Omniscience is an attribute having to do with knowledge; it is the attribute of “having knowledge of everything.” Many philosophers consider omniscience to be an attribute possessed only by a divine being, such as the God of Western monotheism. However, the Eastern followers of Jainism allow omniscience to be an attribute of some human beings. But what exactly is it to be omniscient? The term’s root Latin words are “omni” (all) and “scientia” (knowledge), and these suggest a rough layman’s definition of omniscience as “knowledge of everything.” Yet even though this definition may be somewhat useful, there are a number of questions which the definition alone does not address. First, there is the general question of what exactly our human knowledge is and whether or not an understanding of human knowledge can be applied to God. For example, does God have beliefs? And what kind of evidence does God need for these beliefs to count as knowledge? There is also the question of what exactly this “everything” in the definition is supposed to mean. Does God know everything which is actual but not all that is possible? Does God know the future, and if so, how exactly? This last question is a perennial difficulty and will require a thorough investigation.
There are a number of scriptures that remark on the vastness of God’s knowledge. For instance the Qur’an (alt. Koran) states “[W]hat the heavens and earth contain [is God’s], and all that lies between them and underneath the soil. You have no need to speak aloud; for He has knowledge of all that is secret, and all that is hidden. . . . God has knowledge of all things.” (Suras 20:5ff; 24:35). Psalm 139 expresses similar thoughts:
Even before there is a word on my tongue,
Behold, O LORD, You know it all. . . .
Such knowledge is too wonderful for me;
It is too high, I cannot attain to it.
Where can I go from Your Spirit?
Or where can I flee from Your presence?
If I ascend to heaven, You are there;
If I make my bed in Sheol, behold, You are there. (NASB, vs. 4, 6-8)
These and many other passages from the sacred scriptures of Judaism, Christianity, and Islam all hint at the awesome breadth and depth of God’s knowledge. God is said not only to know the daily activities of his creatures but to know even their thoughts. God as creator knows about the heavens, the earth, and the whole physical cosmos. This much at least is supported by scriptures. But the scriptures are for the most part not philosophical texts and do little to offer a rigorous analysis of omniscience, a task that largely has been left to the philosophers within the traditions. This entry will navigate through the landscape of arguments presented by those theistic philosophers who have tried to make further progress in comprehending this attribute of God.
The first few sections analyze the concept of knowledge itself with particular application to God. After getting clearer on the different components of God’s knowledge, a number of different analyses of the quality and scope of God’s knowledge are considered in an attempt to sort out some plausible definitions of omniscience. The final sections take up one of the most difficult aspects of understanding God’s knowledge, his knowledge of the future. Several models are presented with an eye toward seeing whether or not the models can be reconciled with human freedom, divine providence, and a robust account of God’s omniscience.
It will be helpful to begin an exploration into God’s knowledge with a very brief account of human knowledge. Typically, knowledge has been thought of as a certain kind of belief. For starters, it must be a true belief. It would be a mistake to claim to know that “2+2=5” because 2 and 2 equal 4, not 5. Similarly one could not know that humans lived on the moon during the Clinton administration, because none did.
But is a true belief the same thing as knowledge? No. Here is an example to motivate why this cannot be. Suppose that a friend of yours has a broken compass that is no longer polarized so that the needle can spin freely. Your friend likes this compass a lot and even though he realizes that it does not work, sometimes he uses it to give people directions. One day, a stranger comes to your friend and asks for directions, specifically where north is (it’s a very cloudy day and there is no moss around). Your friend graciously pulls out his compass and proceeds to spin the needle. It lands on north. And, as it turns out, the compass is right. Question: Does your friend know where north is? It seems not. Why? Because your friend has really bad evidence for believing this since it is far more likely that his compass is pointing in the wrong direction. Your friend has a true belief, but he does not have knowledge. Something else is needed, namely, good evidence. Although it is debatable that all beliefs which count as knowledge must be based on good evidence, all knowledge is usually thought as a true belief that is either based on sufficient evidence (or a proper ground) or is formed in the right sort of way.
This is a rough account of what human knowledge is often thought to be. But there are additional complications when trying to apply this account to God. In what follows, a more thorough discussion of each of the elements of knowledge (belief, truth, and the way beliefs are grounded) will be undertaken in order to get clearer on what God’s knowledge may be like.
Some argue that, strictly speaking, at bottom it is not beliefs which are true; instead it is sentences or propositions. When we believe that “Snow is white” we believe that this sentence (or proposition) is true. Thus God’s knowledge is ultimately of sentences, propositions, or whatever the real truth-bearers turn out to be. (See also What Sorts of Things are True (or False).)
First, consider the possibility that the truth-bearers are sentences. Sentences are essential components of a language. Here it is useful to distinguish between sentence-types and sentence-tokens. A sentence-token is a concrete entity such as some ink on a paper, pixels on a screen, a sound uttered by someone’s voice, or some other physical object. The sentences being read on your computer screen are all sentence-tokens. Sentence-tokens are instances of sentence-types. A sentence-type is an abstract entity that is multi-exemplifiable, that is, it can have instances in more than one place at a time. The sentence-token on your screen “Tully is the author of this article” and the ink blot in English on my desk (which reads: “Tully is the author of this article”) are both instances of the same sentence-type.
One objection to the theory that sentence-tokens are truth-bearers is that if there had never been anyone uttering a sentence, there would be no truth. Yet this is very implausible for surely it was true that there were plants before there were humans and other language users. This is a strike against sentence-tokens as the ultimate bearers of truth.
The truth-bearers of God’s knowledge do not seem to be sentence-types either because of an objection that might be called “the problem of indexicals”. For suppose God at some time expresses this proposition audibly in English, “I am God,” and Jim Morrison also says “I am God.” Spoken by God, this is evidently true but for Morrison this is false. It would seem, then, that the sentence-type expressed by both of these propositions would then bear two contradictory truth-values, that of being true and false—an absurd consequence. Therefore sentence-tokens and sentence-types should both be rejected as ultimate constituents of God’s knowledge.
In order to solve these problems, many have turned to propositions as the objects of God’s beliefs. Propositions are non-linguistic, abstract objects. Both of the following sentences can be thought to express the same proposition: “The father is a father by paternity”; “Pater paternitate est pater.” The advantage of holding that propositions are truth-bearers is that the abstract character of propositions does not commit one to thinking that God must be essentially related to time nor speaks in an ineffable divine language. (He might, but the propositional account does not entail this.) Additionally if the truth-bearers are propositions, it can be thought that when God and Jim Morrison both say “I am God” they are expressing two different propositions and not just the same sentence-type.
Ordinarily, in contrast to beliefs, propositions are to be thought of as non-mental entities. If propositions are truth-bearers, then it was true that “There are dinosaurs” when there were dinosaurs and no humans or other smart creatures around to believe this. So propositions have an advantage over beliefs as truth-bearers, because if propositions do the truth-bearing then there can be true statements when there are no believers.
But since God has always existed and been aware of everything, it may be that God’s beliefs are good enough to do the trick and there is no need for propositions, just so long as God believes all the facts. So for the theist who believes that everything is dependent on God in some sense—and thus at least partially on God’s mind—it may be appropriate to adopt the view that the propositions which humans believe are just God’s beliefs. After all, the only significant difference between propositions and beliefs is that propositions are ordinarily thought of as non-psychological, mind-independent entities. Positing beliefs rather than “free-floating” propositions as the truth-bearers of God’s knowledge is a more natural way of deferring to God as the source of all knowledge. Perhaps a theist can say with Berkeley, “Esse est percipi”—to be is to be perceived, or more precisely, “Esse verum est Deo credi”—to be true is (just) to be believed by God. God is the source of his beliefs and God’s beliefs are the source of what is true; false beliefs arise from creatures mistakenly believing to be true what God believes is false.
Whether or not propositions are just God’s beliefs will not be fully settled in this entry. Since much of the literature on omniscience understands the concept as knowledge of true propositions, the remaining sections of the article will not suppose that the ultimate truth-bearers of God’s knowledge are beliefs or propositions and the two terms will be used interchangeably to refer to whatever the truth-bearers happen to be.
Another distinction is useful in getting clearer on the nature of God’s beliefs. This is the distinction between occurrent and dispositional beliefs. To have an occurrent belief that something is true is to be actively thinking that something is true. For instance, supposing that person P believes in God, P is only currently believing in God if P is actively thinking that this proposition is true, “God exists.”
