Political Philosophy of Alasdair MacIntyre
This article focuses on Alasdair MacIntyre’s contribution to political philosophy since 1981, although MacIntyre has also written influential works on theology, Marxism, rationality, metaphysics, ethics, and the history of philosophy. He has made a personal intellectual journey from Marxism to Catholicism and from Aristotle to Aquinas, and he is now one of the preeminent Thomist political philosophers. The most consistent and most distinctive feature of MacIntyre’s work is his antipathy to the modern liberal capitalist world. He believes that modern philosophy and modern life are characterized by the absence of any coherent moral code, and that the vast majority of individuals living in this world lack a meaningful sense of purpose in their lives and also lack any genuine community. He draws on the ideal of the Greek polis and Aristotle’s philosophy to propose a different way of life in which people work together in genuinely political communities to acquire the virtues and fulfill their innately human purpose. This way of life is to be sustained in small communities which are to resist as best they can the destructive forces of liberal capitalism.
Table of Contents
- Philosophy and Society
- The Current Moral Disorder and Its Consequences
- The Absence of Meaningful Moral Choices
- Emotivism and Manipulative Social Relations
- The Concept of a Practice and the Origin of the Virtues
- Politics in a World without Morality
- The Greek Way of Life
- Heroic Society and Homer
- The Athenian Polis and Aristotle
- Our Human Nature: Dependent Rational Animals and Human Virtues
- A New Politics
- A New Economics
- References and Further Reading
Alasdair MacIntyre was born in 1929, in Glasgow, Scotland. He holds MA degrees from the University of Manchester and University College at Oxford, and taught at several institutions in the United Kingdom before moving to the United States in 1970. He has taught at several institutions in the United States, and he currently holds a position at Notre Dame University.
His first publication, “Analogy in Metaphysics,” appeared in 1950 when he was 21 years old. His first book, Marxism: An Interpretation, followed in 1953. Since then, he has written or edited nearly twenty books and hundreds of articles and book reviews on a wide range of subjects, including theology, Marxism, the nature of rationality, metaphysics, and the history of philosophy and ethics. For references that deal with his contributions to fields other than political philosophy, and for more detailed biographical information, see the References and Further Reading.
This essay concentrates on MacIntyre’s contributions to political philosophy and is primarily concerned with his best known work, After Virtue, which was originally published in 1981. A second edition of After Virtue was published in 1984; it included a postscript in which MacIntyre responded to a number of criticisms of the original edition. It is this second edition that will be cited below. The three main works which followed After Virtue expand on, clarify, or revise the arguments found there. These are Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (1988), Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (1990), and Dependent Rational Animals (1999). The last is of particular importance for understanding the practical consequences of MacIntyre’s political philosophy. It is also likely to be the easiest of the three for the beginning student of MacIntyre’s work to read and understand. A useful source for MacIntyre’s thought is The MacIntyre Reader (1998), edited by Kelvin Knight, which brings together a number of MacIntyre’s shorter works going back to the 1950s, a pair of interviews with MacIntyre, excerpts from After Virtue and Whose Justice? Which Rationality?, and two thoughtful essays by Knight.
In the first of those essays, Knight claims that “MacIntyre’s politics may now, to an extent, be described in terms of resistance” (The MacIntyre Reader 23; see also Breen 2002 and McMylor 1994). Knight is certainly right about this. MacIntyre is trying to resist and transform essentially the entire modern world. His definition of “modern” stretches back roughly 350 years to the Enlightenment, although he considers the Enlightenment to have been a mistake; (After Virtue 118 and Chapters 4-6; see also Whose Justice? Which Rationality? Chapter 1), but in this article the term “modern” will mean the contemporary twentieth and twenty-first century world.
MacIntyre wants to overthrow the liberal capitalist ideology that currently dominates the world both in the realm of ideas and in its manifestations in political and social institutions and actions. He seeks to achieve this not through the use of force but by changing how people think about, understand, and act in the world. To show that the changes he wants are possible and desirable, he returns to an older conception of morality, derived from the teachings of St. Thomas Aquinas and ultimately, through Aquinas, the philosophy of Aristotle and the way of life of the Athenian polis. He portrays this older conception of morality as both superior to and fundamentally hostile to the modern order, and his philosophical arguments are meant to help restore it to the world. On the other hand, he understands that liberal capitalism has tremendous power and appeal both in the world of ideas and in the power it has over people in the social, political, and economic spheres. Ultimately his recommendation is that the particular conditions of the modern world require that those who agree with his arguments should, to the greatest possible degree, withdraw from the world into communities where the old morality can be kept alive until the time is right for it to re-emerge.
This article begins by describing the modern world as MacIntyre sees it, and then moves on to MacIntyre’s depiction of what he believes to be the very different world of the ancient Greeks, and specifically the ancient Athenians. Next, it contrasts the two and shows why MacIntyre believes the ancient world to be superior. The conclusion examines MacIntyre’s suggested alternative to the modern world, which draws on the ancient world without simply proposing a return to it.
It is important to keep in mind that MacIntyre is not suggesting that we should merely tinker around the edges of liberal capitalist society; his goal is to fundamentally transform it. He does not believe that this will happen quickly or easily, and indeed it may not happen at all, but he believes that it will be a disaster for humanity if it does not happen. After Virtue famously closes with a warning about “the new dark ages which are already upon us” (After Virtue 263). It is also important to keep in mind that even if, after careful consideration, you do not agree with MacIntyre’s proposed solution, or you do not believe that it has any chance of actually coming about, it may still be that MacIntyre’s critique of the modern world is at least partially correct. MacIntyre is well aware that most of us who have been brought up in the liberal capitalist world see our world’s ideas and institutions as natural and desirable – not perfect, but fundamentally sound – and so we will not easily be persuaded that it is in fact inherently deeply flawed and profoundly unhealthy. But an openness to that possibility is essential to understanding MacIntyre.
As we work through MacIntyre’s argument, we will be talking about both the world of ideas – that is, philosophy – and the world of institutions and actions – that is, politics and society. Although at times we will consider these two worlds separately, one of MacIntyre’s most strongly held convictions is that they are closely connected. MacIntyre has not always been clear or consistent about the strength or direction of that connection, but the importance of the connection for MacIntyre’s argument has been consistent ever since After Virtue. Contemporary philosophers, he says, tend to interpret and argue about the works of past philosophers without paying attention to the intellectual and especially the social context in which those works were created. They act as though all past philosophers are contributing to the same argument, seeking timeless and eternal moral truths. But this is wrong, because philosophies are in large part derived from sociologies and are specific to particular societies: “Morality which is no particular society’s morality is to be found nowhere” (After Virtue 265-266; see also The MacIntyre Reader 258). Although philosophers can and should learn from the work of earlier philosophers, this is not their main source of ideas when they are doing their job properly. What philosophers primarily do is study the actual world in which they live – its politics, traditions, social organization, families and so on – and try to find the ideas and values that must underlie those institutions and practices, even if the members of the society cannot articulate them, or cannot articulate them fully. When the philosophers have done their work correctly, the philosophy they articulate will reflect their society; and because philosophers are uniquely suited to see the society as a whole they will be in a unique position to point out inconsistencies, propose new ideas consistent with the old ones that are nevertheless improvements on those ideas, and show why things that seem trivial are actually crucial to the society, and vice versa. They are also in a position to examine not only what it is that the people in their society do but why they do it, even when those people cannot explain it for themselves. These are the things that MacIntyre himself wants to do: show the inconsistencies and incoherencies at the center of modern conceptions of morality and society and transform them so that the modern expression of morality, structure of society, and practices of politics can be transformed as well. But philosophers do not and cannot stand outside of all societies to offer objective truths or objective moralities, since these must always be connected to particular societies.
So, the political, social, and economic life of a society constrains the kinds of ideas and morality it can have (at times MacIntyre seems to agree with Marx that these things do not merely constrain ideas and morals but actually determine them), and those ideas and that morality, especially as articulated by philosophers, in turn influence economics and politics (again, in different writings MacIntyre seems to have different views about how much influence they have). Let us see what MacIntyre has to say about modern ideas and institutions in After Virtue.
