fact, the first known use of the term “Occam’s razor” occurs in 1852 in the work of the British mathematician William Rowan Hamilton. Although Ockham never even makes an argument for the validity of the principle, he uses it in many striking ways, and this is how it became associated with him.
For some, the principle of simplicity implies that the world is maximally simple. Aquinas, for example, argues that nature does not employ two instruments where one suffices. This interpretation of the principle is also suggested by its most popular formulation: “Entities should not be multiplied beyond necessity.” Yet this is a problematic assertion. We know today that nature is often redundant in both form and function. Although medieval philosophers were largely ignorant of evolutionary biology, they did affirm the existence of an omnipotent God, which is alone enough to render the assumption that the world is maximally simple suspicious. In any case, Ockham never makes this assumption and he does not use the popular formulation of the principle.
For Ockham, the principle of simplicity limits the multiplication of hypotheses not necessarily entities. Favoring the formulation “It is useless to do with more what can be done with less,” Ockham implies that theories are meant to do things, namely, explain and predict, and these things can be accomplished more effectively with fewer assumptions.
At one level, this is just common sense. Suppose your car suddenly stops running and your fuel gauge indicates an empty gas tank. It would be silly to hypothesize both that you are out of gas and that you are out of oil. You need only one hypothesis to explain what has happened.
Some would object that the principle of simplicity cannot guarantee truth. The gas gauge on your car may be broken or the empty gas tank may be just one of several things wrong with the car. In response to this objection, one might point out that the principle of simplicity does not tell us which theory is true but only which theory is more likely to be true. Moreover, if there is some other sign of damage, such as a blinking oil gage, then there is a further fact to explain, warranting an additional hypothesis.
Although the razor seems like common sense in everyday situations, when used in science, it can have surprising and powerful effects. For example, in his classic exposition of theoretical physics, A Brief History of Time, Stephen Hawking attributes the discovery of quantum mechanics to Ockham’s Razor.
Nevertheless, not everyone approves of the razor. Ockham’s contemporary and fellow Franciscan Walter Chatton proposed an “anti-razor” in opposition to Ockham. He declares that if three things are not enough to verify an affirmative proposition about things, a fourth must be added, and so on. Others call Ockham’s razor a “principle of stinginess,” accusing it of quashing creativity and imagination. Still others complain that there is no objective way to determine which of two theories is simpler. Often a theory that is simpler in one way is more complicated in another way. All of these concerns and others make Ockham’s razor controversial.
At bottom, Ockham advocates simplicity in order to reduce the risk of error. Every hypothesis carries the possibility that it may be wrong. The more hypotheses you accept, the more you increase your risk. Ockham strove to avoid error at all times, even if it meant abandoning well-loved, traditional beliefs. This approach helped to earn him his reputation as destroyer of the medieval synthesis of faith and reason.
One of the most basic challenges in metaphysics is to explain how it is that things are the same despite differences. The Greek philosopher Heraclitus (540 – 480 B.C.E.) points out that you can never step into the same river twice, referring not just to rivers, but to places, people, and life itself. Every day everything changes a little bit and everywhere you go you find new things. Heraclitus concludes from such observations that nothing ever remains the same. All reality is in flux.
The problem with seeing the world this way is that it leads to radical skepticism: if nothing stays the same from moment to moment and from place to place, then we can never really be certain about anything. We can’t know our friends, we can’t know the world we live in, we can’t even know ourselves! Moreover, if Heraclitus is right, it seems science is impossible. We could learn the properties of a chemical here today and still have no basis for knowing its properties someplace else tomorrow.
Needless to say, most people would prefer to avoid skepticism. It’s hard to carry on in a state of complete ignorance. Besides, it seems obvious that science is not impossible. Studying the world really does enable us to know how things are over time and across distances. The fact that things change through time and vary from place to place does not seem to prevent us from having knowledge. From this, some philosophers, such as Plato and Augustine (354-430), draw the conclusion that Heraclitus was wrong to suppose that everything is in flux. Something stays the same, something that lays underneath the changing and varying surfaces we perceive, namely, the universal essence of things.
For example, although individual human beings change from day to day and vary from place to place, they all share the universal essence of humanity, which is eternally the same. Likewise for dogs, trees, rocks, and even qualities—there must be a universal essence of blueness, heat, love, and anything else one can think of. Universal essences are not physical realities; if you dissect a human being, you will not find humanity inside like a kidney or a lung! Nevertheless, universal essences are metaphysical realities: they provide the invisible structure of things.
Belief in universal essences is called “metaphysical realism,” because it asserts that universal essences are real even though we cannot physically see them. Although there are various different versions of metaphysical realism, they are all designed to secure a foundation for knowledge. It seems you have a choice: either you accept metaphysical realism or you are stuck with skepticism.
Ockham, however, argues that this is a false dilemma. He rejects metaphysical realism and skepticism in favor of nominalism: the view that universal essences are concepts in the mind. The word “nominalism” comes from the Latin word nomina, meaning name. Earlier nominalists such as the French philosopher Roscelin (1050-1125), had advanced the more radical view that universal essences are just names that have no basis in reality. Ockham developed a more sophisticated version of nominalism often called “conceptualism” because it holds that universal essences are concepts caused in our minds when we perceive real similarities among things in the world.
For example, when a child comes in contact with different human beings over time, he begins to form the concept of humanity. The realist would say that he has detected the invisible common structure of these individuals. Ockham, in contrast, insists that the child has merely perceived similarities that fit naturally under one concept.
It is tempting to assume that Ockham rejects metaphysical realism because of the principle of simplicity. After all, realism requires believing in invisible entities that might not actually exist. As a matter of fact, however, Ockham never uses the razor to attack realism. And on closer examination, this makes sense: the realist position is that the existence of universal essences is a hypothesis necessary to explain how science is possible. Since Ockham was just as concerned as everyone else to avoid skepticism, he might have been persuaded by such an argument.