But sometimes we are inclined to say things like this too, “Yes, I’ve believed that all my life. I’ve always believed God exists, even if I haven’t always been actively thinking this.” If this way of describing beliefs is right, what we are talking about cannot be an occurrent belief since we have not spent all of our life thinking about this or any other proposition. Rather, we have what is called a dispositional belief. If a person has a dispositional belief this means she would be disposed or inclined to have an occurrent belief in a proposition if she were to think about the proposition.
But how best to describe God’s beliefs? The downside of the dispositional account of God’s beliefs is that dispositional beliefs entail that God is not always aware of all that is true. A dispositional account of beliefs is suitable for making sense of limited human cognitive activity but would be deficient for a perfect thinker. If it is possible to make sense of a being who can be aware of all propositions simultaneously it is preferable to think of all of God’s beliefs as occurrent. Dispositional beliefs are adequate for finite humans, but the goal is always to be aware of everything that one believes. [For arguments in favor of dispositional beliefs see Hunt (1995)].
Not all describe God’s knowledge in the typical way of God having a very large set of justified, true beliefs. William Alston has argued that God’s knowledge should be characterized in a different way because, no matter how one understands God’s knowledge, it can be shown that God has no beliefs (287-307).
According to Alston, there are two plausible ways to characterize God’s knowledge without beliefs. The predominant view in contemporary philosophy of religion is that his knowledge is propositional in content. Alston thinks God’s knowledge may be thought of as propositional without God having beliefs. Call this the propositional view of God’s knowledge. An alternative view is that God does not grasp the truth of propositions; rather he is immediately and directly aware of the world without any propositional intermediaries that are about the world. This is the non-propositional view of God’s knowledge.
Beginning with the latter position, Alston takes Aquinas to be one of its chief representatives. According to Aquinas, God is not dependent for his existence on anything, including his attributes. God is thought of as absolutely simple, not having any real parts distinct from God’s essence. God’s simplicity encompasses every attribute of God including his knowledge. To put it crudely, there is no difference between God, his knowledge, and the objects of God’s knowledge. So the object of God’s knowledge turns out to be God’s own essence. God’s essence contains within it the likeness of everything and God knows everything by knowing his own essence.
Alston admits that this way of knowing is very mysterious and we will never be able to adequately understand how it is that God knows everything. But he thinks we can liken God’s knowledge to our initial perceptual vision of a scene, where we have yet to extract from the scene separate facts. We have an awareness of things but the awareness is without a propositional structuring. In this initial perception, there is a unity present in which we have yet to separate subject from object, knower from things known. For humans, we do not have understanding until we begin to separate our knowledge from the things known and separate the scene into a distinct set of facts. Yet we lose and long for the underlying unity of the initial awareness. God, it may be thought, retains the unity and can have understanding without piecemeal, discursive thought present in human reasoning.
That is a rough description of what non-propositional knowledge is like, perhaps not fully illuminating, but not incoherent. If one accepts divine simplicity, one has a pretty strong argument against knowledge as propositional beliefs:
1. God is simple, including God’s knowledge.
2. Propositional thought structure is complex.
3. If God’s thought structure is propositional, this means that either God’s beliefs just are propositions or the content of his beliefs are of mind-independent propositions.
4. Either way, God’s knowledge cannot be composed of beliefs.
If one balks at the idea of divine simplicity, there is a second argument for why God’s knowledge is non-propositional. We humans are limited. We cannot understand any concrete thing without abstracting from it and formulating propositions about its abstract features. For example, we cannot fully understand Jimmy Carter but only various aspects of him, that he is a Democrat, that he is human, and so forth. But God is not limited. His knowledge is complete. God can understand everything about Jimmy Carter all at once without separating aspects of him from Jimmy Carter. He does this by knowing Jimmy Carter himself. So there is no reason for God to employ propositions if his knowledge is unlimited in the way just described. Since God does not have to employ propositions, he has no need of beliefs.
If a propositional account of God’s knowledge is to be preferred, Alston thinks that this too can be described without the employment of beliefs. He calls this view the “intuitive” conception of knowledge. Instead of having a belief that p is true—where p is a proposition that is true if it corresponds with some fact F—he thinks that God could be directly aware of the fact, F, with no belief about p at all. (Even though God is directly aware of facts, and not propositions, he still thinks that this can rightly be called a propositional way of knowing because the facts which would correspond to true propositions have the same isomorphic structure. For more on facts and correspondence, see Truth as Correspondence). Knowing something would then be a completely different kind of psychological state than believing something. One can have a belief without the belief being true. However if knowledge is a state of awareness of a fact, there is an intrinsic relationship between awareness of facts and truth that beliefs do not have. All of God’s knowledge would be infallible in a very strong sense.
Alston thinks that if we compare this kind of knowledge with human knowledge (true belief grounded in the right way) we can see that the former is better because “[t]here is no potentially distorting medium in the way, no possibly unreliable witnesses, no fallible signs or indications” (190). We humans have a lot of beliefs that we are not always immediately aware of and could be wrong about many of them. We would gladly trade this kind of knowledge for always being directly aware of the facts. Intuitive knowledge just seems like a superior kind of knowledge. Since God is perfect he should be thought of as having this superior kind of knowledge, a knowledge without beliefs. [For objections to this view see Hasker (1988)].
A discussion of all of the different theories of truth is well beyond the scope of this entry. Instead only two theories will be discussed which present the most likely candidates for the kind of truth involved in God’s knowledge. Since the belief and justification components of knowledge provide more complications for a theory about God’s knowledge, this section will be relatively brief. For additional complications, see Truth.
The most widely held account of truth is that truth is a relationship, namely one of correspondence (See Correspondence Theory). A belief is true if the proposition held to be true corresponds with some fact. “2+2=4” is true if it is a fact that 2+2=4. “John McCain is now President of the United States” is true if right now it is a fact that he is the president and it is false if this fact does not now obtain. What is a fact? This is an area of current debate. Some think of facts as concrete entities like events which contain substances and their properties as constituents. But it is doubtful that a theist can maintain this understanding of facts since it is often thought that God could know propositions about God’s thoughts or about uncreated creatures. Yet there seems to be no concrete entity or entities which these kinds of propositions could correspond with to give them their truth value. Thus for many theists, facts have been understood like propositions as abstract entities—states of affairs that are either actually, possibly, or necessarily existing.
Above it was mentioned that William Alston proposes that God does not have beliefs. Instead, God has knowledge by either being directly aware of facts or by being directly aware of his own essence. If Alston is right, then the truth element involved in God’s knowledge is not truth as correspondence since there are no beliefs or propositions as constituents of God’s knowledge to correspond with facts.
Alston at one point appeals to Descartes’ formulation of knowledge as a clear and distinct perception to clarify his view that God can have knowledge by a kind of perception without beliefs. Although Alston does not do so explicitly himself, Descartes’ thoughts can also be used to illuminate what truth would be in the absence of beliefs. According to this understanding, perceptions or “awarenesses” are true if and only if they are clear and distinct. Moreover, we might just hink of truth as this quality of being clear and distinct. For humans, not all of our perceptions are clear and distinct, so some of our perceptions will not be true. But God’s perceptual faculties do not suffer from human limitations—all of his perceptions (of either his own essence or of mind independent facts) would be perfectly clear and distinct. Thus built into God’s perceptual faculties is that they yield qualitatively perfect perceptions and thus everything which is perceived must be true.
The traditional account of knowledge is true belief plus something else. What this something else is has often been called justification (or sometimes “warrant”). From the time of the Ancient philosophers to the present, there has been an endless debate on the nature of this third component of knowledge. Some have even thought that justification, being an essentially normative (and perhaps moral) notion, should not be attributed to God who is the author or ground of normativity and does not need to justify his beliefs.
This debate about what justification is and whether God needs it will not be resolved here. Even if God does not have to have justified beliefs and does not need reasons for all of his items of knowledge, God still needs cognitive faculties to provide him experience or a proper ground for at least some things. Thus we can understand this third component of knowledge less controversially in terms of the kinds of cognitive faculties needed to yield a wide scope of knowledge. A cognitive faculty is simply a particular ability to know something. Perception is an example of a faculty of human cognition that allows us to know about the physical world. Memory is the faculty that allows us to know about the past. Below, each of the classical faculties which have been thought to provide humans with evidence for their beliefs will be discussed in relation to God’s knowledge.