MacIntyre begins After Virtue by asking the reader to engage in a thought experiment: “Imagine that the natural sciences were to suffer the effects of a catastrophe…. A series of environmental disasters [which] are blamed by the general public on the scientists” leads to rioting, scientists being lynched by angry mobs, the destruction of laboratories and equipment, the burning of books, and ultimately the decision by the government to end science instruction in schools and universities and to imprison and execute the remaining scientists. Eventually, enlightened people decide to restore science, but what do they have to work with? Only fragments: bits and pieces of theories, chapters of books, torn and charred pages of articles, hazy memories and damaged equipment with functions that are unclear, if not entirely forgotten. These people, he argues, would combine these fragments as best they could, inventing theories to connect them as necessary. People would talk and act as though they were doing “science,” but they would actually be doing something very different from what we currently call science. From our point of view, in a world where the sciences are intact, their “science” would be full of errors and inconsistencies, “truths” which no one could actually prove, and competing theories which were incompatible with one another. Further, the supporters of these theories would be unable to agree on any way to resolve their differences.
Why does MacIntyre ask us to imagine such a world? “The hypothesis I wish to advance is that in the actual world which we inhabit the language of morality is in the same state of grave disorder as the language of natural science in the imaginary world which I described” (After Virtue 2, After Virtue 256). People in the modern liberal capitalist world talk as though we are engaged in moral reasoning, and act as though our actions are chosen as the result of such reasoning, but in fact neither of these things is true. Just as with the people working with “science” in the imaginary world that MacIntyre describes, philosophers and ordinary people are working today with bits and pieces of philosophies which are detached from their original pre-Enlightenment settings in which they were comprehensible and useful. Current moral and political philosophies are fragmented, incoherent, and conflicting, with no standards that can be appealed to in order to evaluate their truth or adjudicate the conflicts between them – or at least no standards that all those involved in the disputes will be willing to accept, since any standard will presuppose the truth of one of the contending positions. To use an analogy that MacIntyre does not use, one might say that it is as if we tore handfuls of pages from books by Jane Austen, Shakespeare, Danielle Steele, Mark Twain, and J.K. Rowling, threw half of them away, shuffled the rest, stapled them together, and then tried to read the “story” that resulted. It would be incoherent, and any attempt to describe the characters, plot, or meaning would be doomed to failure. On the other hand, because certain characters, settings, and bits of narrative would reappear throughout, it would seem as though the story could cohere, and much effort – ultimately futile – might be expended in trying to make it do so. This, according to MacIntyre, is the moral world in which we currently live.
One consequence of this situation is that we have endless and interminable debates within philosophy and, where philosophy influences politics, within politics as well (After Virtue 6-8, Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry 7 and Chapter 1). MacIntyre demonstrates this with regard to philosophers by a comparison of the positions of John Rawls and Robert Nozick on what justice is, positions which are mutually exclusive, but internally coherent. Each conclusion follows reasonably from its premises (After Virtue Chapter 17). Each position has many adherents who can point out the flaws in the other but cannot successfully defend their own position against attack. In the political world, one of the examples MacIntyre uses is the abortion issue in the United States. One side of the debate, drawing largely on a particular interpretation of Christian ethics, asserts that abortion is murder and hence is both morally unacceptable and deserving of legal punishment; the other side, usually drawing either on a conception of privacy or of rights or both, asserts that women should have the right to make a private decision about terminating a pregnancy, and therefore abortion, while possibly morally problematic, deserves the protection of the law. In either case, the conclusion follows logically, that is, reasonably, from the premises. But the starting premises are incompatible, and there is no way to gain everyone’s agreement to either set of premises, nor is there even any agreement on what kind of argument might be able to gain a consensus. (And a look at public opinion polls about abortion taken in the United States shows that the percentage of people for or against legal abortion in particular circumstances has basically remained unchanged since Roe v. Wade was decided in 1973).
It is also the case, according to MacIntyre, that those involved in these philosophical and political debates claim to be using premises that are objective, based on reason, and universally applicable. Many of them even believe these claims, misunderstanding the nature of their particular inadequate modern philosophy, just as the people in MacIntyre’s post-disaster world misunderstand what it means to be doing real science. But what they are really doing, whether they recognize it or not, is using the language of morality to try to gain their own preferences. They are not trying to persuade others by reasoned argument, because a reasoned argument about morality would require a shared agreement on the good for human beings in the same way that reasoned arguments in the sciences rely on shared agreement about what counts as a scientific definition and a scientific practice. This agreement about the good for human beings does not exist in the modern world (in fact, the modern world is in many ways defined by its absence) and so any attempt at reasoned argument about morality or moral issues is doomed to fail. Other parties to the argument are fully aware that they are simply trying to gain the outcome they prefer using whatever methods happen to be the most effective. (Below there will be more discussion of these people; they are the ones who tend to be most successful as the modern world measures success.) Because we cannot agree on the premises of morality or what morality should aim at, we cannot agree about what counts as a reasoned argument, and since reasoned argument is impossible, all that remains for any individual is to attempt to manipulate other people’s emotions and attitudes to get them to comply with one’s own wishes.
MacIntyre claims that protest and indignation are hallmarks of public “debate” in the modern world. Since no one can ever win an argument – because there’s no agreement about how someone could “win” – anyone can resort to protesting; since no one can ever lose an argument – how can they, if no one can win? – anyone can become indignant if they don’t get their way. If no one can persuade anyone else to do what they want, then only coercion, whether open or hidden (for example, in the form of deception) remains. This is why, MacIntyre says, political arguments are not just interminable but extremely loud and angry, and why modern politics is simply a form of civil war.
But there is another problem. Just as no one can win an argument with anyone else by persuading them with reasons, no one can win such an argument with himself or herself in trying to determine what their own moral commitments should be. In other words, no one can have real reasons for choosing the moral positions and values that they do, and no one can have any real reasons for choosing any way of life over any other as the best possible life. So any choice about the kind of life one will lead (and of course these choices have to be made, either consciously or unconsciously) must be arbitrary; any individual could always just as easily have chosen some other life which would have a very different set of moral positions and values (After Virtue Chapter 4). And if I can choose to be anything, but have no way of discovering reasons that might persuade me that some choice is the best, then it is impossible for me to make any kind of meaningful commitment to any of my choices, and it will be extremely easy to revise my morals in the name of expediency. The temptation will therefore be strong to choose moral principles on the grounds of effectiveness. I will choose my values at any given time because they happen to be useful as a way of attaining something else I value, rather than rationally choosing the best possible life and then letting that choice of the best life determine what I should value and what I should do. Perhaps I will choose values that enable me to be more popular in my community, or values that are useful for justifying my desire for money, or values that I believe will make me more successful at my job. What most people cannot do and are not even aware that they should do is tie their moral positions to a coherent and defensible version of the good life for human beings. The modern philosophies that have received the most attention and support – theories of utility such as those put forward by Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill, and theories of rights such as those advanced by John Locke and John Rawls – cannot provide such a description of the good life for human beings, and MacIntyre regards them as having failed in their ambitions to do so and therefore to have failed in their project of creating new moral systems even on their own terms (After Virtue Chapter 6).
Many would disagree with MacIntyre at this point. They would say that these moral debates are interminable not because of anything specific to modernity but because by their nature they do not and cannot have any resolution. In their view, the situation MacIntyre has described is not a sign of philosophical or political failure in modern times, it is simply a recognition that there are many diverse definitions of what the best life for human beings is and therefore what is just, or good, or virtuous, and that while many of them are legitimate, none is or can be absolutely true. It follows that each of us is entitled to our own viewpoint on these matters and to choose the version of the best life and the best moral code that we individually prefer, provided of course we do not harm others. In After Virtue, MacIntyre calls this point of view emotivism, “the doctrine that all evaluative judgments and more specifically all moral judgments are nothing but expressions of preference, expressions of attitude or feeling, insofar as they are moral or evaluative in character” (After Virtue 11-12, emphasis in original). In a world where people subscribe to emotivism, moral judgments, since they cannot be used for reasoned persuasion, are used for two reasons: to express our own preferences, and to try to change the emotions and attitudes of those with whom we disagree in order to make them agree with us and share our preferences. MacIntyre believes that emotivism is a false doctrine, because we can in fact rationally determine the best possible life for human beings and therefore can have moral judgments that are more than mere preferences, but it is nevertheless a doctrine that many people today subscribe to, and they act as though it is true. Because so many people act as if it is true, it takes on a degree of power in the world. This is one example of the linkage between how people think and how they live: “A moral philosophy – and emotivism is no exception – characteristically presupposes a sociology” (After Virtue 23; see also Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry 80). Although few people would, if asked, say that they subscribed to the doctrine of emotivism (indeed, few people would even be able to explain what it is), it is only possible to make sense of their actions and lives if we say that they are acting according to emotivist principles – they act as though morality is nothing but an arbitrary choice that is an expression of their will, and so this is the doctrine to which we can say they subscribe.