Ockham has a much deeper worry about realism: he is convinced it is incoherent. Incoherence is the most serious charge a philosopher can level against a theory because it means that the theory contains a contradiction—and contradictions cannot be true. Ockham asserts that metaphysical realism cannot be true because it holds that a universal essence is one thing and many things at the same time. The form of humanity is one thing, because it is what all humans have in common, but it is also many things because it provides an invisible structure of each individual one of us. This is to say that it is both one thing and not one thing at the same time, which is a contradiction.
Realists claim that this apparent contradiction can be explained in various ways. Ockham insists, however, that no matter how you explain it, there is no way to avoid the fact that the notion of a universal essence is an impossible hypothesis. He writes,
There is no universal outside the mind really existing in individual substances or in the essences of things…. The reason is that everything that is not many things is necessarily one thing in number and consequently a singular thing. [Opera Philosophica II, pp. 11-12]
Ockham presents a thought experiment to prove universal essences do not exist. He writes that, according to realism,
…it would follow that God would not be able to annihilate one individual substance without destroying the other individuals of the same kind. For, if he were to annihilate one individual, he would destroy the whole that is essentially that individual and, consequently, he would destroy the universal that is in it and in others of the same essence. Other things of the same essence would not remain, for they could not continue to exist without the universal that constitutes a part of them. [Opera Philosophica I, p. 51]
Since God is omnipotent, he should be able to annihilate a human being. But the universal form of humanity lies within that human being. So, by destroying the individual, he will destroy the universal. And if he destroys the universal, which is humanity, then he destroys all the other humans as well.
The realist may wish to reply that destroying an individual human destroys only part of the universal humanity. But this contradicts the original assertion that the universal humanity is a single shared essence that is eternally the same for everyone! For Ockham, this problem decisively defeats realism and leaves us with the nominalist alternative that universals are concepts caused in our minds when we perceive similar individuals. To support this alternative, Ockham develops an empiricist epistemology.
Epistemology is the study of knowledge: what is it, and how do we come to have it? There are two basic approaches to epistemology: rationalists claim that knowledge consists of innate certainties that we discover through reason; empiricists claim that knowledge consists in accurate perceptions that we accumulate through experience. Although early medieval philosophers such as Augustine and Anselm (1033-1109) were innatists, empiricism came to dominate during the high Middle Ages. This is mostly because Aristotle was an empiricist and the texts in which he promotes empiricism were rediscovered and translated for the first time into Latin during the thirteenth century.
Following Aristotle, Ockham asserts that human beings are born blank states: there are no innate certainties to be discovered in our minds. We learn by observing qualities in objects. Ockham’s version of empiricism is called “direct realism” because he denies that there is any intermediary between the perceiver and the world. (Note that direct realism should not be confused with metaphysical realism, which Ockham rejects, as discussed above.) Direct realism states that if you see an apple, its redness causes you to know that it is red. This may seem obvious, but it actually raises a problem that has led many empiricists, both in Ockham’s day and today, to reject direct realism.
As the French philosopher Peter Aureol (1275-1333) points out, the problem is that there are cases where we perceive something that is not really there. In optical illusions, hallucinations, and dreams, our perceptions are completely disconnected with the external world.
Representationalism is the version of empiricism designed to solve this problem. According to representationalists, human beings perceive the world through a mental mediary, or representation, known in the Middle Ages as the “intelligible species.” Normally, an apple causes an intelligible species of itself for us to perceive it through. In cases of optical illusions, hallucinations, and dreams, something else causes the intelligible species. The perception seems veridical to us because there is no difference in the intelligible species. Even before Peter Aureol, Thomas Aquinas advocated representationalism, and it soon became the dominant view.
The difficulty with representationalism, as the Irish philosopher George Berkeley (1685-1754) amply demonstrates, is that once you introduce an intermediary between the perceiver and the external world, you lose your justification for belief in the external world. If all of our ideas come through representations, how do we know what, if anything, is behind these representations? Something other than physical objects could be causing them. For example, God could be transmitting representations of physical objects to our minds without ever creating any physical objects at all—which is in fact what Berkeley came to believe. This view, known as idealism, is radically skeptical, and most philosophers prefer to avoid it.
Ockham preempts idealism through the notion of intuitive cognition, which plays a crucial role in his four-step account of knowledge acquisition. It can be summarized as follows. The first step is sensory cognition: receiving data through the five senses. This is an ability human beings share with animals. The second step, intuitive cognition, is uniquely human. Intuitive cognition is an awareness that the particular individual perceived exists and has the qualities it has. The third step is recordative cognition, by which we remember past perceptions. The fourth step is abstractive cognition, by which we place individuals in groups of similar individuals.
Notice that, if an apple is set in front of a horse, the horse will receive data about the apple—the color, the smell, etc.—and react appropriately. The horse will not, however, register the reality of the object. Suppose you project a realistic, laser image of an apple in front of the horse and he tries to take a bite. He will become frustrated, and eventually give up, but he will never really “get it.” Human beings, in contrast, have reality-sensitive minds. It’s not a matter of thinking “This is real” every time we see something. On the contrary, Ockham asserts that intuitive cognition is non-propositional. Rather, it is a matter of registering that the apple really has the qualities we perceive. Ockham writes:
Intuitive cognition is such that when some things are cognized, of which one inheres in the other, or one is spatially distant from the other, or exists in some relation to the other, immediately in virtue of that non-propositional cognition of those things, it is known if the thing inheres or does not inhere, if it is spatially distant or not, and the same for other true contingent propositions, unless that cognition is flawed or there is some impediment. [Opera Theologica I, p. 31]
While intuitive cognition is itself non-propositional, it provides the basis for formulating true propositions. A horse cannot say “This apple is red” because its mind is not complex enough to register the reality of what it perceives. The human mind, registering the existence of things—both that they are and how they are—can therefore formulate assertions about them.