Most often when we ask for evidence for someone’s belief, it is propositional evidence that we are asking for. We are asking for propositional reasons to believe something. Many times, we will use our beliefs that certain propositions are true as evidence for some of our other beliefs. Using beliefs as evidence for other beliefs is using inferential evidence. Here is an example. In order for Jane to justifiably believe that Brutus killed Caesar, Jane may need to know that the history book that she is reading was written by a credible historian. To know that cigarettes cause cancer, Jane would perhaps need to know that studies have shown this to be true. When we are reasoning inferentially, we are employing arguments. Thus inferential evidence can come as a deductive, inductive, or abductive argument.
A deductive argument which provides knowledge is one in which the premises guarantee the truth of the conclusion such that if the premises were true it would be impossible for the conclusion to be false.
1.If John Sidoti is Sicilian, then John Sidoti is Italian.
2.John Sidoti is Sicilian.
3.Thus, John Sidoti is Italian.
Deductive reasoning is an excellent way to come to a conclusion because the premises necessitate the truth of the conclusion. Since deductive arguments provide an infallible guide to knowledge of the conclusions, if God reasons inferentially there is little reason to think that he does not reason deductively.
An inductive argument which yields knowledge is one in which the premises do not guarantee the truth of the conclusion but make it very likely that a conclusion is true.
1.98% of the students at the Ohio State University have high school diplomas.
2.Titus is a student at the Ohio State University.
3.Thus, Titus has a high school diploma.
The conclusion of this argument does not necessarily follow from the premises. Inductive reasoning is thus a fallible way of reasoning, and as such, most have not attributed this kind of reasoning to God. Since the truth of the premises does not guarantee that the conclusion is true, God could be wrong if he reasoned inductively—an unfortunate feature of a perfect being. But as will be seen below, there are some who think that God is omniscient yet could be mistaken about some things. For example, if the future is to some degree indeterminate, God could possibly be mistaken about its outcome. Still, God could make reasonable predictions about the future if he reasons inductively. Thus an inductive account of some of God’s knowledge may be attractive as a way of granting the most and qualitatively best knowledge possible given necessary limiting conditions which are thought to inhere in the world.
An abductive argument is an argument to the best explanation. Inferential knowledge of a proposition via an abductive argument would be such that the conclusion yields a true and epistemically plausible explanation for the facts provided in the premises.
1. There are things which came into existence.
2. Whatever comes into existence is caused to exist by something or other.
3. There cannot be an infinite series of past causes.
4. Therefore, there was a first uncaused cause.
5. Thus God exists (because the best explanation for this first cause is God).
Like inductive reasoning, abductive reasoning is thought to be fallible, again, a serious drawback in attributing it to a perfect being. One important difference between inferential and abductive reasoning that counts even more against the possibility of God reasoning abductively is that while inductive reasoning is forward looking, abductive reasoning is present or backward looking and may be unnecessary for God to have. There might be good reasons to think that God can only have fallible knowledge of the future, but there are few reasons why God could not have infallible knowledge of the present and past so long as (a) there has never been a time in which God has not existed and (b) God has perfect “vision” of all that is present to him or that he remembers. Presumably God would never need to make a best guess about why something is the way it is, since he has “seen” all that has been before and all that is now. So it is unlikely that God reasons abductively if he has the sorts of cognitive faculties like perception and memory which will be discussed below.
One final thing should be said about God’s reasoning in general. When humans reason by inference, they do so discursively with a temporal lag between seeing the premises as true and using the premises as bases for the conclusion. In other words, we reason piecemeal and working through our reasoning by way of an argument takes time. Most who think that God can reason inferentially do not think his reasoning is discursive like this. God can see the argument all at once and see immediately that certain premises lead to a conclusion. The premises are evidentially prior to the conclusion but he does not think of them temporally prior to believing the conclusion.
Not all evidence comes from inferential cognitive faculties. More often than not, we take direct experience as evidence for the truth of propositions and think that we have faculties which can provide us this more immediate kind of evidence. The perception of a watch on your neighbor’s hand is taken as evidence that “Your neighbor is wearing a watch” is true. The feeling of a sharp pain in my leg is evidence that “I am hurting” is true. The feeling of one’s legs being crossed under the desk is evidence for the belief that “My legs are crossed.” At a minimum, perceptual, introspective, and kinesthetic experience seem to count as evidence for some beliefs. In addition, memory, testimony, and a priori intuitions have been thought to yield immediate evidence as well.
Many theists speak of God as “seeing” the world, “hearing” their prayers, and “feeling” sad for sin. Less often is God spoken of as smelling or tasting something. But in general, it is thought that God can perceive the world. (See The Epistemology of Perception.) Since most theists think of God as non-bodily, God’s perception will only be analogously like human perception. God’s sight, for example, will not involve the reception of light into the eye and his sight will never yield misleading or “fuzzy” data. Accordingly having perfect perception would seem to involve removing all of the limits of human perception. For instance, God’s seeing would not be limited to seeing the surface of material objects but could penetrate through the solid objects to what is beyond. He would lack unclear, peripheral vision and instead would be able to focus on everything clearly all at once.
God’s relationship with time will also affect the scope of God’s perceptions. If God is atemporal, God’s perceptual faculty should be thought of as God’s ability to perceive all of time all at once. If God is temporal, his perception would best be thought of like human perception, as awareness of only what is present.
The introspective faculty provides direct insight of one’s own internal thoughts, feelings, and emotions (See Introspection). That I am now in pain can be known just by experiencing pain. That I am now thinking is also known by introspection. Since God is traditionally thought to be personal—enjoying psychological faculties involving beliefs, feelings, thoughts, and so forth—there is little reason to think that some of God’s knowledge is not gained by something like human introspection.
Kinesthetic awareness is an experience of one’s bodily movements and the location (and perhaps feeling) of one’s bodily parts. Whether or not kinesthetic awareness is a type of introspection or something different entirely is a matter of debate. But either way, it would seem that God would lack this type of evidence and its corresponding faculty since God is usually not thought to have a body. If God did have a body (say, as Jesus), then God could have kinesthetic awareness.
The faculty of memory provides immediate knowledge of the past. The question of whether or not God remembers things is essentially tied to questions about God’s relationship to time. If God is atemporal, then he would have no memory, since memory consists of being aware of a past experience. But if God is atemporal, then he would have no past experiences to recall. Thus God only has memory if God is a temporal being.
Some think that humans have a testimony faculty which enables them to have knowledge of some propositions just by hearing certain kinds of testimony that something is true. It is not clear why God could not have testimony as evidence but there seems to be no reason to think that he does. This is because God would already have overwhelming evidence from his other faculties for whatever a creature testified to be true. Since there are no circumstances in which testimony would be needed by God in order for him to have knowledge, there is little reason to suppose that God ever has knowledge which is based on testimony.
Finally, God is thought to have knowledge of all necessarily true propositions such as “2+2=4,” “God exists,” and “if x is a bachelor, then x is an unmarried male.” God does not reason by inference that these propositions are true nor does he experience that they are true. God just intuits they are true by an a priori intuition (See A Priori and A Posteriori).
There is wide debate about what a priori intuition is for humans so it is even more difficult to explain what it is for God. Some have thought that having a priori knowledge just amounts to understanding the meaning of the terms in a statement; if one were to understand the terms, then one would know that it is true. Others have suggested that it is a kind of grasping of abstract objects and their relations between them (for instance, grasping the numbers 2 and 4 and the relations of adding and equaling in the proposition 2+2=4). Whatever a priori intuition turns out to be for God, most think that God enjoys this cognitive faculty.
How great is God’s knowledge? How much does he know? In order to answer these questions it is not enough just to offer an analysis of the components of God’s knowledge; one must also specify the scope of his knowledge. There are a number of ways this might be done.
The first three attempts at an analysis of the scope of God’s knowledge listed below have been called non-comparative notions because they specify the range or amount of God’s knowledge without comparing God’s knowledge to the knowledge of any other being. The final four are comparative accounts of God’s knowledge. Proponents of these views recognize God’s knowledge as perhaps more limited than the non-comparative notions allow but still think that omniscience can be explained in terms of a comparison with other beings, even if God’s knowledge is significantly restricted. The last of the four also stands out as not only being a non-comparative account, but as the only analysis which does not state that it is necessary for an omniscient being to have knowledge. Rather it is sufficient to be omniscient if one has a significant degree of power to have knowledge.