If we are to fully understand emotivism as a philosophical doctrine, MacIntyre says, we must understand what it would look like if it were socially embodied. That is, if we stipulate that nearly all the people in a given society subscribe to emotivism, what can we expect their society look like? How will they behave? It turns out, MacIntyre says, that such a society would look much like ours, and that (as has been said) we act as though we believe emotivism to be true. MacIntyre says that “the key to the social content of emotivism….is the fact that emotivism entails the obliteration of any genuine distinction between manipulative and non-manipulative social relations” (After Virtue 23). Each of us regards the other members of our society as means to ends of our own. Because I cannot persuade people, and because we cannot have any common good that is not purely temporary and based on our separate individual desires, there is no kind of social relationship left except for each of us trying to use the others to achieve our own selfish goals. Even for someone who did not want to live this way, the fact that others would be trying to gain power over them in order to manipulate them would mean that they would still need to seek as much power as they could simply to avoid being manipulated. It would also mean that each of them would need to manipulate others in ways that would make it more difficult or impossible for them to be manipulated in return. This is similar to the argument that animates a good deal of Hobbes’ Leviathan, where the constant battle for power over one another in a state of nature leads to a life that is solitary, poor, nasty, brutish, and short, and eventually to the recognition of the need for a sovereign with absolute power – although this, of course, is not the solution MacIntyre advocates.
In After Virtue, MacIntyre tries to explain another element of what is missing in modern life through his use of the concept of a practice. He illustrates this with the example of a person wishing to teach a disinterested child how to play chess.
The teaching process may begin with the teacher offering the child candy to play and enough additional candy if the child wins to motivate the child to play. It might be assumed that this is sufficient to motivate the child to learn to play chess well, but as MacIntyre notes, it is sufficient only to motivate the child to learn to win – which may mean cheating if the opportunity arises. However, over time, the child may come to appreciate the unique combination of skills and abilities that chess calls on, and may learn to enjoy exercising and developing those skills and abilities. At this point, the child will be interested in learning to play chess well for its own sake. Cheating to win will, from this point on, be a form of losing, not winning, because the child will be denying themselves the true rewards of chess playing, which are internal to the game. The child will also, it should be noted, enjoy playing chess; there is pleasure associated with developing one’s skills and abilities that cannot come if one cheats in order to win.
MacIntyre concludes that there are two kinds of goods attached to the practice of chess-playing and to practices in general. One kind, external goods, are goods attached to the practice “by the accidents of social circumstance” – in his example, the candy given to the child, but in the real world typically money, power, and fame (After Virtue 188). These can be achieved in any number of ways. Internal goods are the goods that can only be achieved by participating in the practice itself. If you want the benefits to be gained by playing chess, you will have to play chess. And in pursuing them while playing chess, you gain other goods as well – you will get an education in the virtues. The two kinds of goods differ as well in that external goods end up as someone’s property, and the more one person has of any of them the less there is for anyone else (money, power, and fame are often of this nature). Internal goods are competed for as well, “but it is characteristic of them that their achievement is a good for the whole community who participate in the practice” (After Virtue 190-191). A well played chess game benefits both the winner and loser, and the community as a whole can learn from the play of the game and develop their own skills and talents by learning from it.
MacIntyre believes that politics should be a practice with internal goods, but as it is now it only leads to external goods. Some win, others lose; there is no good achieved that is good for the whole community; cheating and exploitation are frequent, and this damages the community as a whole. (MacIntyre has changed his terminology since After Virtue. He now calls internal goods “goods of excellence,” and external goods are now called “goods of effectiveness.” See The MacIntyre Reader 55).
One important way to understand the community surrounding a genuine practice is as a community of teachers and learners, with each individual community member filling each of these roles at different times. “It belongs to the concept of a practice as I have outlined it…that its goods can only be achieved by subordinating ourselves within the practice in our relationship to other practitioners ” (After Virtue 191). Throughout my time as a participant in a practice, but especially at the beginning, I must put myself under the authority of others. To continue MacIntyre’s example of chess playing beyond where he develops it, notice that I, the player, rely on other chess players to teach me rules and strategies, to evaluate my play and suggest improvements, answer questions, encourage and guide me, and provide opponents. In competing with one another, we develop one another’s skills, and each of us is able to recognize and value those skills in the other and hence values the other person for exhibiting those skills.
MacIntyre notes that when individuals first start to engage in a practice, they have no choice but to agree to accept external standards for the evaluation of their performance and to agree to follow the rules set out for the practice: “A practice involves standards of excellence and obedience to rules as well as the achievement of goods” (After Virtue 190). As a newcomer, I lack the knowledge and experience that would let me evaluate myself and my efforts, so I must rely on others to judge me according to the standards of the practice. And I cannot simply subordinate the standards to my will; I cannot simply decide that I am a grand master at chess because I want to be one. The standards that determine who is and who is not a grand master are already established, and I must accept them. Unilaterally declaring myself a grand master will not place me at the top of the chess hierarchy; it will place me outside it altogether. As I gain in talent, experience, and knowledge, I can begin to have input into the standards themselves, but I will never gain the ability to move outside them if I want to continue to participate in the practice. Nor will I ever gain the ability to move outside the rules if I want to be part of the practice, although in some cases the community can agree to change the rules if they believe it is beneficial to the practice. So, for example, the rules of chess have changed since the game’s origin, and MacIntyre would likely say that this has happened in order to more fully develop the principles of the game.
MacIntyre also emphasizes that chess, like other practices, has a history and is part of a tradition. So he might point out that an important part of becoming a grand master at chess is studying the records of games that have been played by previous grand masters, reading commentaries on those games, examining their philosophies, practice regimens, and the psychological tactics they employed on their opponents, and so on. The rules and standards have developed in the past and are binding on the present, and although they can sometimes be changed by the community as a whole those changes should be consistent with the principles of the game as it has developed in the past. This would seem to be a very conservative doctrine, as it is in the hands of someone like Edmund Burke (cf. Reflections on the Revolution in France), but MacIntyre is explicit that traditions that are in good order require ongoing internal debates about the meaning of the tradition and how it is to be improved and developed for the future. He is not advocating blind loyalty to the past, nor is he saying that all change is bad. He is only acknowledging that the present rests on the past and must take that past into account in its self-understanding as well as in its planning for the future. We have already mentioned changes in the rules of chess, but other transformations can occur without changing the rules. Today, for example, chess players may decide that they must revise what they know about the game and how it is played in order to compete against computer opponents which use very different methods of playing than human opponents do. This requires new approaches and tactics which will become part of the tradition that is available to players in the future. But developing new methods does not require starting from scratch – the past provides materials for use in the present and should not be dismissed as irrelevant.
Although MacIntyre does not emphasize this, he likely would agree with Burke that the idea that one is part of a tradition can serve to strengthen the community, as it encourages the present practitioners to think of themselves as tied to the past and with an obligation to the future, so that they will work to surpass the standards of the past and leave a tradition that is in good order to those who will practice it in the future.