Strictly speaking, when one has an intuitive cognition of an apple, one is not yet thinking of it as an apple, because this requires placing it in a group. In normal adult human perception, all four of the above steps happen together so quickly that it is hard to separate them. But try to imagine what perception is like for a toddler: she sees the round, red object and points to it saying “That!” This is an expression of intuitive cognition.
Intuitive cognition secures a causal link between the external world and the human mind. The human mind is entirely passive, according to Ockham, during intuitive cognition. Objects in the world cause us to be aware of their existence, and this explains and justifies our belief in them.
Despite his insistence on the causal link between the world and our minds, Ockham clearly recognizes cases in which intuitive cognition causes false judgment. (See the last line of the above quotation: “…unless that cognition is flawed or there is some impediment.”) For example, when you see a stick half-emerged in water, it looks bent. This is because your intuitive cognition of the stick is being affected by your simultaneous intuitive cognition of the water, and this causes a skewed perception. In addition to leaving room for error on his account, Ockham also leaves room for skepticism: God can transmit representations to human beings that seem exactly like intuitive cognitions.
Given that direct realism cannot rule out skepticism any more than representationalism can, one might wonder why Ockham prefers it. In the end, it is a question of simplicity. Whereas Ockham never uses his razor against metaphysical realism, he does use it against representationalism. Intuitive cognition is necessary to secure a causal link between the world and the mind, and, once it is in place, there is no need for a middle man. The intelligible species is an unnecessary hypothesis.
It is worth noting that intuitive cognition also provides epistemological support for Ockham’s nominalist metaphysics. Representationalists typically hold that the intelligible species emanates from the universal essence of the thing. In their view, you perceive an apple as an apple because the apple’s universal essence of appleness is conveyed to you through its intelligible species. In fact, many metaphysical realists would argue for the superiority of their view precisely on the grounds that universal essences provide a basis for intelligible species, and intelligible species are necessary for us to know what we are perceiving. They would ask: how else do we ever identify apples as apples instead of just so many distinct individuals?
As we have seen, Ockham argues that there is no universal essence. There is therefore no basis for an intelligible species. Each object in the world is an absolute individual and that is how we perceive it at first. Just like toddlers, we are bombarded with a buzzing, booming confusion of colors and sounds. But our minds are powerful sorting machines. We remember perceptions over time (recordative cognition) and organize them into groups (abstractive cognition). This organizational process gives us a coherent understanding of the world and is what Ockham aims to explain in his account of logic.
Although the human mind is born without any knowledge, according to Ockham, it does come fully equip with a system for processing perceptions as they are acquired. This system is thought, which Ockham understands in terms of an unspoken, mental language. He is therefore considered an advocate of “mentalese,” like the American philosopher Noam Chomsky.
Ockham might compare thought to a machine ready to manipulate a vast quantity of empty boxes. As we observe the world, perceptions are placed in the empty boxes. Then the machine sorts and organizes the boxes according to content. Two small boxes with similar contents might be placed together in a big box, and then the big box might be conjoined to another big box. For example, as perceptions of Rover and Fido accumulate, they become the concept dog, and then the concept dog is associated with the concept fleas. This conceptual apparatus enables us to construct meaningful sentences, such as “All dogs have fleas.”
The intuitive cognition in Ockham’s epistemology provides a basis for what is today called a “causal theory of reference” in philosophy of language. The word “dog” means dog because the concept you think of when you write it or say it was caused by the dogs you have perceived. Dogs cause the same kinds of concepts in all human beings. Thus, mentalese is universal among us, even though there are different ways to speak and write words in different countries around the world. While written and spoken language is conventional, signification itself is natural.
Early in his career, Ockham entertained the notion that concepts are mental objects or “ficta” which resemble objects in the world like pictures. He abandoned ficta theory, however, because it presupposes a representationalist epistemology, which in turn presupposes metaphysical realism. Arguing instead for “intellectum theory,” according to which objects can have causal impact on the mind without creating mental pictures of themselves; he offers the following analogy. Medieval pubs received wine in shipments of wooden barrels sealed with hoops. When the shipment arrived, the pub owner would hang a barrel hoop outside the front door to communicate to the townspeople that wine was available. Although the hoop did not resemble wine in any way, it was significant to the townspeople. This is because the presence of the hoop was caused by the arrival of the wine. Likewise, dogs in the world cause concepts in our minds that are significant even though they do not resemble dogs.
It must be noted that there is a drawback to both the barrel hoop analogy and the box illustration: they portray concepts as things. For convenience, Ockham often speaks of concepts loosely as though they were things. However, according to intellectum theory, concepts are not really things at all but rather actions. Perceiving a dog does not cause an entity to exist in your mind; rather, it causes a mental act. Today we would say that it causes a neuron to fire. Repeated acts cause a habit: the disposition to perform the act at will. So, repeated perceptions of dogs cause repeated acts of dog-conceiving and those repeated acts cause a dog-conceiving habit, meaning that you can engage in dog-conceiving actions whenever you want, even when there are no dogs around to perceive.
In Ockham’s view, any coherent thought we have requires connecting or disconnecting concepts by means of linguistic operators. Ockham has a lot of ideas about how the linguistic operators work, which he develops in his version of supposition theory. Although supposition theory was a major preoccupation of late medieval logicians, scholars are still divided over its purpose. Some think it was an effort to build a system of formal logic that ultimately failed. Others think it was more akin to a modern theory of logical form.
Ockham’s interest in supposition theory seems motivated by his concern to clarify conceptual confusion. Much like Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889-1951), Ockham asserts that many philosophical errors arise due to the misunderstanding of language. He took metaphysical realism to be a prime example. Conceiving of human beings in general leads us to use the word “humanity.” Metaphysical realists conclude that this word must refer to a universal essence within all human beings. For Ockham, however, the word “humanity” stands for a habit that enables us to conceive of all the human beings we have perceived to date in a very efficient manner: stripped of all of their individual details. In this way, Ockham’s supposition theory is designed to support his nominalist metaphysics while elucidating the rules of thought.