In spite of an initial feeling of piety that might accompany embracing this definition, it should be rejected. Why? Recall what knowledge is. It requires at a minimum holding what is true. But some propositions are false such as 2+2=5. Since it is false it cannot be known by anyone, especially God who most think could not even believe something that is false let alone know it.
According to this clause, God knows a lot—in fact he knows all that could possibly be known. This is a very strong version of omniscience and in all likelihood has been the one most widely held among theists. On this interpretation, God knows all the present truths and all truths of the past and future. God also knows the propositions that must be true or are merely possibly true. For instance, God knows that “necessarily, all humans are not triangles” and “possibly, the Steelers sign a linebacker named Tristan this year.” Furthermore, many who hold to this definition think that God knows all of the subjunctive propositions which are sometimes of events that are not actual but could have been as in the statement “if the U.S. had not entered World War II, Germany would have won.”
Many have proposed (iii) [i.e., Having knowledge of all true propositions and having no false beliefs] instead of (ii) [i.e., Having knowledge of all true propositions] in order to make clear that an omniscient being not only believes all true propositions but is not mistaken about any beliefs either. But as Edward Wierenga has pointed out, adding this clause in (iii) is at least redundant and possibly incoherent (39) for it seems to presuppose it is possible that for someone to know all true propositions and yet have a false belief. Suppose that God could. If God knew all true propositions, he would know that he believed some false proposition. But it may not be coherent to both know p and know that you believe not-p.
Yet even if this is coherent, says Wierenga, the additional clause about God not having false beliefs can be shown to be redundant. Presumably God has deductive cognitive faculties. Now if God both knows p and believes not-p, then God believes a contradiction, and anything whatsoever can be validly deduced from a contradiction. So if God did know p and believed not-p, God would deduce all propositions from this and believe everything. But this seems impossible. Thus there is no reason to add the additional clause “having no false beliefs” because knowing all true propositions seems to be incompatible with having false beliefs.
Although holding this definition is consistent with believing that God knows all true propositions, it leaves open the possibility that God does not know everything. Those that prefer this analysis of omniscience think that there are some propositions that likely God does not know.
Recall the discussion above about indexicals (See Beliefs, Sentences, Propositions and God’s Knowledge). Some have argued that it is impossible for God to know the proposition expressed by Jones when Jones says “I am thinking.” The idea is that such propositions involving an indexical term like “I” are not identical with propositions involving proper names such as “Jones” in the sentence, “Jones is thinking.” God could know “Jones is thinking” but propositions with an indexical like “I” can only be grasped by whoever is expressing the proposition, in this case, Jones.
In response, some have argued that “I” refers to a haecciety, a mysterious entity that individuates Jones from other humans, but an entity nonetheless that God can know (Wierenga, 50-6). Jones and every other human have in common “humanity” but differ by having individual haeccities. In knowing “I am thinking” when thought by Jones, God knows the act of Jones’ thinking & Jones’ haecciety and thereby knows that this proposition is true. But there are questions about whether or not God could know haeccities of persons or objects other than God (Rosenkrantz, 220-4).
Another set of propositions that God may not know are propositions about causally undetermined, future events. Examples are random events at the quantum level or free creaturely actions. Whether or not God has knowledge of the future will be discussed below.
It should be reiterated that proponents of this limited view of omniscience still want to maintain that omniscience can be characterized quite sufficiently as a comparative notion. They are not denying that God is omniscient. They simply think that omniscience need not be thought of as necessarily having knowledge of every true proposition. True, it may seem strange that God learns things. Nevertheless, they insist, no one who exists knows as much as God. God still knows a lot more than anyone else.
This definition is also compatible with the second non-comparative definition above (having knowledge of all true propositions) and proponents of this definition typically think that God does not know all true propositions. But this analysis is stronger than the previous comparative analysis (i) because it states that God knows everything that any being could possibly know. The problem with the previous analysis of omniscience is that it leaves open the possibility that there is a possible being whose knowledge could exceed God’s knowledge. But at least since the time of Anselm, God is thought of not only as the greatest actual being, but the greatest possible being. As such it should be the case that God has knowledge which no one could possibly surpass.
Note that both (i) and (ii) state that no one can know as much as God but they allow for the possibility that there can be more than one omniscient being. But most theists are uncomfortable with this possibility and (iii) rules this out. In support of (iii) a theist could appeal to the doctrine of divine simplicity, the doctrine that God is perfectly simple (as mentioned above).
Since the Medieval era, a number of theologians have proposed that God is absolutely simple and that in reality, (on a very popular interpretation) all of God’s attributes are really identical with each other and God. This is a difficult doctrine to understand for it forces one to say that God’s omniscience is really identical to God’s omnipotence, God’s omnipotence is identical to God’s justice, and so forth. But if the doctrine is embraced, it seems to be incompatible with analyses (i) and (ii). For if God is the greatest possible being, and God is the greatest in virtue of having the great-making attributes of omniscience, omnibenevolence, and so forth, (which turn out to all be identical with each other and with God), then it is impossible that any other being have omniscience, for to be omniscient is to be identical with God. [For more arguments for a comparative analysis of omniscience see Hoffman and Rosenkrantz (2002)].
The final analysis of God’s omniscience is really a group of three related views which could be parsed in terms of God having the most actual power or possible power. But for brevity sake the three views have been lumped together leaving it to the reader to understand “most actual”, “unsurpassable”, and “unmatchable” along the lines discussed in the previous three analyses. What separates this kind of analysis from the former ones is that the idea of omniscience is understood strictly as a function of God’s omnipotence and not in terms of the scope or content of God’s knowledge. The concept of omniscience, it is thought, is only a concept about what God is able to do and not about what he knows. So this view is neutral on the scope of God’s actual knowledge—there may be some things that God does not or cannot know.
One virtue of this view for Christian theists is that it may provide resources for making sense of how Jesus was God even though he seemed to grow in knowledge and wisdom during his life on earth. If to be omniscient, it is sufficient to have a superior kind of cognitive power without thereby exercising that power, Jesus could be said to be divine even though he did not fully exercise his power to know many things. In becoming a man, Jesus relinquished the full exercise of his omnipotence and with it his vast knowledge, nevertheless retaining his power. This position of course leaves one with the curiosity that one can be a human and be omniscient, but perhaps this can be defended. Furthermore, there is a question about whether omniscience is an attribute of only God considered as a complete substance or an attribute of each person. [For more on this understanding of the scope of omniscience see Kvanvig (1986), (1989), and Taliafferro (1993)].
Quite possibly the most contested area of God’s knowledge has been his knowledge of the future. On the one hand there is the problem of how God’s foreknowledge is possible without canceling the possibility of his creatures’ ability to act freely. If God knows that some event E will happen in the future, there is a sense in which E must happen. But if God knows the future exhaustively, then it seems as if the entire future is fixed and humans are not genuinely free (See Foreknowledge and Freewill). On the other hand, if creatures are free and act indeterminately then it may be that God cannot know what exactly his creatures will do and this lack of knowledge may limit his providential care for them. The theist is thus forced to try to retain a strong sense of (a) God’s knowledge of the future and (b) God’s providence, while at the same time not excluding the possibility of (c) free creaturely action.
There have been many ways of trying to hold on to all three and sometimes the attempts end up diminishing the extent of one at the expense of another. Some begin with a strong sense of God’s sovereignty and then try to explain God’s foreknowledge and creaturely freedom in ways which may end up limiting one or the other. Others begin with a strong sense of creaturely freedom and then explain God’s sovereignty or foreknowledge.
In order to sort out the different views, it will be helpful to offer an argument against the compatibility of God’s foreknowledge and human freedom. The argument will serve as a heuristic device for showing how competing views of God’s foreknowledge have developed at least in part as a way of solving this dilemma. After the argument is presented, four types of foreknowledge which are modeled after human cognitive faculties will be explained as responses to the argument. [For a good introduction to different views about God’s foreknowledge see Beilby and Eddy (2001)].
The following argument is about a fictional person, Ryan, who we are to imagine freely refrains from watching TV on his day off from work. A worry is that if God knows what he will do ahead of time, then Ryan is not really free to refrain from watching TV. Even though this is a fictional account, one can see that if this argument is right it would additionally apply to real people and could be generalized to show that either no one is ever free, or God is not omniscient since he does not have foreknowledge. [For other incompatibility arguments see Fischer (1989)].