Practices are also important because it is only within the context of a practice that human beings can practice the virtues. Goods that are external to practices, such as money and power, can be achieved in a variety of ways, some good and some bad. But achieving the goods that are internal to a practice, according to MacIntyre, requires the presence of the , and in After Virtue he defines the virtues in terms of practices: “A virtue is an acquired human quality the possession and the exercise of which tends to enable us to achieve those goods which are internal to practices and the lack of which effectively prevents us from achieving any such goods….we have to accept as necessary components of any practice with internal goods and standards of excellence the virtues of justice, courage, and honesty” (After Virtue 191). The necessity of these virtues follows logically from the definition of a practice, as we shall see, but it is important to understand that as far as MacIntyre is concerned, virtues and therefore morality can only make sense in the context of a practice: they require a shared end, shared rules, and shared standards of evaluation. The virtues also define the relationships among those who share a practice: “….the virtues are those goods by reference to which, whether we like it or not, we define our relationships to those other people with whom we share the kind of purposes and standards which inform practices” (After Virtue 191). We must have the virtues if we are to have healthy practices and healthy communities. Let us consider the three virtues of honesty, courage, and justice and see how they arise from practices.
Members of a practice must be honest with each other when they instruct others in the principles of the practice, when they explain the rules to them, and when they evaluate their performance. And we have already seen that the practitioners must not lie or cheat when they engage in the practice, or they will not really be engaging in it and will not gain the benefits of doing so. Courage, MacIntyre says, is a virtue “because the care and concern for individuals, communities and causes which is so crucial to so much in practices requires the existence of such a virtue” (After Virtue 192). Practitioners of a shared practice come to genuinely care about each other, and genuinely caring about others means a willingness to risk harm or danger on their behalf, and that is what courage is. Finally, “Justice requires that we treat others in respect of merit or desert according to uniform and impersonal standards,” and we have seen that these are the standards that are a part of a practice (After Virtue 192). So virtues such as honesty, courage, and justice have meaning in the context of a practice, raising the possibility that there is a way out of the moral chaos that surrounds us today.
MacIntyre is vague about what things do and do not constitute practices; he gives some examples of each, stating that playing chess is a practice but playing tic-tac-toe isn’t; farming is, but planting turnips isn’t. More important to him than narrowly defining the boundaries of a practice is arguing that particular kinds of activities certainly are practices. Why does MacIntyre care so much about practices? It is because he believes that there are a number of things that have been practices in the past, currently are not, but could (and should) be again, and chief among these is politics. It is possible to think of politics as a practice within a community that has a shared aim, and where the members of that community have the same standards of excellence, the same rules, and the same traditions. Indeed, in MacIntyre’s view, politics is a sort of meta-practice, because it is the practice of determining the best life for human beings, a life which will include engaging in other practices. Here MacIntyre parallels Aristotle’s language about politics as the science ordering the other sciences (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics I.2). The benefits of a practice would then flow to those who participated in politics – in fact, certain important benefits could only be achieved by political participation – and politics would make people more virtuous rather than less virtuous as it now does. To see why politics currently makes people worse instead of better, and how this inevitably follows from our current moral anarchy, we need to take a closer look at contemporary politics.
MacIntyre argues that today we live in a fragmented society made up of individuals who have no conception of the human good, no way to come together to pursue a common good, no way to persuade one another about what that common good might be, and indeed most of us believe that the common good does not and cannot exist. What kind of politics can such a society have? “Politically the societies of advanced Western modernity are oligarchies disguised as liberal democracies. The large majority of those who inhabit them are excluded from membership in the elites that determine the range of alternatives between which voters are permitted to choose. And the most fundamental issues are excluded from that range of alternatives.” (The MacIntyre Reader 237; see also The MacIntyre Reader 248, 272). What MacIntyre means by “the most fundamental issues” are the issues of what the best way of life is for individual human beings and for human communities as a whole, and how each can be ordered so as to enable the other to flourish. Modern politics has no space for such issues. Prior to the 2004 election in the United States he published a short essay on the Internet arguing that in light of this lack of meaningful alternatives about the most fundamental issues the proper thing to do was refrain from voting. There are no meaningful alternatives on these issues because almost all citizens subscribe, consciously or not, to the modern idea that issues about the best way of life are not capable of political resolution or consensus and that they must be left to each individual to decide. MacIntyre and other critics of liberalism, which they see as the political manifestation of emotivism, argue that liberalism claims to be neutral about the best way of life and moves debates about it out of the public sphere and into the private, claiming that the state should take no position about what the good life or the good state is. This however has the effect of privileging a certain kind of life and a certain kind of state in the name of neutrality; it is another of the deceptions of the modern world. Because liberalism asserts that each individual has a right to pursue happiness in his or her own way, and because the versions of happiness individuals pursue are inevitably mutually incompatible (I wish to have prayer in schools, you do not; I wish to outlaw abortion, which you support; I wish to raise taxes on the wealthy to feed the poor, which you reject), and because we cannot persuade one another or agree on a common good, politics is, as MacIntyre says, “civil war carried on by other means” (After Virtue 253).
MacIntyre’s famous comment, quoted earlier, about the new dark ages we are living in is followed by the observation that in contrast to the earlier dark ages, the barbarians are not at the gates but in fact have been governing us for some time (After Virtue 263). This conclusion is what we would expect if MacIntyre’s view of the world is right. We would be ruled by people who are ruthlessly aggressive, ignorant of or actually hostile to the virtues required for civilized life, and destructive of social life. Since politics today is about using ideas and arguments not to search for truth but to manipulate others in the quest for power, we would expect the people with the most power to be the ones who are best at manipulating others for their own purposes and who have the greatest desire for power. The reasons they would give to justify their power would be false, but widely accepted, and they would use that power for their own selfish ends. Furthermore, they would pursue that power through whatever means they felt would be most effective, in the absence of any of the standards of right and wrong or success and failure that a practice would provide. In such a world, MacIntyre says, things that would appear to be vices would in fact be virtues. For example, keeping one’s word, which as we have already seen MacIntyre considers to be one of the most important virtues (it is part of honesty), would frequently have negative consequences for those who practiced it, since it might end up being an obstacle to achieving some goal most effectively. So instead of condemning people for not keeping their word, we praise them for the virtue of “adaptability” and the ability to change as the situation demands it. If politics were a practice with the possibility of internal goods and virtues, this would not be the case; but since it is currently not a practice, and therefore has only external goods to offer, it is. Anyone who has read The Prince cannot read MacIntyre on this point without recalling Machiavelli’s advice to the prince about the need to be adaptable and the only relevant standards being those of success or failure; MacIntyre would certainly agree that the modern world is characterized by its Machiavellian politics.
It would also be in the interest of the ruling elite that would arise that no one raises any of the fundamental questions about the best life for human beings and the community considered earlier, because any answer to those questions, and indeed any attempt to find answers, could only undermine the legitimacy of their rule which is based on the belief that there are no such answers. MacIntyre says in After Virtue that claims to rule are based on the claim to possess bureaucratic competence as described by Max Weber: people claim that they should have power because they are the ones that can use it most effectively, although the goals that they are pursuing in such an effective fashion are never questioned or discussed. MacIntyre further believes that these claims of managerial competence are and must be false; they are another of the deceptions of the modern age (After Virtue Chapter 6-8). But even if these claims were valid, valuing the effective use of power without considering the ends for which it is being used is a mistake. Trying to answer questions about the proper ends of human life not only reveals the nature of our current problems and the responsibility of those in power for creating and perpetuating them but it also leads to the realization that the world needs radical change before it can even be possible to discover the answers.
MacIntyre argues that modern politics has no place for patriotism, because there is no patria, or fatherland. Although there can be nationalism, jingoism, and propaganda, there can be no genuine, healthy affection for the nation or for our fellow citizens because we lack a shared project that would connect us to the nation or to our fellow citizens. It would be bizarre for people to have a feeling of attachment to the modern state, since it is bound to thwart many of their projects, allows them no effective voice, and gives them no unifying vision of the good life or any kind of shared community. And if the state is purely instrumental, to be used to advance one’s own projects, why would anyone be willing to die for it, since death means the end of all such projects? Yet the state requires such a patriotic attachment, because it needs people willing to serve as soldiers, police officers, and in other similar life- and safety-threatening jobs. In trying to create such an attachment, the state reveals its own nature and its absurdity: “The modern state…behaves part of the time towards those subjected to it as if it were no more than a giant, monopolistic utility company and part of the time as if it were the sacred guardian of all that is most to be valued. In the one capacity it requires us to fill in the appropriate forms in triplicate. In the other, it periodically demands that we die for it” (The MacIntyre Reader 227; see also The MacIntyre Reader 236).