The word “supposition” comes from the Latin word “stand for” but it closely approximates the technical notion known as “reference” in English. At its most basic level, supposition theory tells us how words used in sentences, which Ockham calls “terms,” refer to things.
Medieval logicians recognize three types of supposition—material, personal and simple—but their metaphysical commitments affect their analyses. Most everyone agrees about material supposition. It occurs when a term is mentioned rather than used, as is the term “stop” in the sentence, “The sign says ‘stop.’” But they disagree over personal and simple supposition. For Ockham, personal supposition occurs when a term stands for an object in the world, as does the term “cat” in the sentence, “The cat is on the mat” and simple supposition occurs when a term stands for a concept in the mind, as does “horse” in the sentence, “Horse is a species.” For Ockham’s realist opponents, in contrast, the term “species” stands for a universal essence, which is an object in the world. They therefore have a different account of personal and simple supposition.
In addition to three types of supposition, medieval logicians recognize two types of terms: categorematic and syncategorematic. Categorematic terms refer to existing things and are called “categorematic” because, in his Organon, Aristotle asserts that there are ten categories of existing things. Syncategorematic terms do not refer to anything at all. They are logical operators, such as “all,” “not,” “if,” and “only,” which tell how to associate or disassociate the categorematic terms in a sentence.
Among categorematic terms, some are absolute names while others are connotative names. Ockham describes the difference as follows:
Properly speaking, only absolute names, that is, concepts signifying things composed of matter and form, have definitions expressing real essence. Some examples of this sort of name are “human being,” “lion,” and “goat.” Connotative and relative names, on the other hand, which signify one thing directly and another thing indirectly, have definitions expressing nominal essence. Some examples of this sort of name are “white,” “hot,” “parent,” and “child.” [Opera Philosophica IX, p. 554]
The terms “human being” and “parent” are both names for Betty. The term “human being” signifies Betty in an absolute way because it refers to her alone as an independently existing object. The term “parent” signifies Betty in a connotative way because it signifies her while at the same time signifying her children.
Although the distinction between absolute and connotative terms seems minor, Ockham uses it for radical purposes. According to the standard reading of the Organon, Aristotle holds that there are ten categories of existing things as follows: substance, quality, quantity, relation, place, time, position, state, action, and passion. According to Ockham’s reading, however, Aristotle holds that there are only two categories of existing things: substance and quality. Ockham bases his interpretation on the thesis that only substances and qualities have real essence definitions signifying things composed of matter and form. The other eight categories signify a substance or a quality while connoting something else. They therefore have nominal essence definitions, meaning that they are not existing things.
Consider quantity. Suppose you have one orange. It is a substance with a real essence of citrus fruit. Furthermore, it possesses several qualities, such as its color, its flavor, and its smell. The orange and its qualities are existing things according to Ockham. But the orange is also singular. Is its singularity an existing thing? For mathematical Platonists, the answer is yes: the number one exists as a universal essence and inheres in the orange. Ockham, in contrast, asserts that the singularity of the orange is just a short hand way of saying that there are no other oranges nearby. So, in the sentence “Here is one orange” the term “one” is connotative: it directly signifies the orange itself while indirectly signifying all the other oranges that are not here. Ockham eliminates the rest of the categories along the same lines.
Interestingly, Ockham’s elimination of quantity precipitated his summons to Avignon because it pushed him to a new account of the sacrament of the altar. The sacrament of the altar is the miracle that is supposed to occur when bread and wine are transformed into the body and blood of Jesus Christ. This process is known in theology as “transubstantiation” because one substance changes into another substance. The problem is to explain why the bread and wine continue to look, smell, and taste exactly the same despite the underlying change. According to the standard account, the qualities of the bread and wine continue to inhere in their quantity, which remains the same while substances are exchanged. According to Ockham, however, quantity is nothing other than the substance itself; if the substance changes then the quantity changes. So, the qualities cannot continue to inhere in the same quantity. Nor can they transfer from the substance of the bread and wine into the substance of Jesus because it would be blasphemous to say that Jesus was crunchy or wet! Ockham’s solution is to claim that the qualities of the bread and wine continue to exist all by themselves, accompanying the invisible substance of Jesus down the gullet. Needless to say, this solution was a bit too clever.
One question scholars continue to ask is why Ockham allows for two of the ten categories to remain instead of just one, namely, substance. It seems that qualities, such as whiteness, crunchiness, sweetness, etc, can just as easily be reduced to nominal essences: they signify the substance itself while connoting the tongue or nose or eye that perceives it. Of course, if Ockham had eliminated quality, he really would have had no basis left for saving the miracle of transubstantiation. Perhaps that was reason enough to stay his razor.
Despite his departures from orthodoxy and his conflict with the papacy, Ockham never renounced Catholicism. He steadfastly embraced fideism, the view that belief in God is a matter of faith alone. Although fideism was soon to become common among Protestant thinkers, it was not so common among medieval Catholics. At the beginning of the Middle Ages, Augustine proposed a proof of the existence of God and promoted the view that reason is faith seeking understanding. While the standard approach for any medieval philosopher would be to recognize a role for both faith and reason in religion, Ockham makes an uncompromising case for faith alone.
Three assertions reveal Ockham to be a fideist.
The word “science” comes from the Latin word “scientia,” meaning knowledge. In the first book of his Sentences, Peter Lombard raises the issue of whether and in what sense theology is a science. Most philosophers commenting on the Sentences found a way to cast faith as a way of knowing. Ockham, however, makes no such effort. As a staunch empiricist, Ockham is committed to the thesis that all knowledge comes from experience. Yet we have no experience of God. It follows inescapably that we have no knowledge of God, as Ockham affirms in the following passage:
In order to demonstrate the statement of faith that we formulate about God, what we would need for the central concept is a simple cognition of the divine nature in itself—what someone who sees God has. Nevertheless, we cannot have this kind of cognition in our present state. [Quodlibetal Questions, pp. 103-4]
By “present state” Ockham is referring to life on earth as a human being. Just as we now have knowledge of others through intuitive cognitions of their individual essences, those who go to heaven (if there ever are any such) will have knowledge of God through intuitive cognitions of his essence. Until then we can only hope.