- God essentially exists in time and is essentially omniscient.
- Now suppose someone, call him Ryan, gets a call from his boss on Thursday that he should not come to work, and Ryan stays home from work on Friday but freely refrains from watching TV on Friday even though he could have watched TV.
- Principle of Freedom: An act, A, is freely performed by a person S, only if S’s performing the action is not wholly determined by anyone or anything other than S and S could’ve done other than A.
- Suppose also that God knows on Thursday that Ryan does not watch TV on Friday.
- If Ryan were to have freely watched TV on Friday, then God would have had a false belief on Thursday.
- But if God would have had a false belief on Thursday, then God would not have been omniscient on Thursday.
- Thus if Ryan were to watch TV on Friday, then God would not have been omniscient on Thursday; in other words, God wouldn’t have existed, since being omniscient is an essential part of what it is to be God.
- Thus either Ryan is never free to do things like watch TV (or any other free action for that matter) or Ryan could have brought it about that God did not exist.
One way to challenge the conclusion of the IOF argument is to reject the clause in the first premise that God is essentially in time. A number of philosophers have postulated that God is not in time but “sees” all of time from his eternal perspective. Boethius is a good representative of this contingent of philosophers and is one of the earliest philosophers to devote much thought to the question of how God knows the future. God is able to know the future because of the way that God exists, eternally. Boethius describes God’s eternal existence as follows:
“Eternity is a possession of life, a possession simultaneously entire and perfect, which has no end. . . That which grasps and possesses the entire fullness of a life that has no end at one and the same time (nothing that is to come being absent to it, nothing of what has passed having flowed away from it) is rightly held to be eternal.” (Consolation CV 6.4, 144).
God is not like humans who exist wholly at each finite moment in time and endure through time. A human possesses her life only in a small finite window which we call “now”—the past life is no longer possessed but gone, the future is not yet realized. Since our human life is lived in a finite “now”, it is never full and complete but is fragmented. God, however, is perfect and God’s life is not fragmented like the life of a temporally enduring human. He lives in the eternal “now.” His “now” stretches over our past, present, and future. Our finite present is representative of God’s eternal present, but our finite present is only a faint and imperfect model.
Thus by being eternal, the future is not off in the distance for God but is subsumed under his eternal presence. Since God wholly exists at all times in his eternal “now” he can know what happens at every time. Boethius says that God’s foreknowledge “looks at such things as are present to it just as they will eventually come to pass in time as future things.” (Consolation CV 6.21, 147). Boethius’ explanation for how God knows the future is a kind of perceptual model. Foreknowledge is a simple awareness of the future, not involving any complex deductive or inductive reasoning. If having knowledge of something before it happens is like looking far off in the distance, having knowledge in the “eternal now” is like perceiving something immediately before one’s eyes. God “sees” with the divine mind all of existence immediately in one eternal moment. [See Marenbon (2003)].
Obviously this perceptual model of God’s foreknowledge represented here by Boethius is not meant to be taken literally in the sense that God has eyes and really has a vision in the same sense that humans do. Still, there are other worries besides how to make sense of the way an immaterial being perceives. For one, there are problems about what kinds of propositions God could be justified in believing from his vantage point. It seems that from the perspective of the eternal “now”, God’s knowledge of temporal statements is limited to tenseless, time-indexed propositions—propositions that specify the time a certain event occurred such as “In 1994 Pink Floyd goes on tour” but do not change their truth value over time such as the proposition “Pink Floyd will tour next year.” This latter proposition is true in 1993, but false in 1995.
But God could not know this latter kind of tensed proposition. This is because these kinds of statements describe events relative to the time they are spoken, written, or in general, expressed by creatures. But for God, all time is “now” and it makes no sense to say that something will happen or did happen in relation to God’s temporal “now,” since his temporal “now” subsumes all times. All tensed propositions will be reduced to tenseless propositions. For example, when Jane thinks “Pink Floyd will go on tour next year” what God knows is that “In 1993, Jane thinks that Pink Floyd will go on tour in 1994” and “In 1994, Pink Floyd goes on tour.”
Defenders of Boethius argue that tense is a creaturely fiction; tensed statements only express psychological attitudes but nothing about time itself. As such, there is nothing that God fails to know since time is not really composed of a real past, present, and future. But this debate is yet to be settled.
There is another related problem having to do with the relationship between God’s eternal “now” and every other “now.” The problem can be seen by considering the transitivity of the relation “happening now.” Here is a definition of a transitive relation: x is a transitive relation, if and only if for any A, B, and C, if A stands in x to B, and B stands in x to C, then A stands in x to C. “Being to the left of” is a good example of a transitive relation. If A is to the left of B, and B is to the left of C, then A is to the left of C.
“Happening now” also seems to be transitive. If I am now typing while my wife is writing, and my wife is writing while my daughters are now playing, then I am now typing while my daughters are now playing. Here is the problem for Boethius’ position. For God, I am now typing while he is now seeing me type, and God is now seeing me type while he is seeing Rome burn. But this means that I am now typing while Rome is burning! This seems absurd. The Boethian defender is thus faced with the difficulty of explaining how God’s eternal “now” does not lead to this absurdity. An adequate explanation will need to provide an account of the kind of “now” which is special for God that both meets at least some of our intuitions of what “now” means while avoiding complications which arise from the transitivity of our “now” with God’s “now.”
Another substantial problem with the perceptual model has to do with making sense of God’s providence. If the perceptual view is right, it would seem that God is taking a very large risk in creating. This is because his creative activity must be in some sense prior to his knowledge of his creation—for he cannot be said to know the happenings in the world if it does not exist! In other words, God creates the whole world all at once—past, present, and future—then sees the world from his atemporal vantage point. But if God’s creative activity is logically prior to God’s knowledge of the world, it would seem that God’s creative activity is done in the blind. Thus God runs a risk of creating a world in which tremendous evil occurs.
In response to this objection, an argument might be developed against the notion of “risk” utilized in the objection. If it can be shown that risks imply temporal priority and not just logical priority in actions, then the Boethian understanding of God’s knowledge of the future can be preserved because, since God is outside of time, his creative activity is not temporally prior to his foreknowledge. If this cannot be shown, then the theists who want to maintain God’s future knowledge and God’s providence might move to either of the next two models which have a more straightforward way of preserving God’s providence.
A final problem for this view is with reconciling Boethius’ understanding of foreknowledge with the divine attribute of immutability—God’s changelessness. If God creates the world logically prior to his knowing about the world, then it appears that God learns about what he creates. But to learn of what he creates is for God to change. Hence if Boethius is right, it either means that God is not immutable or that Boethius’ view is internally incoherent.
At least two things could be said in response to this charge. First, typically since at least the time of Aristotle, a change has been thought of as the acquisition or loss of a property from one time to another. If I gain the property of “being 5 feet 11 inches tall” then I have lost some other property, say, “being 5 feet 10 inches tall” and thus have changed. But since God is atemporal, there is no time in which he gains or loses a property. His creation is logically prior to his knowledge, but not temporally prior. Of course, this response hinges crucially on the notion of logical priority—if some sense can be made of it and it can be separated from temporal priority then this objection seems to have been met. A second response is to concede that God has changed, but retort that this kind of change does not affect the doctrine of divine immutability. God does not change with regard to his moral character, but can change in other ways. This response would weaken the doctrine of immutability as it has traditionally been held. [For further objections see Marenbon (2003) and Hoffman and Rosenkrantz 2002].
The DK model for the most part embraces the reasoning of the IOF argument but rejects the Principle of Freedom. Being free is compatible with being determined. Some DK advocates also reject the idea that God is temporal. Both the temporal and atemporal versions are discussed below.
The DK view has been attributed to a number of philosophers and theologians, most notably to the Christian Father, Saint Augustine, and the Protestant Reformer John Calvin. The basic idea is relatively simple. According to DK, God is completely in control of the unfolding of time including everything that happens in the future. This is because he predestines the future. Here, “predestines” means that God determines the outcome of the future. Since the future is determined by God, once God initiates his plan for the future, necessarily, his plan unfolds and there is no possibility of any divergence from the plan. Thus, once God knows his plan and initiates it, God can deduce any event which follows from it because he knows either self-evidently or a priori, (1) the plan prior to its unfolding, (2) that he wants it to unfold, and knows (3) that God gets exactly what he wants.