Finally, in addition to these political problems, the modern age is also characterized by global capitalism, which in MacIntyre’s view has its own deeply pernicious consequences. First, it reinforces emotivism by making the pursuit of one’s preferences the highest good. By doing so, it is like emotivism in that it promotes a false view of human happiness. We will see shortly what MacIntyre sees as the truly happy human life, or at least the potentially happy life, which is lived according to the objective standards of virtue found within a tradition. But we can say here that that life does not involve simply accumulating money or the things that money can buy. Money has a role to play in the virtuous life; there are certain virtues, such as generosity, which are impossible or at least very difficult to carry out without money – here MacIntyre agrees with Aristotle. But a life spent pursuing money is a wasted life, as far as MacIntyre is concerned.
Second, capitalism as an ideology also promotes the instrumental manipulation of people we have already discussed. The capitalist manager manipulates their employees in the production of goods, and the marketing department manipulates customers in order to get them to consume those goods. Free market economies “in fact ruthlessly impose market conditions that forcibly deprive many workers of productive work, that condemn parts of the labor force in metropolitan countries and whole societies in less developed areas to irremediable economic deprivation, that enlarge inequalities and divisions of wealth and income, so organizing societies into competing and antagonistic interests” (The MacIntyre Reader 249). And it is money that dominates the modern politics that is constructed by this capitalist competition and antagonism (Dependent Rational Animals 131). Money and the harm it does to the political process will not be removed from politics until people choose to pursue goods of excellence rather than goods of effectiveness. Capitalism is therefore not only harmful in and of itself but also for its effects on politics.
Given his abiding interest in and admiration for the polis, it would not be surprising if MacIntyre has another meaning for “barbarians” when he describes the people who rule us today: for the ancient Greeks, anyone who did not live in a polis and participate in polis life was a barbarian, and when we see what MacIntyre thinks the polis was and what kind of life pursued there, we will see that the people who are on top in the world today are very far from living that kind of life – as, of course, we all are. So he is probably using the word as it was originally used, in addition to using it for its modern meaning. Overcoming the modern barbarians would mean creating and defending a modern version of the polis – and to do this, we must understand the ancient version of the polis.
It is time, then, to turn to the ancient world which was destroyed by the modern world we have been describing (MacIntyre offers a history of how the new world came to replace the old one in After Virtue, Chapter 16). Most of our attention will be focused, as MacIntyre’s is, on the Athenian polis, or city-state, in the time of Aristotle, and on Aristotle’s thought, which MacIntyre believes is an expression of the way of life of the Athenian upper class. As with his description of modernity, his descriptions of the ancient world and Aristotle’s thought are contentious, and there are many points on which other scholars disagree with his arguments and his conclusions. We will be focusing on the contrast between the ancient world and the modern world and the reasons MacIntyre believes the former to be in many ways superior. Keep in mind that ultimately he wants us to learn from the institutions and ideas of the past and modify them to fit the conditions of the modern world; the final part of this essay will describe how his new world would differ from the world in which we now live.
MacIntyre does not want to try to recreate the polis, nor does he believe it would be possible even if it were desirable. MacIntyre also does not simply offer uncritical praise of the polis. He is strongly opposed to many of the institutions that made day-to-day polis life possible: slavery, the treatment of women, the elitism of its politics and political philosophy, and its exclusion of outsiders. One can summarize these positions by saying that MacIntyre rejects those elements of the polis and of Aristotle’s thought that are hierarchical in a way that subordinates some people (actually most people) for the good of others. So MacIntyre realizes that there is much in the polis that we do not and should not wish to restore. He believes that it is possible to separate the positive features of the polis from its negative features, keeping the former while rejecting the latter; whether he is correct in this is an open question.
For MacIntyre, understanding the polis means understanding its predecessor: heroic society as described by Homer in the Iliad and Odyssey (After Virtue Chapter 10; Whose Justice? Which Rationality? Chapter 2). In heroic society, MacIntyre says, people did not see themselves as we moderns do, as individuals bearing rights and seeking autonomy from external control through the manipulation of others. They also did not see themselves as constructing their own identities, choosing what they wanted to be and who they were. Instead, their identities came from their place within their society: “The self becomes what it is in heroic societies only through its role; it is a social creation, not an individual one” (After Virtue 129). Each individual had a fixed role resulting from their location in the social network, primarily through their particular ties to their family and kin, and each individual had the specific obligations and privileges attached to that location.
Many of these obligations were not chosen by the person bearing them, and that person was not free to choose other obligations instead. Nor would trying to evade one’s obligations be praised as an example of adaptability; it would be condemned as a violation of the social order, which was the framework on which morality was built. People in this society did not try to determine morality in terms of abstract objective rules which applied to all equally – to try to place oneself outside of society was to cease to exist, because each person’s identity made sense only in the context of that society. As MacIntyre puts it, each individual in such a society “has a given role and status within a well-defined and highly determinate system of roles and statuses….In such a society a man [sic] knows who he is by knowing his role in these structures; and in knowing this he knows also what he owes and what is owed to him by the occupant of every other role and status” (After Virtue 122). So in any particular situation, an individual would be able to understand what they should do in a straightforward way: the thing for them to do is the thing that it is appropriate for a person in their position to do by showing the proper regard for someone, meeting the particular obligations they have, doing what their duty requires them to do, and so forth. And it is also clear what actions must be performed in order to do these things. All they must do is ask what a person in their position is supposed to do in this situation and then do it.
In MacIntyre’s view, this kind of society, unlike modern societies, can have a genuine moral code, since failing to do what a person in a particular position is supposed to do is a moral failure, and that person can and will be judged accordingly by the other members of the society, who know what that person’s duties, obligations, and privileges are and have legitimate claims on that person for them. This moral code is based on what is agreed to be the shared end of the society and the best way to achieve it, which gives each member their proper role in the society and their proper tasks. Heroic society is not by any means democratic, and so it would appear that democracy is not necessary to have this kind of society, but MacIntyre does believe that societies which include practices and virtues nowadays will prove to be democratic – much more democratic than they are now, in fact.
Recall our earlier discussion of the practices and the virtues. Taken as a whole, this kind of society can be understood as a kind of practice. Each individual agrees about what the virtues are – those traits that make it possible for them to carry out their obligations as they ought to in order to bring about the best possible life for the society as a whole – and they follow the virtues in living out their lives. There is also a determinate pattern to the life of each individual in the society, as each meets their obligations and fulfills their role like characters in a story. Remember the earlier suggestion that making sense out of morality today is like trying to tell a coherent story by mixing up parts of five or six very different novels. In this society, each individual is like a character in a story that is told by the society as a whole. The story is about what the good life is, and it provides a shared narrative for everyone. What is good for the individual and what is good for society are mutually reinforcing. If each individual does what they are supposed to do, the society will function as it should, and at the same time the society provides the context for the happy life spent in pursuit of the virtues that give meaning to the lives of its members.
MacIntyre asserts that the virtues of heroic society and the heroic ideal carry forward into classical Athens, but since Athenian society is organized very differently than heroic society, this leads to difficulties. The virtues that are expressed in a society organized primarily around family and kinship networks have to be expressed differently in a society organized around the principle of the equality of citizens and the activity of politics. In MacIntyre’s view, much of Athenian philosophy and art is engaged in redefining the heroic virtues to make them fit the new context of the polis; again we see how philosophy and society are interrelated, with changes in society leading to changes in philosophy. MacIntyre’s definition of the polis is somewhat idiosyncratic: “The application of [the virtues as a way to measure an individual's goodness] in a community whose shared aim is the realization of the human good presupposes of course a wide range of agreement in that community on goods and virtues, and it is this agreement which makes possible the kind of bond between citizens which, on Aristotle’s view, constitutes a polis” (After Virtue 155; see also Whose Justice? Which Rationality? 33-34). Restoring this agreement is the sense in which MacIntyre wants to return to the polis.