The Trinity is the core Christian doctrine according to which God is three persons in one. Christians traditionally consider the Trinity a mystery, meaning that it is beyond the comprehension of the human mind. Ockham goes so far as to admit that it is a blatant contradiction. He displays the problem through the following syllogism:
According to the doctrine of the Trinity:
(1) God is the Father,
(2) Jesus is God.
Therefore, by transitivity, according to the doctrine of the Trinity:
(3) Jesus is the Father.
Yet, according to the doctrine of the Trinity, Jesus is not the Father.
So, according to the doctrine of the Trinity, Jesus both is and is not the Father.
Providing precedent for a recent presidential defense, many medieval philosophers suggested that the transitive inference to the conclusion is broken by different senses of the word “is.” Scotus creatively argues that the logic of the Trinity is an opaque context that does not obey the usual rules. For Ockham, however, this syllogism establishes that theology is not logical and must never be mixed with philosophy.
Living prior to the advent of Christianity, Aristotle never believed in the Trinity. He does, however, seem to believe in a supernatural force that lends purpose to all of nature. This is evident in his doctrine of the Four Causes, according to which every existing thing requires a fourfold explanation. Ockham would cast these four causes in terms of the following four questions:
First Cause: What is it made of?
Second Cause: What does it do?
Third Cause: What brought it about?
Fourth Cause: Why does it do what it does?
Most medieval philosophers found Aristotle’s four causes conducive to the Christian worldview, assimilating the fourth cause to the doctrine of divine providence, according to which everything that happens is ultimately part of God’s plan.
Though Ockham was reluctant to disagree with Aristotle, he was so determined to keep theology separate from science and philosophy, that he felt compelled to criticize the fourth (which he calls “final”) cause. Ockham writes,
If I accepted no authority, I would claim that it cannot be proved either from statements known in themselves or from experience that every effect has a final cause…. Someone who is just following natural reason would claim that the question “why?” is inappropriate in the case of natural actions. For he would maintain that it is no real question to ask something like, “For what reason is fire generated?” [Quodlibetal Questions, pp. 246-9]
No doubt Ockham put his criticism in hypothetical, third-person terms because he knew that openly asserting that the universe itself may be entirely purposeless would never pass muster with the powers that be.
Needless to say, Ockham rejects all of the alleged proofs of the existence of God. Two of the most important proofs then, as now, were Anselm’s ontological proof and Thomas Aquinas’s cosmological proof. Although the former is based on rationalist thinking and the latter is based on empiricist thinking, they boil down to very similar strategies, in Ockham’s view. There were, of course, many different versions of each of these proofs circulating in Ockham’s day just as there are today. Ockham thinks that the most plausible version of each boils down to an infinite regress argument of the following form:
If God does not exist, then there is an infinite regress.
But infinite regresses are impossible.
Therefore, God must exist.
The reason Ockham finds this argument form to be the most plausible is that he fully agrees with the second premise, that infinite regresses are impossible. If it were possible to show that God’s non-existence implied an infinite regress, then Ockham would accept the inference to his existence. Ockham denies, however, that God’s non-existence implies any such thing.
In order to understand Ockham’s aversion to infinite regress, it is necessary to understand Aristotle’s distinction between extensive and intensive infinity. An extensive infinity is an uncountable quantity of actually existing things. Mathematical Platonists conceive of the set of whole numbers as an extensive infinity. Ockham, however, deems the idea of an uncountable quantity contradictory: if the objects exist, then God can count them, and if God can count them, then they are not uncountable. An intensive infinity, on the other hand, is just a lack of limitation. As a nominalist, Ockham understands the set of whole numbers to be an intensive infinity in the sense that there is no upward limit on how far someone can count. This does not mean that the set of whole numbers are an uncountable quantity of actually existing things. Ockham thinks that infinite regresses are impossible only in so far as they imply extensive infinity.
According to Ockham, advocates of the ontological proof reason as follows: There would be an infinite regress among entities if there were not one greatest entity. Therefore, there must be one greatest entity, namely God.
One way to counter this reasoning would be to deny that greatness is an objectively existing quality. Ockham does not, however, take this approach. On the contrary, he seems to take the Great Chain of Being for granted. The Great Chain of Being is a doctrine prevalent throughout the Middle Ages and beyond. According to it, all of nature can be ranked on a hierarchy of value from top to bottom, roughly as follows: God, angels, humans, animals, plants, rocks. The Great Chain of Being implies that greatness is an objectively existing quality.
Ockham’s curt response to the ontological argument is that it does not prove that there is just one greatest entity. Bearing the Great Chain of Being in mind, it is evident what he means to say. If God and the angels do not exist, then human beings are the greatest entities, and there is no single best among us. Notice that, even if there were a single best among humans, he or she would be a “god” in a very different sense than is required by Catholic orthodoxy.
Some scholars have interpreted Ockham to mean that the ontological argument succeeds in proving that the Father, the Son, and the Holy Ghost exist, but not that they are one. It is not clear, however, how Ockham’s empiricism could permit such a conclusion.
According to Ockham, advocates of the cosmological argument reason as follows: There would be an infinite regress among causes if there were not a first cause; therefore, there must be a first cause, namely, God.
There are two different ways to understand “cause” in this argument: efficient cause and conserving cause. An efficient cause brings about an effect successively over time. For example, your grandparents were the efficient cause of your parents who were the efficient cause of you. A conserving cause, in contrast, is a simultaneous support for an effect. For example, the oxygen in the room is a conserving cause of the burning flame on the candle.
In Ockham’s view, the cosmological argument fails using either type of causality. Consider efficient causality first. If the chain of efficient causes that have produced the world as we know it today had no beginning, then it would form, not an extensive infinity, but an intensive infinity, which is harmless. Since the links in the chain would not all exist at the same time, they would not constitute an uncountable quantity of actually existing things. Rather, they would simply imply that the universe is an eternal cycle of unlimited or perpetual motion. Ockham explicitly affirms that it is possible that the world had no beginning, as Aristotle maintained.