The DK view is consistent with both an atemporal understanding of God as well as a temporal one. On the atemporal view, God is outside of time and determines the world via one eternal act. Since God is outside of time there is no prior time when God formulates and initiates a plan. Nevertheless it is still right to say that there is a causal or logical priority in this instance and that God’s initiating a plan for the world is logically and causally prior to the unfolding of that plan. So God deduces, logically prior to his one eternal act, everything that will occur given his plan and his intent to create the future.
The temporal view is basically the same. God knows his plan, that he wants it, and that he will get it if he wants it. The only difference is that God has always known this in his infinite temporal existence. God is everlasting and his knowledge of the future is not only logically prior to the future but is temporally prior to the future as well. God deduces what will happen both logically and temporally prior to the future occurrences. For present purposes, the only significant difference between the temporal and atemporal DK model is that the atemporal position can, with the perceptual model, reject the first premise of the IOF argument about God’s essential relationship to time. [For Augustine’s view see Augustine (1979) and Wetzel (2001); for a defense of the DK model see Paul Helm’s chapter in Beilby and Eddy (2001)].
The DK model has a clear way of preserving God’s providence. Since God causes the future by bringing about his perfect plan, there are no surprises like there seem to be if God knows the future via perception. The model also has a clear way of explaining how God knows, namely by deduction—an infallible guide to a conclusion. So the most substantive objections to this model of knowledge are not epistemological, rather they are metaphysical. One fairly obvious worry is that this view relies on a very tenuous view of freedom, namely that freedom is compatible with determinism. But for many this sounds crazy. What could be any less free than being wholly determined?
Another problem is that it seems that God is the author of not only the good and redemptive acts in the world, but also pain, suffering, and in general, all the evil. Since God’s plan includes evil, human actions as a component, and God’s will is sufficient for bringing about his plan, it would seem that God is the ultimate cause of evil. Although this problem of evil is something that all theists must deal with, it is particularly difficult for the determinist. A defender of DK will either want to argue that this is the best world God could create, or that even if we cannot show that it is, there may be reasons of which we are unaware for why God permits so much evil. [For further objections see remarks against Paul Helm’s view in Beilby and Eddy (2001) and also see Craig (1999)].
Middle knowledge or as it is often called, Molinism, after the 16th century Jesuit theologian Luis de Molina, is also a deductive model (See Middle Knowledge). Like the previous two models, Molinism is not committed to the idea that God is essentially in time. However, Molinists want to maintain a strong view of human freedom and reject the idea that human freedom is compatible with determinism. Their response to the IOF argument is to show that it is invalid because God can know the future, whether in time or not, and humans can still be significantly free. (More will be said below to flesh out precisely how they would respond.)
Like most theories of God’s omniscience, Molinism says that God knows a number of things a priori or self-evidently, for example, necessary mathematical and logical truths, as well as truths about God’s nature, the nature of uncreated creatures, and so on. This is God’s natural knowledge. God also has free knowledge. This is knowledge of contingent truths, such as the truth that “God creates this world,” that “Adam eats the fruit,” and that “the Steelers win the Super Bowl in 2006.” God’s free knowledge is known by God subsequent to acts of God’s free will.
But the Molinist account of how some of this free knowledge is arrived at is different than the account given by some DK advocates who allow that the future is contingent. On the (non-fatalistic) DK model, all of God’s free knowledge of contingent truths is arrived at because of the contingency of God’s causal activity. It is contingently true (and not necessarily true) that Adam eats the fruit only because it is possible that God determine Adam not to eat the fruit. The Molinist rejects this deterministic way of thinking about God’s knowledge and instead posits that God arrives at free knowledge of creaturely actions by deducing it from (a) God’s free knowledge of his own actions and from (b) his middle knowledge of what creatures would do in certain situations that God could place them in. Thus a proper description of God’s knowledge of the future crucially hinges on an account of God’s middle knowledge.
Like natural knowledge, God’s middle knowledge is known prior to God’s free knowledge. But middle knowledge is like free knowledge in that the truths of middle knowledge are contingent and not necessary. Here is an example: “If Eve were in the garden in the circumstances in which a serpent tempts her to eat fruit, then Eve would freely choose to eat the fruit after being placed in these circumstances.” (More generally, items of middle knowledge are subjunctive conditionals of the form “if x were in circumstance C, x would do A.”)
Using this example we can see how God uses it in order to deduce knowledge of the future:
1. Natural Knowledge: It is possible that Eve and a snake are created in a garden and possible that Eve will freely choose to eat the fruit.
2. Middle knowledge: If Eve were in the garden in the circumstances in which a serpent tempts her to eat fruit, then Eve would freely choose to eat the fruit after being placed in these circumstances.
3. Free knowledge: God creates Eve in the garden in the circumstances in which a serpent tempts her to eat the fruit.
4. Free knowledge (of the future): Thus Eve will freely choose to eat the fruit.
The argument is stated in the logical order of God’s knowledge. First, God surveys all the necessary truths which reveals all the possible circumstances that he can create, in this case that it is possible that God create the garden with Eve and the snake in it. God then surveys his middle knowledge to see what Eve would freely do if placed in these circumstances. He then elicits an act of will to create this world or some set of circumstances in the world and thus knows the actual circumstances of the world. Since he knows the circumstances of the actual world and what will happen given those circumstances, he is able to deduce the future.
Middle knowledge (allegedly) gives God perfect providential control of the future. To see how, we must make a distinction between different kinds of conditional statements known by Middle Knowledge. All conditionals about what creatures would freely do are subjunctive conditionals and can be called “subjunctives of freedom.” Within subjunctives of freedom it is worth distinguishing between what might be called factuals and counterfactuals of freedom. A factual of freedom is a true conditional statement about a creature in which the antecedent (the first half of the conditional) and the consequent (the second half of the conditional) are both true. Factuals of freedom are what God uses to deduce knowledge of the future. A counterfactual of freedom is a conditional statement in which the antecedent is (contingently) false and describes a set of circumstances that is contrary to fact, for example, “If Eve were alive today, she would be the First Lady.” According to Molinism, God knows both factuals and counterfactuals of freedom. His knowledge is comprehensive. He knows what people will do when placed in actual circumstances and he knows what they would choose to do if they were placed in other circumstances that God and his creatures never bring about. Knowing both kinds of subjunctives of freedom enables God to see what his creatures would do in any kind of circumstances and allows God to survey all the possible worlds that he might create and choose one that he thinks is good enough to create.
Molinism has a number of attractive features if correct. First, it offers a clear way to describe God’s knowledge of the future as deductive. Second, it retains a robust theory of human freedom. But perhaps just as important, it does not sacrifice God’s providence at the expense of freedom. God is still free to create whatever sorts of worlds he deems feasible by surveying what any particular creature from any species would do if placed in certain situations by God. Thus when God creates, he is not at all surprised by anything about his creation or any actions which his creatures will do because he knows all the circumstances that he will create them in and by his middle knowledge knows exactly what they will do in those circumstances.
To return now to the IOF argument against the compatibility of God’s omniscience with human freedom, we can now give an account of the complex response the Molinist has at his disposal. (For a more in-depth response see Foreknowledge and Freewill).
Although Molinism tends to lend itself to the view that God is atemporal, there is nothing about the position which entails that it must take a position on God’s relationship with time as the perceptual model must. Thus the following response to the IOF argument is presented on behalf of Molinists who believe God is in time (since the atemporal Molinist could simply reject the first premise that God is essentially in time).
The strategy for the temporal-Molinist is to accept the premises of the argument, but object that once the argument is fully understood it will be found to be invalid. There is nothing in the argument that leads to the conclusion that either people are not free or that God cannot have knowledge of free actions. To see how this reply works, it will be useful to first present the problem from a DK model perspective only now cast in Molinist terms. According to the DK advocate, God knows the future exclusively just by knowing his free knowledge of God’s decision to determine the kind of world he wants. His knowledge of what he will do is logically prior to his creating and his knowledge entails what will unfold in the world. So God’s free knowledge does in some sense determine everything and limits human freedom.
But for the Molinist, God knows prior to any decision to create what his creatures would freely do in all circumstances by way of Middle Knowledge. His free knowledge of the future is posterior to his knowledge of what creatures would freely do. So God’s Middle Knowledge, which is only of what creatures would freely do, does not determine what they in fact do. Nor does God’s free knowledge determine what they would freely do since his free knowledge is posterior to God’s Middle Knowledge.