That the polis was the setting for the good life was, MacIntyre says, taken for granted by everyone participating in the debate about what the virtues could mean in their new setting, and in After Virtue he examines four of the voices in this debate: Plato, the sophists, playwrights such as Sophocles, and Aristotle. It is Aristotle who comes to be MacIntyre’s focus, because it is Aristotle “whose account of the virtues decisively constitutes the classical tradition as a tradition of moral thought” (After Virtue 147). MacIntyre believes that Aristotle is essentially expressing the Athenian way of life in the form of a philosophy. Some scholars would disagree with this argument, but let us consider Aristotle more closely in order to see MacIntyre’s argument.
Aristotle’s philosophy has at its heart the idea of a telos, or final purpose. Think about a knife for a moment. If you were asked to describe a knife, what would you say about it? You would probably describe its size and shape, what it is made out of, the fact that it has a handle and a blade, and you would probably also say that its purpose is to cut things. That purpose is its telos, and your description of the knife would be incomplete in an important way if you did not include it. It is fairly easy to see that something made by human beings has a telos, since humans generally create things for specific purposes. But Aristotle believes that things in the natural world also have a telos. The acorn has as its telos growing into a big, tall, strong oak tree, full of healthy acorns. The baby thoroughbred horse has as its telos being a swift runner; the wolf cub will grow up to hunt well; and so on. Human beings also have a telos, and according to Aristotle it is to be happy by living a life in accordance with the virtues. This is the inherent purpose of human life, and each of us is intended by nature to live a virtuous life in the same way the acorn is meant to be an oak tree and the colt is meant to be a swift racehorse. We do not get to choose what our telos is, any more than a knife or an acorn or a horse does. We do get to choose whether or not we are going to try to achieve it, and we can be held responsible if we do not (The MacIntyre Reader, “Plain Persons and Moral Philosophy”).
The idea of a telos can be used to provide standards for normatively evaluating things. For example, if I have a knife that will not hold an edge, or has a handle that falls off, I have a knife that will not be able to fulfill its telos. It cannot do what it is supposed to do and what it was made to do. I can therefore say that it is a bad knife. Similarly, a wolf that is fat and lazy, or unable to scent animals, or runs slowly, is not the ideal wolf. It has not become what it was supposed to be. And human beings, if they do not pursue the life of happiness through virtuous behavior that is their telos, are bad human beings. They are guilty of moral failure, and everyone who agrees about what the human telos is will have to agree to that, in the same way they will have to agree that a knife that falls apart whenever someone tries to use it is a bad knife. Thus, for people who share a telos and whose community expresses that shared telos, morality has context and meaning.
It should be pointed out here that contemporary philosophies such as emotivism deny that there is a human telos (with ruinous consequences as far as MacIntyre is concerned). The idea that there is a human telos carries with it its own problems. Most obviously, it has at least so far proven impossible to unite all people behind a particular idea of what that telos is, or to demonstrate how we can be sure that a telos even exists. Often, the idea that nature or the gods want people to pursue certain goals and behave in certain ways has been used as a pretext for human tyranny. Many would point to the Taliban in Afghanistan, or the Catholic Inquisition, as an example of this. Also, there have been historical eras in which people in different societies strongly believed that there was a telos, but disagreed about what it was (in fact, the era of the polis in Greece was one such era). This has often led to war. The liberal idea of religious toleration, based on the idea that the proper work of government is the protection of people’s bodies and property rather than their soul (see Locke’s Letter Concerning Toleration), was in part the result of the religious wars, which were in part about the best life for human beings, that ravaged Europe for centuries (and ravage other parts of the world today). MacIntyre points out, however, that just because we haven’t reached agreement on this subject doesn’t mean that we can’t, and he argues that the belief that we can’t is a historically specific belief, rather than an objective and permanent truth about how the world works. If we reason correctly, and examine competing philosophical traditions of moral enquiry, we can choose the most accurate one. (This is the task of Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry).
You may want to think about physical health as an analogy. If I want to be healthy, I am much more likely to succeed if I am willing to exercise, eat sensibly, avoid tobacco and other drugs, and do what my doctor tells me, even when that means undergoing painful surgery, paying for expensive treatments, or swallowing foul-tasting medicines. I am certainly free not to do any of these things. I can smoke, overeat, lie on the couch all day, and never go near a doctor’s office. But in that case I won’t be healthy, and I don’t get to redefine “health” to cover my condition. If I said I was living such a lifestyle because I was trying to live a healthy life, anyone who knew anything about health would laugh at me. Since health is preferable to sickness, I should be willing to reject unhealthy behaviors that are temporarily pleasant to achieve what is really good for me in the long run. Yet often I do not. In the same way, I should give up things that do not bring me closer to my telos by contributing to a virtuous life. But, again, often I do not. And if we accept that certain things are inherently good or harmful for our bodies because of our nature as particular kinds of animals, why shouldn’t we accept the same principle regarding our souls?
As human beings, we are not always inclined to live a virtuous life devoted to the pursuit of the virtues, but that is the life that we should lead. MacIntyre calls this the distinction between “human nature as it is” and “human nature as it could be if it realized its telos” (After Virtue 52). The role of ethical theory is to take us from the former condition to the latter, teaching us how to overcome the weaknesses of our human nature and become what we are capable of becoming, as well as why this ought to be our good. It is like a road map, showing us where we are and where we need to get to and identifying the hazards along the way. Recall that MacIntyre said that in the modern world people believe that they do not have any fixed telos or purpose; there is nothing that we are meant to become, no innate goal that we move towards. (MacIntyre points to Hobbes and Leviathan as an example of this philosophical belief and its consequences). Absent any conception of what human beings are supposed to become if they realized their telos, there can be no ethical theory, because it simply has no purpose. For people with no destination, a road map has no value.
We have seen MacIntyre’s description of modernity and its problems, and we have seen his description of the life of the polis and the philosophy of Aristotle. This brings us to the choice MacIntyre says confronts us. In After Virtue he says that we can either choose the modern world, with its emotivism, liberalism and capitalism – a world which, if we are honest, is actually a Nietzschean world – or we can choose to return to a morality and a conception of the virtues based on the philosophy of Aristotle (After Virtue Chapter 18). MacIntyre wants us to reject Nietzsche and choose Aristotle – not on the basis of the kind of arbitrary decision made under emotivism, but on the grounds that the kind of rational morality proposed by Aristotle does not fall prey to the criticisms of Nietzsche. It remains to describe what the future would hold if MacIntyre were successful in his project. How would a world based on the experience of the polis and the philosophy of Aristotle that world differ from the world we live in today? After Virtue ends without providing much guidance – MacIntyre says that we are waiting for a new Saint Benedict (who was the founder of monasticism in the Catholic tradition) to lead us out of the new dark ages (After Virtue 263) – but in his later writings he has offered more detail about what a better world would look like.
Much of what MacIntyre has to say on this topic is found in Dependent Rational Animals, and that book will be the focus of this section of the essay. MacIntyre intends the book to answer two questions: “Why is it important for us to attend to and to understand what human beings have in common with members of other intelligent animal species?” and “What makes attention to human vulnerability and disability important for moral philosophers?” (Dependent Rational Animals ix). The book reflects MacIntyre’s change of position regarding whether “an ethics independent of biology” is possible (Dependent Rational Animals x). In After Virtue he had rejected Aristotle’s biological teleology – which is the idea that human beings have a telos because of the particular kind of creature that we are. Aristotle says that only human beings have the ability to speak and reason and therefore our telos is to develop that reason. In Dependent Rational Animals MacIntyre now accepts the idea of a biological teleology, but much of his argument for this is based on the idea that it is not human beings alone that have the ability to speak and reason; dolphins and gorillas can also do these things, and we can learn something about humans from how these other animals pursue their individual and collective goods. What we learn is that for human beings the key to flourishing is to be an independent practical reasoner (Dependent Rational Animals 77). What are the consequences of this?