Next, consider conserving causality. Conceiving of the world as a product of simultaneous conserving causes is difficult. The idea is perhaps best expressed in a story reported by Stephen Hawking. According to the story, a scientist was giving a lecture on astronomy. After the lecture, an elderly lady came up and told the scientist that he had it all wrong. “The world is really a flat plate supported on the back of a giant tortoise.” The scientist asked “And what is the turtle standing on?” To which the lady triumphantly replied: “You’re very clever, young man, but it’s no use – it’s turtles all the way down.”
Ockham readily grants that if the world has to be “held up” by conserving causes, then there must be a first among them because otherwise the set of conserving causes would constitute an uncountable quantity of actually existing things. It is in fact a tenet of belief that God is both an efficient and conserving cause of the cosmos, and Ockham accepts this tenet on faith. He handily points out, however, that, just as the cosmos need not have a beginning; it need not be “held up” in this way at all. Each existing thing may be its own conserving cause. Hence the cosmological argument is entirely inconclusive.
Ockham’s fideism amounts to a refusal to rely on the God hypothesis for theory building. It is worth bearing in mind that there were no philosophy departments or philosophy degrees in the Middle Ages. A student’s only choices for graduate school were law, medicine, or theology. Wanting to be a philosopher, Ockham studied theology and ran through his theological exercises, all the while trying to carve out a separate space for philosophy. The one area where the two worlds collide inextricably for him is in ethics.
Many people think God commands human beings to be kind because kindness is good and that God himself is always kind because his actions are always in conformity with goodness.
Although this was and still is the most common way of conceiving of the relationship between God and morality, Ockham disagrees. In his view, God does not conform to an independently existing standard of goodness; rather, God himself is the standard of goodness. This means it is not the case that God commands us to be kind because kindness is good. Rather, kindness is good because God commands it. Ockham was a divine command theorist: God’s will establishes right and wrong.
Divine command theory has always been unpopular because it carries one very unintuitive implication: if whatever God commands becomes right, and God can command whatever he wants, then God could command us always to be unkind and never to be kind, and then it would be right for us to be unkind and wrong for us to be kind. Kindness would be bad and unkindness would be good! How could this be?
In Ockham’s view, God always has commanded and always will command kindness. Nevertheless, it is possible for him to command otherwise. This possibility is a straightforward requirement of divine omnipotence: God can do anything that does not involve a contradiction. Of course, plenty of philosophers, such as Thomas Aquinas, insist that it is impossible for God to command us to be unkind simply because then God’s will would contradict his nature. For Ockham, however, this is the wrong way to conceive of God’s nature. The most important thing to understand about God’s nature, in Ockham’s view, is that it is maximally free. There are no constraints, external or internal, to what God can will. All of theology stands or falls with this thesis in Ockham’s view.
Ockham grants that it is hard to imagine a world in which God reverses his commands. Yet this is the price of preserving divine freedom. He writes,
I reply that hatred, theft, adultery, and the like may involve evil according to the common law, in so far as they are done by someone who is obligated by a divine command to perform the opposite act. As far as everything absolute in these actions is concerned, however, God can perform them without involving any evil. And they can even be performed meritoriously by someone on earth if they should fall under a divine command, just as now the opposite of these, in fact, fall under a divine command. [Opera Theologica V, p. 352]
One advantage of this approach is that it enables Ockham to make sense of some instances in the Old Testament where it looks as though God is commanding such things as murder (as in the case of Abraham sacrificing Isaac) and deception (as in the case of the Israelites despoiling the Egyptians). But biblical exegesis is not Ockham’s motive. His motive is to cast God as a paradigm of metaphysical freedom, so that he can make sense of human nature as made in his image.
Metaphysical libertarianism is the view that human beings are responsible for their actions as individuals because they have free will, defined as the ability to do other than they do. Metaphysical libertarianism is opposed to determinism, according to which human beings do not have free will but rather are determined by antecedent conditions (such as God or nature or environmental factors) to do exactly what they do.
Suppose Jake eats a cupcake. According to the determinist, antecedent conditions caused him to do this. Hence, he could not have done otherwise unless those antecedent conditions had been different. Given the same conditions, Jake cannot refrain from eating the cupcake. Determinists are content to conclude that freedom is an illusion.
Compatibilism is a version of determinism according to which being determined to do exactly what we do is compatible with freedom as long as the antecedent conditions that determine what we do include our own choices. Compatibilists claim that the choices we make are free even though we could not do otherwise given the same antecedent conditions. On this view, Jake chose to eat the cupcake because his desire for it outweighed all other considerations at that moment. Our choices are always determined by our strongest desires according to compatibilists.
Metaphysical libertarians reject determinism and compatibilism, insisting that free will includes the ability to act against our strongest desires. On this view, Jake could have refrained from eating the cupcake even given the exact same antecedent conditions. While desires influence our choices they do not cause our choices according to metaphysical libertarianism; rather, our choices are caused by our will which is itself an uncaused cause, meaning that it is an independent power, stronger than any antecedent condition. This notion of free will enables the metaphysical libertarian to assign a very strong conception of individual responsibility to human beings: what we do is not attributable to God or nature or environmental factors.
Many people make the assumption that all medieval philosophers were metaphysical libertarians. Whereas Protestant theology classically promotes theological determinism, the view that everything human beings do is foreordained by God, Catholic theology classically promotes the view that God gave human beings free will. While it is true that every medieval philosopher endorses the thesis that human beings are free, few are able to maintain a commitment to free will, defined as the ability to do other than we do given the same antecedent conditions. The reason is that so many other theological and philosophical doctrines conflict with it.