Returning now the IOF argument, prior to Ryan’s actions, God knows what Ryan would freely do if Ryan were placed in certain circumstances. But this knowledge in no way causes Ryan to do what he does, for it just says what Ryan would freely do, not what he must do. Ryan is the cause of his actions, and it is the fact that he does freely choose to refrain from watching TV that makes God’s belief true from all eternity that Ryan would freely refrain from watching TV if given the day off from work. [For a defense of Molinism see Craig (1999) and Flint (1989)].
There are two problematic questions for Middle Knowledge. One is, on what basis are these conditionals of freedom known? This is an epistemic question about how God is justified in his knowledge of subjunctives of freedom. Second, what are the truth-makers of these conditionals? This is a metaphysical question about the explanation for what makes these conditionals true.
Consider first the epistemic problems having to do with God’s evidence for knowing the future. According to Molinism God knows the future by deducing it in part from factuals of freedom which are contingently true. But factuals of freedom are not themselves deduced from anything, they are known directly by one of God’s Non-inferential Faculties. But by which one? As contingent truths they cannot be known a priori, since a priori knowledge is only of necessary truths. Moreover they are obviously not known by perception, memory, kinesthetic awareness, or testimony. This leaves introspection as the last option. Yet it is a complete mystery what God could know about himself that would yield evidence of what his creatures would freely do if placed in certain circumstances. So it looks as if the Molinist must posit some unknown faculty by which God knows factuals of freedom (as wells as counterfactuals of freedom). But then this account of God’s foreknowledge which started out as a deductive model—modeled after human knowledge—is at bottom wholly inscrutable. Why not, then, just say that God somehow knows the future instead of complicating things with a deductive account?
This kind of objection can be put in a slightly different way. How is it that God knows which of the true subjunctives of freedom are factuals rather than counterfactuals of freedom? Recall that a factual of freedom has a true antecedent and a counterfactual of freedom a false antecedent. But the truth or falsity of the antecedent cannot be known prior to God’s creative activity. For instance, God only knows that it is true that “Eve is in the garden in the circumstances in which a serpent tempts her to eat fruit” after he creates her in these circumstances and knows that it is false that “A Martian is in the garden in the circumstances in which a serpent tempts her to eat fruit” after he decides not to create Martians. But then God cannot know which subjunctive of freedom (that has either the information about Eve or the Martian in the antecedent) should be used in an argument to deduce what will happen in the future prior to his creating.
It might be tempting for the temporal-Molinist to think that someone’s past actions or present character will provide sufficient evidence. But again, this will not help God prior to his decision to create his creatures. His creative act must first be known in order to know what kinds of characters his creatures end up having.
Turning now to the metaphysical side of the problem, there is the difficulty of explaining what it is that makes subjunctives of freedom true. It cannot be a fact about the creatures themselves, for God is supposed to have Middle Knowledge before there are any creatures. Perhaps, then, it is a fact about uninstantiated creaturely essences. God might know a lot about Eve and Martians even before he creates them because he knows the essence of these creatures just like he would know the essence of plants and other kinds of animals before he creates them. But it is strange to think that Eve’s essence could provide knowledge of what she will freely do in certain circumstances. If she is free and not determined to act by the circumstances in which she is created, there is some possible world in which she is placed in the same set of circumstances and freely does not eat the apple. But then there is nothing about her essence which necessitates what she will in fact do when placed in those circumstances—for Eve is essentially Eve in the circumstances in which she freely eats of the fruit and freely refrains from eating. But if not creaturely essences as the ground of the truth of subjunctives of freedom, what then?
It needs to be pointed out that none of the objections to middle knowledge show that God could not have deductive knowledge of the future. At best what the objections show is that Middle Knowledge bottoms out in a mystery. In order to offer a satisfying explanation of how God knows the future, a Molinist must provide an answer to these questions. [For objections to Molinism see Hasker (1989), (2000), and Beilby and Eddy (2001).]
Of the three theories presented so far, the only one which has been a model of direct knowledge of the future has been the Boethian perceptual theory. The other two models describe God as having indirect knowledge of the future via deduction. The intuitive model is another account of how God might have knowledge of the future directly. But instead of God having this knowledge via perception God has the knowledge either innately or as a kind of immediate a priori grasp of the truth about the future.
The intuitive model is compatible with God being temporal or atemporal. If the atemporal model is preferred, the intuitionist can respond to the IOF argument in the same way that Boethius does by rejecting the first premise of the argument which says that God is in time. If the temporal model is preferred, the intuitionist can argue like the Molinist that the argument is invalid. The intuitive model of God’s foreknowledge offers no unique objection to the IOF argument.
Here is an account of God’s intuitive knowledge. Intuitive knowledge is knowledge which is in some sense internal to the knower. One can have intuitive knowledge of something without external evidence to justify it. Many have thought that mathematical knowledge is like this. Yes, a human might need external objects to become aware of certain propositions, but they do not need external evidence to be justified in believing the propositions. For instance, it may be true that children need to have symbols of numbers written on a chalk board, or have two blocks presented to them with two other blocks presented to them in order to at first become aware that 2+2 really does equal 4. But the chalk and the blocks are not evidence that 2+2=4; they are more like physical tools (like their own brain) that gets their mind to be aware of the proposition 2+2=4. But once they become aware of the proposition, they just see that it is true. They may even think, “Of course, I’ve always known that!” Some truths we just seem to know in this intuitive way.
If it is true that humans know some things intuitively, it would seem that God does too. Moreover it would seem that unlike humans, God would not even need physical objects like chalk and toy blocks to become aware that 2+2=4. God, it is assumed, could have innate knowledge of mathematical and logical truths without physical objects either helping him to become aware of propositions, making the propositions true, or justifying God’s belief in the propositions. But, the intuitionist argues, if God can know a number of propositions intuitively, why not think that God knows the future intuitively too?
One advantage of the intuitionist position is its flexibility. For instance, since the intuitionist position is silent with regard to God’s relationship to time the intuitionist is able to adopt whatever theory seems best on its own merits and can respond to IOF type arguments with many of the previously mentioned replies. Similarly, the intuitionist position itself makes no claims about the compatibility of God’s actions with human freedom leaving the intuitionist unconstrained in adopting a libertarian or compatibilist view of freedom. Finally, if the future is known exhaustively by intuition, then it would seem that God’s providential control would not be restricted. [For a brief defense of intuitive knowledge of the future see Craig (1999)].
As just mentioned, the advantage of the intuitionist position is its ability to be flexible and meet a wide range of objections. But this is taken by some as insight into its weakness. The reason why the intuitive account might seem invulnerable to objection is because it can hardly be considered a theory about how God knows at all. The perceptual view and the deductive models at least offer a model of understanding with which we are all quite familiar. This is why it seems that most defenders of God’s knowledge of the future begin with the previously mentioned models and only give them up after much resistance. The intuitionist model seems like a last ditch effort to retain an explanation of God’s foreknowledge if the other models fail. How does God know the future, if the other models fail? He just does, the intuitionist answers, in the same way that we know 2+2=4. But without anything further to add, it can hardly be thought to be an explanation for how God knows the future.
Another reason to think that the intuitionist model is an ad hoc explanation is because most of our intuitions which we count as knowledge are necessary truths, like 2+2=4. Thus intuitive knowledge is often characterized as a priori knowledge (See A priori intuition above). Often it is argued that such truths are either known by knowing the meaning of the terms or are known by grasping the abstract objects involved (in the example, numbers and their relations). But, unless one adopts a fatalist version of the DK model, truths about the future are thought to be wholly contingent. But a priori knowledge is not of contingent truths and thus cannot be how God directly intuits the future.
A second way of characterizing intuitive knowledge is as a kind of introspection. As was discussed above, William Alston recently has appealed to Aquinas’ view, which says that that God knows the future by knowing creaturely essences which are ultimately contained in God’s essence (See Does God have Beliefs? above). This is a very mysterious doctrine (For further elaboration of Aquinas’ view, see Stump).
A final reply is to treat God’s intuitions like intuitions of people who are clairvoyant or psychic. A few studies suggest that some humans have abilities to know extraordinary things by being presented with images of the future or some event taking place well beyond their vision. Such knowledge is of contingent truths. Still, the skeptic may balk at using such questionable instances of knowledge as an illustration analogous to God’s infallible grasp of the future.