MacIntyre now believes that any successful ethical theory must comprehend three aspects of human existence: we are dependent, we are rational, and we are animals. The first and third of these, he says, are seldom taken into account by philosophers, and the second is frequently overemphasized. Aristotle comes in for particular criticism for denying the merit of the experiences of dependent human beings and making a virtue out of self-sufficient superiority (Dependent Rational Animals 6-7, 127). These are flaws which can be seen to contribute to MacIntyre’s turning away from Aristotle and towards Aquinas, whose account of the human telos and virtues includes resources that allow us to include everyone in the community rather than a small elite as Aristotle’s philosophy does. Much of the book is concerned with placing human beings in relationship to other animals, especially with regard to intelligence and rationality. MacIntyre argues that human beings retain their animal natures in important ways (Dependent Rational Animals 49) and that we are like gorillas and dolphins in that members of each species “pursue their respective goods in company with and in cooperation with each other” (Dependent Rational Animals 61).
Because we are animals, we are vulnerable to a wide range of inadequacies, deficiencies, and illnesses and are in need of the help of others if we are to survive and even more help if we are to thrive. Each of us has had the experience of dependency in infancy and childhood and most of us will face physical dependency again as we age. The kind of dependency that MacIntyre focuses on is our dependency on others to learn how to be rational and how to be ethical. This need is strongest in children, who at first simply follow whatever desires they happen to have at the moment. One of the things that parents must do (MacIntyre focuses on the mother throughout his discussion of parenting, without giving any reasons for this) is to teach their children that what they desire is not necessarily what is best for them at that time or what is best for them in the context of their life as a whole. Even when we pass beyond childhood, we still need others to watch and comment on our motives and actions, to insure that those aim at what is good for us and not merely at satisfying our temporary and potentially harmful desires. These are our friends, who provide us with insight and self-understanding, not least because they call us to account for our actions when those seem immoral, short sighted, or out of character. To provide such an account I must first reflect on my motivations and goals, and then explain them in such a way that my friend can make sense of them.
This is one of the ways in which I need other people, receive things from them, and am dependent on them. Throughout my life, other people assist me in developing the use of my reason, and I am dependent on others for this; I cannot become rational on my own. I can only grow if I can reason with and learn from others, and this requires certain traits from me: the virtues (honesty, courage, and justice, for example). Each of us also finds that others are dependent on us at different times and in different ways, and we are obligated to assist them in developing the same qualities and virtues others are helping us to develop; and this assistance is itself a virtue. We therefore find ourselves as part of a community of giving and receiving which is a network of duties and obligations. Potentially, of course, these same networks are dangerous; MacIntyre acknowledges that these structures of giving and receiving are also structures of unequal power distribution and potentially of domination and deprivation (Dependent Rational Animals 102). We must take care to see that they are not used in this way. But this network of obligations in the service of a shared good – the development of human capacities to reason and behave virtuously – means that this kind of society resembles the polis as MacIntyre understands it.
So acknowledging our nature as a particular kind of animal forces us to acknowledge our dependence on others to develop our rationality and become independent and our need to use our rationality to help dependent others (hence the title: Dependent Rational Animals). MacIntyre says that each of these is a different kind of virtue: the virtues of dependence differ from the virtues of independence but are nonetheless virtues (Dependent Rational Animals Chapter 10). This in turn requires us to acknowledge the networks of relationships of which we are a part, and once we have done this we can and must deliberate about the social and political institutions we wish to create in order to promote and protect these networks. Collectively promoting the social structures we need in order to flourish as individuals enables us to escape from false dichotomies between self-interest and the common interest and between selfishness and altruism. In supporting the networks that are necessary if we are to flourish, I am promoting both my interest and everyone else’s, and I am looking out for the common good as well as my own individual good. Practices, then, are both consequences of our nature as the kind of animals we are, when we properly understand the kind of animals we are, and forms of social order that are in keeping with our nature, as opposed to contemporary forms of social order (liberalism and capitalism) which are not.
MacIntyre has shown that his ideal society would be different from our own in two particular areas, politics and economics, and now it is time to consider what he believes we should do in order to bring this ideal society into being. As was stated at the very beginning of this essay, MacIntyre is writing in order to resist the modern world, including modern politics. “Modern systematic politics, whether liberal, conservative, radical, or socialist, simply has to be rejected from a standpoint that owes genuine allegiance to the tradition of the virtues; for modern politics itself expresses in its institutional forms a systematic rejection of that tradition” (After Virtue 255). When we have made the changes MacIntyre wants to see, politics will no longer be civil war by other means: “the politics of such communities…is not a politics of competing interests in the way in which the politics of the modern state is” (Dependent Rational Animals 144). It is instead a shared project, and one that is shared by all adults, rather than being limited to a few elites who have gained power through manipulation and use that power to gain the goods of effectiveness for themselves. Politics will not be about people selfishly fighting over power and money; instead there will be “a conception of political activity as one aspect of the everyday activity of every adult capable of engaging in it” (Dependent Rational Animals 141). Human beings, as the kind of creatures we are, need the internal goods/goods of excellence that can only be acquired through participation in politics if we are to flourish. Therefore, everyone must be allowed to have access to the political decision-making process. The matters to be discussed and decided on will not be limited as they are now; they will extend to questions about what the good life is for the community and those who make it up. Politics will be especially concerned with the virtues of justice and generosity, ensuring that citizens get what they deserve and what they need. And it is an important requirement of this new politics that, everyone must “have a voice in communal deliberation about what these norms of justice require” (Dependent Rational Animals 129-130). This kind of deliberation requires small communities; although not every kind of small community is healthy, a healthy politics can only take place in a small community. Although their size cannot be precisely specified, they will be intermediate in scale between the family and the modern state (Dependent Rational Animals 131).
Politics will be understood and lived as a practice, and it will be about the pursuit of internal goods/goods of excellence rather than external goods/goods of effectiveness. “It is only because and when a certain range of moral commitments is shared, as it must be within a community structured by networks of giving and receiving, that not only shared deliberation, but shared critical enquiry concerning that deliberation and the way of life of which it is a part, becomes possible” (Dependent Rational Animals 161). When the community deliberates collectively about its best way of life it is choosing a telos, or final end. And that final end will be one which reflects the needs of all the citizens, including the need to have and use the virtues, which are part of our nature as dependent rational animals.
MacIntyre’s communities will also have traditions and histories, and they will have people who are authorities to whom the rest of us will submit ourselves while we learn about those traditions and histories. Think back to the discussion of chess. Authority in chess is derived from a mastery of the virtues internal to the game (or goods of excellence) rather than external virtues (or goods of effectiveness). Chess players with authority do not have authority because they dominate others, or because they have wealth or political power. Players recognize who has mastered the virtues internal to the game, and try to learn from them. Rather than hating or resenting or fearing those with authority, they welcome and value them; the powerful seek to share their knowledge and skills for the good of the game, rather than for purposes of domination or exploitation. All the players recognize the rules of the game that make it possible for the game to educate us in its virtues, and they follow those rules because they recognize them as necessary and desirable. They are loyal to the game, they enjoy it, and they genuinely care about those with whom they share it. There is competition, to be sure, but it is in the service of pursuing a common good. The political community, for MacIntyre, must be this kind of community.
Capitalism must be replaced or transformed, or at least ways must be found to shield individual small communities from its effects. “The tradition of the virtues is at variance with central features of the modern economic order and more especially its individualism, its acquisitiveness and its elevation of the values of the market to a central social place” (After Virtue 254). The ideas that the purpose of life is to get rich and that the well-being of a society can be measured by its economic production will both be rejected, for these both reflect a focus on the goods of effectiveness rather than the goods of excellence. In addition, capitalism undermines communities of all kinds, including the family; we must have a way of life that puts the common good first. “Market relationships can only be sustained by being embedded in certain types of local nonmarket relationship, relationships of uncalculated giving and receiving, if they are to contribute to overall flourishing, rather than, as they so often in fact do, undermine and corrupt communal ties” (Dependent Rational Animals 117). There are many possibilities for how we might construct new economic systems. “The institutional forms through which such a way of life is realized, although economically various, have this in common: they do not promote economic growth and they require some significant degree of insulation from and protection from the forces generated by outside markets” (Dependent Rational Animals 145; The MacIntyre Reader 249). The society MacIntyre prefers will have only small inequalities of income and wealth, to prevent people from being excluded from the community by their poverty or placing themselves above it on account of their great wealth, both of which phenomena we certainly see today (and which Aristotle recognized in his day). If MacIntyre is correct that growing up as human beings is about learning to overcome our immediate desires and learning to see our long term good, then advertising and marketing, which teach us to give in to our immediate desires, are going to become much less effective. Markets must be subordinated to the development of the virtues in individuals and the community, rather than the other way around, which is what happens in the world in which we now live.