Consider divine foreknowledge. If God is omniscient, then he knows everything that you are ever going to do. Suppose he knows that you will eat an apple for lunch tomorrow. How then is it possible for you to choose not to eat an apple for lunch tomorrow? Even if God does not force you in any way, it seems his present knowledge of your future requires that your choices are already determined.
Medieval philosophers struggle with this and other conflicts with free will. Most give up on metaphysical libertarianism in favor of some form of compatibilism. This is to say they maintain that our choices are free even though they are determined by antecedent conditions.
In his Sentences Commentary, Peter John Olivi makes a long and impassioned argument for an unadulterated metaphysical libertarian conception of free will. Ockham embraces Olivi’s position without ever making much of an argument for it. In Ockham’s view, we experience freedom. We can no more dismiss this experience than we can dismiss our experience of the external world. Ockham goes to great lengths to adjust his account of divine foreknowledge and anything else that might otherwise threaten free will in order to accommodate it. He writes,
The will is freely able to will something and not to will it. By this I mean that it is able to destroy the willing that it has and produce anew a contrary effect, or it is equally able in itself to continue that same effect and not produce a new one. It is able to do all of this without any prior change in the intellect, or in the will, or in something outside them. The idea is that the will is equal for producing and not producing because, with no difference in antecedent conditions, it is able to produce and not to produce. It is poised equally over contrary effects in such a way in fact, that it is able to cause love or hatred of something…. To deny every agent this equal or contrary power is to destroy every praise and blame, every council and deliberation, every freedom of the will. Indeed, without it, the will would not make a human being free any more than appetite does an ass. [Opera Philosophica, pp. 319-21]
Ockham’s reference to an ass here is significant in connection with the famous thought experiment known as Buridan’s Ass.
Jean Buridan was a younger contemporary of Ockham’s. Although he embraced and elaborated Ockham’s nominalism, he openly rejected metaphysical libertarianism, arguing that the human intellect determines the human will. He may have engaged in a public debate with Ockham over the nature of human freedom. At any rate, his name somehow became associated with the following thought experiment.
Imagine a hungry donkey poised between two equally delicious piles of hay. The donkey has reason to eat the hay, but because he caught sight of both piles at the same time, he has no more reason to approach one pile than the other. For lack of any way to break the tie, the donkey starves to death. A human being, in contrast, would never make such an ass of himself. The reason is that, in human beings, the will is not determined by the intellect. Free will is the uniquely human dignity that enables us to break the tie between two equally reasonable options.
The French philosopher Pierre Bale (1647-1706) is the first on record to call this thought experiment “Buridan’s Ass.” Although Buridan mentions the case of a dog poised between food and water, he never discusses the case of the donkey in connection with freedom. It is therefore somewhat of a puzzle why the thought experiment is named after him. Interestingly, Peter John Olivi does discuss the case of the donkey in connection with freedom, and we see Ockham echoing that text here.
So, in the end, Ockham’s ethics is dictated by his empiricism. We experience free will. Therefore, free will is at the core of human nature. Theology tells us that we are made in God’s image. Therefore, free will is at the core of God’s nature. But theology also tells us that God is always good. Therefore, God’s free will must be the objective determinant of goodness.
Setting aside his divine command theory, Ockham’s ethics is rather unremarkable, coming to more or less the same thing as that of his colleagues who reject divine command theory. One might think Ockham takes a long way around the barn just to arrive at yet another conventional account of Christian virtue! But Ockham never minds taking the long way around for the sake of consistency. We see the same unflagging determination in his political theory
Although Ockham was summoned to the papal court in Avignon to defend a number of “suspect theses” extracted from his work, largely concerning the sacrament of the altar, he was never found guilty of heresy, and his conflict with the papacy ultimately had nothing to do with the sacrament of the altar. While staying in Avignon, Ockham met Michael Cesena (1270-1342), the Minister General of the Franciscan Order, who was there in protest of the Pope’s recent pronouncements about the Franciscan vow of poverty. Michael asked Ockham to study these pronouncements, whereupon Ockham joined the protest and soon became irretrievably entangled in a political imbroglio. Leaving academia behind for good, he nevertheless marshaled his central philosophical insights into the debate. While Ockham was not allowed to publish his political treatises, they circulated widely underground, indirectly influencing major developments in political thought.
Who would have guessed that at the root of these developments lay the Franciscan vow of poverty? In Matthew 19, Jesus says to a man, “If you wish to be perfect, go, sell all you have, give your money to the poor, and come, and follow me.” The man who was to become St. Francis of Assisi (1182-1226) took these instructions personally. Raised in a wealthy family, St. Francis gave up the worldly life, founding the Order of the Friar Minor, and requiring all its members to take a vow of poverty. From the very beginning there was controversy over what exactly this vow entailed. By the 1320s, various factions had come to the breaking point.
Michael Cesena promoted the “radical” interpretation, according to which Franciscans should not only live simply but also own nothing, not even the robes on their backs. Pope Nicholas III (1210/1220-1280) had sanctioned this interpretation by arranging for the papacy officially to possess everything that the Franciscans used, including the very food they ate. Living in absolute poverty enabled the Franciscans to preach convincingly against avarice, and, much to the chagrin of Pope John XXII (1244-1334), raise questions about the ever-expanding papal palace in Avignon.
John was determined to amass great wealth for the church and the Franciscan vow of poverty was getting in the way. Trained as a lawyer, John worked up a good argument for revoking Nicholas’s arrangement. Given that the Franciscans enjoyed exclusive use of the donations they received, they were the de facto owners. Papal “ownership” of Franciscan property was ownership in name alone.
As a nominalist, however, Ockham was in an excellent position to show why reducing something to a name is not the same as reducing it to nothing at all. A name is a mental concept, and a mental concept is an intention. Ockham set out to show that the intention to use is distinct from the intention to own.
Ockham derives his definition of ownership from metaphysical libertarianism. Ownership is not just a conventional relationship established through social agreement. It is a natural relationship that arises through the act of making something of your own free will. Free will naturally confers ownership because it implies sole responsibility. Suppose you freely make a choice. Since you could have done otherwise, you are the true cause of the result. To own something is to do what you will with it.