Like Molinists, Open Theists are strongly committed to the idea that humans have libertarian freedom. However Open Theists are skeptical that God has the kind of comprehensive knowledge that all of the previous views claim. If faced with the IOF argument given above, the Open Theist will give up the idea that God exhaustively knows the future or will argue that even if God knows the future, his certainty of the future is not strong enough to cause problems for human freedom. Open Theists think that God is in time and that there are at least some tensed and non-tensed statements that God does not know with absolute certainty.
At a minimum, Open Theism is the doctrine that the future has not yet been fully decided, it is “open” to what is not yet completely known by God or anyone else. There are a number of different ways that this “openness” can be explained and defended, some more radical than others. We will first turn to the more radical position and then the more moderate.
An Open Theist could think that God has no knowledge at all of the future for several reasons. One is because there is no future to know anything about. On either a Presentist view of time (only the present exists) or an Expanding Universe view of time (the growing past is real as well as the present), the future is denied existence. Only what is present exists, or perhaps the past along with the present. But if the future does not exist, then there is nothing to make the following sorts of propositions true “In 2021, a Republican is President;” or “A Republican will be President in 2021.” There is no future to ground the truth of the propositions, so the propositions lack a truth-value.
In response it is fair to note that this position is somewhat radical because it forces one to deny a widely held principle called The Principle of Bivalence: For any proposition, it must be either true or false. The Open Theist of the sort being described can accept that there are propositions about the future but must deny that any are true because there is nothing to make them true. But this does not mean they are false either since there is no contradictory future state of affairs to render the propositions false. The propositions’ truth-values have yet to be decided, but in the present, they lack a truth-value. To fully meet this argument from the Open Theist, one must either defend the view that the future does exist in some sense or that there can be abstract future facts which make propositions about the future true, even if the future does not exist.
A second way to argue that God cannot know the future is to deny that there really are propositions or beliefs about the future. If there were no propositions/beliefs about the future then there could not be knowledge of the future. In order to make sense of what seem like perfectly good claims about the future that we ordinarily make, it can be argued that claims seemingly about the future are really only about the past or present. For example, a statement such as “Amy will go to the store this Tuesday” really just expresses the proposition “Right now, Amy’s dispositions are such that, if it were Tuesday, it would be likely that Amy would go to the store.” So on this view, all statements about God’s purported future knowledge are really just statements which express propositions about the present or the past.
This position is fairly radical and has a limited number of proponents (See Fischer, 23-24). The basic reason against it is that most think that they really are saying something about the future and not just the present. It is very hard to believe that most humans are this confused about what they are saying. Surely even if they are wrong that what they are expressing is true, they are saying something about what will happen and not just about they way things currently are.
Finally, a third line of argument that God cannot know the future at all accepts that there are true propositions about the future but denies that God is or could be justified in believing these propositions to the extent that this justification yields knowledge. For instance, a person could have a true belief that it will rain tomorrow but not know this because the inductive evidence for this belief is just too unreliable. Accordingly, there may not be enough current evidence for God to know with certainty what the future holds.
The trouble with this position is that it seems unlikely that God could not know at least some propositions about the future. It is likely that God could know with certainty some propositions about what he will do, for instance that “God will create plants on the third day,” and also some propositions which are entailed by the present state of affairs taken together with the laws of nature. If God knew all the laws of nature that he established involving gravity and saw at time t1 that a rock is falling, that the wind is blowing at such and such a speed, and so forth, God could know with certainty where the rock will be at some subsequent time t2.
Some Open Theists think that God has some knowledge of the future but not exhaustive knowledge. God knows with absolute certainty some things that he will do—such as judge the righteous and the wicked—even if he may not know exactly who all those righteous and wicked people will turn out to be. God also knows some future events that are determined by past events taken together with binding laws of nature. He knows exactly where the sun will be in 2025 because he knows where the sun is in 2020 and knows what the laws of nature will determine the sun and every other planetary object to do. In general, God can know everything about the future which can be validly deduced from the present or past.
But as has been noted previously, there is a class of propositions which God cannot know with absolute certainty, perhaps some indeterminate events which take place on the quantum level and future free actions by God’s creatures. Those that think that God cannot know these future events at all, appeal to arguments raised above by the more radical Open Theists—only applying the arguments just to this class of propositions.
An even less radical kind of Open Theist will grant God exhaustive knowledge of the future—or something close to it—but will insist that God’s knowledge of free creaturely actions is never infallible. How then does God know what creatures will do in the future? He knows by induction rather than deduction (See Inferential Faculties above). God can know the characters of people by perceiving the way they are presently disposed to act. He also has memories of what particular creatures have done in past situations. Given all this knowledge, God can know with a high degree of epistemic probability what will happen in the future.
But God may end up having some false beliefs. Someone’s past actions and present character are good indicators of what creatures will do, but if they are genuinely free they could always act differently or do something uncharacteristic. Thus, if God reasons inductively, it is quite probable that he gets some things wrong. But even if he does not, his knowledge is still fallible because his evidence never guarantees its conclusion.
Above it was mentioned that this view “will grant God exhaustive knowledge of the future—or something close to it.” But it is highly probable that God could not have exhaustive inductive knowledge of the future because of the problem of dwindling probabilities. To see the problem, consider God’s knowledge that the Eiffel tower will be built. It is hard to see how God could have inductive knowledge of the Eiffel tower two hundred years prior to its being built. For instance, God would need to know which couples would be married in the future and which will have grandchildren that will be engineers, how Paris’s economy will shape up, whether Paris will be bombed to smithereens in two hundred years and so forth.
Each item in the previous list will need to be assigned some epistemic probability reflecting the likelihood of its truth. Suppose God sees that it is highly probable that Paris’ economy will have sufficient resources for the Eiffel tower, say, he is 90% sure of this. Allow also that God thinks it is highly probable that there will in fact be a good number of engineers in France in two hundred years; again, he is 90% sure. But notice that God will be less sure that both of these things take place. The probability that both will take place can be figured by multiplying the percentages of each which yields an 81% probability. But there are hundreds, perhaps thousands, of factors which need to be considered to determine if the Eiffel Tower will be built. And there are millions of free decisions which will be made. Once all of these probabilities are taken into consideration, the probability that the Eiffel Tower will be built must be extremely small. What this example shows is that if God does have inductive knowledge, it is probably only of a very limited number of things which are not very far into the future. [For a more extended defense of Open Theism see Hasker (2002), (2000), (1989), Hasker et al. (1994), and Hoffman and Rosenkrantz (2002)].
Some objections have already been mentioned against the arguments that God has no knowledge of the future. The objections to the more limited view will also be objections against the more radical position. Here, then, are a few more problems leveled against Open Theism as a whole.
First is the basic complaint that Open Theism has a new and unorthodox view of God’s knowledge. Of all the views presented, it is the one which thinks of God’s knowledge as most limited. This not only puts constraints on the scope of God’s foreknowledge but this will normally entail a revision of the traditional conception of omniscience as Having knowledge of all true propositions. (Thus Open Theists find Comparative Analyses of God’s Omniscience more conducive to their position).
Open Theists will argue that there are numerous scriptures which support their view—passages which suggest that God regrets creating people, that he changes his mind if people will repent, and that God interacts with his people, responding to them as he learns what they will do. Opponents protest that these readings are anthropomorphic. But the ambiguity of the passages suggests that the disagreement can only be settled by philosophical considerations.
Another problem is that since God learns, God changes. As was already mentioned above this entails that Open Theists must deny God’s immutability. Again, the Open Theist may reply that God’s immutability allows for some changes in God, just not changes involving his impeccable character and love for his creatures.
A third objection is that Open Theism diminishes God’s sovereignty and providence. The Open Theist thinks that it is an advantage of his view that God can relate to and respond to creatures. But the problem with this is if God does not know the future exhaustively, he cannot be of as much help to his creatures since he will be surprised about some things that happen. He can only react to terrible circumstances, but cannot prevent all of them.
Finally, a reoccurring objection is that, if anything, arguments presented by Open Theists just show that competing views have problems and that there is no fully satisfying way of explaining in human terms how God can know the future. But this does not show that God does not know the future. The Open Theist is thus mistaken in concluding that God does not know the future from her failure to understand how it can be known. [For further objections to Open Theism see Flint (1989) and Beilby and Eddy (2001).]
Last updated: July 7, 2006 | Originally published: July/7/2006
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