MacIntyre’s ideal world would be very different from today’s world, and it is one that would undoubtedly take decades, and probably centuries, to arrive, just as the replacement of Aristotelian morality by liberal capitalism took a very long time. What are we to do in the meantime? MacIntyre says that we can begin to work on the kinds of small communities that are capable of preserving the practices and virtues even in the face of liberal capitalism (Whose Justice? Which Rationality? 99). We need to focus our energies on building and maintaining the kinds of small communities where practices and the virtues have a place and protecting them as much as possible from the depredations of the modern state and modern capitalism. At the end of Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry, he proposes ways to modify universities and their curricula to bring them closer to the kind of communities he wants to encourage. As far back as 1968′s Marxism and Christianity, MacIntyre was advocating “a politics of self-defence for all those local societies that aspire to achieve some relatively self-sufficient and independent form of participatory practice-based community” (Marxism and Christianity xxvi, cited in The MacIntyre Reader 23; see The MacIntyre Reader 248 and Breen 187). Small communities will also make it possible for people to evaluate political candidates in a variety of settings and judge them on the basis of integrity rather than adaptability (The MacIntyre Reader 249). We can evaluate our leaders on their actual characters rather than seeing them through the distortions of advertising and the manipulation of propaganda.
MacIntyre’s objections to liberal capitalism show the influences of both the Marxism to which he subscribed early in his career and the Catholic Church of which he is now a member. Both Marxism and Catholicism, for different reasons, critique the unbridled pursuit of wealth under capitalism. But there are many reasons to doubt that the kind of society MacIntyre promotes will turn out as he wishes. Many authors, from Adam Smith to Hayek to von Mises, have argued that attempts to control or limit markets inevitably have as a consequence attempts to control and limit human beings in ways that lead to the gulag rather than to the virtues. They would also argue that MacIntyre’s proposals, by limiting or discouraging economic growth, would condemn the poor to continued poverty and prevent improvements in living standards in general, and would punish people who are able to successfully provide people with what they want while profiting from this success. This would kill initiative and innovation and lead to stagnation. Whether people agree or disagree, MacIntyre would probably take some satisfaction in the fact that at least there is an argument going on – a serious discussion about the ultimate values and way of life the community should pursue – which is typically avoided or stifled on those rare occasions when it does arise. The next step would be to make this kind of argument a part of mainstream political discussions.
If his ideas become widespread and are widely adopted, MacIntyre’s small communities, like St. Benedict’s monasteries, will preserve the practices, the virtues, and morality until such a time as they can re-emerge into the world. In the meantime they will be the best way of life for those who are fortunate and hard-working enough to be a part of them today. And of course those who, like MacIntyre, practice philosophy must continue to strengthen and develop the arguments found in the Aristotelian tradition as it has developed through Aquinas, and continue to draw attention to the flaws and weaknesses of liberal philosophy in the hope of persuading others to change their allegiances.
This bibliography includes only the most significant books from the period beginning with After Virtue and is in chronological order.
- MacIntyre, Alasdair. After Virtue. Second Edition. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1984 (1981).
- The foundation of his later work and the most important of his books to read. Includes his arguments about the failures of modern philosophy and politics and how those failures might be overcome, or at least diminished, with the help of the philosophy of Aristotle and the political way of life of the Greek city-state.
- MacIntyre, Alasdair. Whose Justice? Which Rationality? Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1988.
- MacIntyre addresses “both what makes it rational to act in one way rather than another and what makes it rational to advance and defend one conception of practical rationality rather than another” (p. ix).
- MacIntyre, Alasdair. Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1990.
- MacIntyre discusses three rival versions of moral enquiry: encyclopedia, tradition, and geneaology. He describes how they conflict with one another and the possibility that one of these traditions can “emerge as indisputably rationally superior” (p. 5). It is the Thomist tradition, he argues, that proves to be rationally superior to the others.
- Knight, Kelvin. The MacIntyre Reader. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1998.
- This is a collection of articles by MacIntyre, extracts from After Virtue and Whose Justice? Which Rationality?, and a pair of interviews of MacIntyre, along with an introductory essay on MacIntyre by Knight. The book is an excellent source for anyone looking for an overview of MacIntyre’s career, and Knight’s essay is an outstanding analysis of MacIntyre’s project. There is also a very thorough Guide to Further Reading, in essay form, in which Knight again reveals a sympathetic and extensive knowledge of MacIntyre’s work. Highly recommended.
- MacIntyre, Alasdair. Dependent Rational Animals: Why Human Beings Need the Virtues. Chicago: Open Court, 1999.
- MacIntyre begins this book with the claim that any moral philosophy must begin by acknowledging that human beings are a particular kind of animal with particular needs and goods that are determined by our animal nature. He then establishes what that nature is, and argues that it requires us to develop our rationality while acknowledging our dependence on others, thus providing us with a telos. He provides a sketch of what kind of social organization would be necessary to enable each of us to fulfill our telos, and how that kind of organization differs from the organization of the modern world.
- Ballard, Bruce W. Understanding MacIntyre. Lanham: University Press of America, Inc., 2000.
- This short (90 page) book has two parts: the first part explains the fundamentals of MacIntyre’s thought for beginning students, and the second part brings MacIntyre into contact with thinkers such as Marx, Kierkegaard, and Graybosch. Unfortunately these chapters are too brief to be really useful on their own; Chapter 10, for example, entitled “MacIntyre and His Critics,” is a mere five pages long.
- Breen, Keith. “Alasdair MacIntyre and the Hope for a Politics of Virtuous Acknowledged Dependence.” Contemporary Political Theory (2002) 1, 181-201.
- A political analysis of Dependent Rational Animals. The author concludes that MacIntyre must moderate his claims if he is to avoid self-contradiction and “a despairing purism.”
- Fuller, Michael. Making Sense of MacIntyre. Aldershot, UK: Ashgate, 1998.
- This 144 page book has a title that might lead one to expect an introductory volume, but while there is a summary of MacIntyre’s themes, the author also uses other philosophers, such as Donald Davidson and especially Richard Rorty, to make sense of MacIntyre’s thought, and the reader who is not already familiar with Davidson and Rorty may find this material difficult to understand.
- Horton, John, and Susan Mendus, eds. After MacIntyre: Critical Perspectives on the Work of Alasdair MacIntyre. Notre Dame: Notre Dame University Press, 1994.
- This collection of essays is wide-ranging, including essays on MacIntyre’s conception of justice, his characterization of liberalism, his interpretation of Aquinas and his critique of the Enlightenment. The last chapter is written by MacIntyre himself; entitled “A Partial Response To My Critics,” it offers MacIntyre’s responses to some of the criticisms offered by the other authors. (MacIntyre’s willingness to engage with his critics is both rare and admirable).
- McMylor, Peter. Alasdair MacIntyre: Critic of Modernity. London: Routledge, 1994.
- The author is a sociologist who treats MacIntyre’s work as social criticism. Part one is entitled “MacIntyre – Christianity and/or Marxism?” and part two is “Markets, Managers, and the Virtues.”
- Murphy, Mark C., ed. Alasdair MacIntyre. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
- A collection of eight essays by various scholars, with an introduction by Murphy, that address different aspects of MacIntyre’s thought. Chapters 6 and 7, “MacIntyre’s Political Philosophy,” by Murphy, and “MacIntyre’s Critique of Modernity,” by Terry Pinkard, were especially helpful in working on this essay. The book concludes with an excellent bibliography of works by and about MacIntyre.
- Weinstein, Jack Russell. On MacIntyre. No location: Thomson Wadsworth, 2003.
- Intended for the beginning philosophy student and the general reader. Chapter 2 is a brief biography of MacIntyre’s life with an emphasis on his intellectual influences; Chapter 3 focuses on MacIntyre’s theological work, particularly MacIntyre’s early comparisons of Christianity and Marxism.
Central Michigan University
Last updated: December 31, 2005 | Originally published: December/31/2005
Categories: Political Philosophy