The Franciscans do not do as they will with the donations given to them, according to Ockham, but rather as the owner wills. They are therefore merely using the donations and do not own them. Granted, in normal practice, this distinction may be entirely undetectable, because the will of the owner matches that of the user. But if a conflict of wills should arise, the distinction would become readily apparent. Suppose someone donates some cloth to the Order intending it to be used for robes. The friars must use it for robes even if they would rather use it for something else. And if the donor wants the cloth back even after it is made into robes, the friars will have no basis for refusing and no legal recourse. Ockham puts the crucial point in terms of crucial language: the owner retains a right (ius) to what he owns.
The notion of a right is one of the most important features of modern political theory. Its emergence in the history of Western thought is a long and complicated story. Nevertheless, the Franciscan poverty debate is standardly considered an important watershed, in which Ockham played a significant role.
Ockham extends his commitment to poverty beyond just the Franciscan order, convinced that wealth is an inappropriate source of power for the Catholic Church as a whole. In his view, the Catholic Church has a spiritual power which sets it apart from the secular world. This conviction leads Ockham to propose the doctrine that was to become the foundation of the United States Constitution: separation of church and state.
Throughout the Middle Ages, popes and emperors vied for supremacy across Europe. The political momentum was split in two directions and it was not at all clear which way things would go. One side pushed for hierocracy, where the pope, as the highest authority, appoints the emperor. The other side pushed for imperialism, where the emperor, as the highest authority, appoints the pope. Often the pushing came to shoving; it seemed there would be no end to the ill will and bloodshed.
Ockham boldly proposes a third alternative: the pope and the emperor should be separate but equal, each supreme in his own domain. This was an outrageous suggestion, unwelcome on both sides. Ockham’s argument for it stems from reflections that foreshadow the “state of nature” thought experiments of premier modern political theorists Thomas Hobbes (1588-1679), John Locke (1632-1704) and Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1712-1778).
In the Garden of Eden, God gave the earth to human beings to use to their common benefit. As long as we were willing to share there was no need for property among us. After the fall, however, human beings became selfish and exploitative. Laws became necessary to restrain immoderate appetite for secular or “temporal” goods and to prevent the neglect of their management. Since laws are useless without the ability to enforce them, we arrived at the need for secular power. The function of the secular power is to punish law breakers and in general coerce everyone into obeying the law.
By renouncing property, the Franciscans were attempting to live as God originally intended. In a perfect world, there would be no need for property and the coercive authority it spawns. All Christians should aspire to this anarchic utopia, even though they may never fully achieve it. In the meanwhile, they should avoid mixing the spiritual and the secular as much as possible. Ockham writes,
For this reason, the head of Christians does not, as a rule, have power to punish secular wrongs with a capital penalty and other bodily penalties and it is for thus punishing such wrongs that temporal power and riches are chiefly necessary; such punishment is granted chiefly to the secular power. The pope therefore, can, as a rule, correct wrongdoers only with a spiritual penalty. It is not, therefore, necessary that he should excel in temporal power or abound in temporal riches, but it is enough that Christians should willingly obey him. [A Letter to the Friars Minor and other Writings, p. 204]
For Ockham, the separation of church and state is a separation of the ideal and the real.
Ockham mentions democracy only in passing, arguing in favor of monarchy as the best form of secular government. Moreover, he finds representational forms of government objectionable on the grounds that there is no such thing as a common will. Ockham is not holding out for a superhuman leader. On the contrary, he seems to think that a fairly ordinary, good man can make a decent king. One wonders if Louis of Bavaria, to whose protection he and Michael fled, inspired this confidence. Perhaps Ockham is content with monarchy because, in his view, the secular world will always be intrinsically flawed. He sets his hopes instead on the spiritual world, and this is why he was so bitterly disappointed in Pope John XXII.
Ockham’s battle with the papacy continued after John’s death through two successive popes. Although Ockham never came to criticize the institution of the papacy itself, as would later Protestant thinkers, he did accuse the popes he opposed of heresy and called for their expulsion. Ironically, Ockham’s extensive analysis of the concept of heresy turns into a defense of free speech.
In keeping with his doctrine of the separation of church and state, Ockham maintains that the pope, and only the pope, has the right to level spiritual penalties, and only spiritual penalties, against someone who knowingly asserts theological falsehoods and refuses to be corrected. A man might unknowingly assert a theological falsehood a thousand times, however. As long as he is willing to be corrected, he should not be judged a heretic, especially by the pope.
Ockham’s political treatises are strewn with biblical exegesis, often glaringly ad hoc and sometimes quite interesting, as in the present case. In Matthew 28:20 Jesus promises his disciples: “I will be with you always, to the end of the age.” This text traditionally provided justification for the doctrine of papal infallibility according to which the pope cannot be wrong when speaking about official church matters. Ockham rejects this doctrine, however, arguing that the minimum required for Jesus to keep his promise is that one human being remain faithful at any given time, and this one could be anyone, even a single baptized infant. This implies that the entire institution of the church could become completely corrupt. As a result, any theological claim, no matter how ancient or universally accepted, is always open for dispute.
Even more interesting, however, is Ockham’s view of non-theological speech. He writes that
…purely philosophical assertions which do not pertain to theology should not be solemnly condemned or forbidden by anyone, because in connection with such assertions anyone at all ought to be free to say freely what pleases him, [Dialogus, I.2.22]
This statement long predates the Areopagitica of John Milton (1608-1674), which is typically heralded as the earliest defense of free speech in Western history.
Ockham’s contributions in political thought are less known and appreciated than they may have been if he had been able to publish them. Likewise, there is no telling what he might have accomplished in philosophy if he had been allowed to carry on with his academic career. Ockham was ahead of his time. His role in history was to make way for new ideas, boldly planting seeds that grew and flourished after his death.
John Carroll University
U. S. A.
Last updated: January 3, 2007 | Originally published: