Pacifism is the theory that peaceful rather than violent or belligerent relations should govern human intercourse and that arbitration, surrender, or migration should be used to resolve disputes. Pacifism is as much an element of Western thinking as is the notion of Just War Theory, the argument that the state may legitimately or morally bear arms. While most people accept the necessity of war, conscientious objectors (or martyrs in much of European history) have often been accorded a special recognition for their moral bravery in refusing to take up arms.
The philosophical study of pacifism requires examining a variety of aspects of the broad proposal, as well as an investigation as to its consequences. Pacifism relates to war as well as to domestic injustices and repressive policies. It can be studied in terms of its coherence as a deontological, or intrinsic, value as well as in terms of the beneficial effects it seeks. Examination of the broad theory draws our attention to a vast range of possible ethical meanings and issues that the committed pacifist or critic must consider. The doctrine of absolute pacifism is first dealt with, before turning to an examination of the more flexible doctrines of pacifism and conditional pacifism.
The best place to begin an analysis of pacifism is with the absolutist argument that all forms of violence, war, and/or killing are unconditionally wrong. The proposed ideal is that social intercourse should be completely non-violent and peaceful, and conflicts which may arise should be dealt with through arbitration and compromise rather than with recourse to violent means. Absolutist pacifism asserts that peace is intrinsically a good to be upheld either as a duty or on the consequentialist grounds that it is more conducive to human welfare than any use of violence or force.
The ethical evaluation of these two positions, the deontological and the consequentialist, provides the traditional framework in which ethicists examine pacifism. But what becomes an immediate concern is the kind of pacifism that is intended. Pacifism for many means an anti-war stance, but pacifism can also be construed as a broader theory incorporating doctrines of non-violence, passive resistance, and moral purity. Although the emphasis on pacifism as an anti-war doctrine is the focus of this article, the other nuances of the theory need to be noted.
The first issue to deal with is that while pacifism emphasizes the role that peace should play, there are three general aspects derived from the nature of peaceful relations. First, there is the absolute prohibition of war; second, the absolute prohibition of violence (or force); and third, the absolute prohibition of killing. The three areas of ethical investigation certainly overlap, and most pacifists hold an ethic of non-violence, which underpins both their disdain of killing and of war. Others, however, deny any moral validity to war but accept the use of force or violence (and even killing) under criteria established by the rule of law; some seek a purely non-violent way of life, where as other pacifists are solely nuclear pacifists in that they accept the use of conventional war but not nuclear war.
Before moving onto an ethical analysis of pacifism, the concepts of killing, violence, force, and innocents are reviewed.
Morally, the topic of killing is intricate and complex, deserving a separate consideration, however, for the purposes of examining the various possible readings of pacifism, it can be generally asserted that pacifists cannot condone killing. Their beliefs emphasize the sanctity of human life, according it a special moral status that necessitates strong justifications for the injuring, harming, restraining, or killing of another. Absolute pacifists deny that there can be any justification for killing. The Mosaic command, thou shalt not kill resounds throughout much Western culture and philosophy and is the starting point for absolutist prohibitions on the killing of people in the Western philosophical tradition.
Ethically, the problem of killing divides between passive and active killing as well as intentional, unintentional, and foreseeable variations. The pacifist needs to relate his general moral outlook to these particular areas. For example, would the pacifist prohibit all forms of killing, including mercy killings and killings in self-defense? Is it any form of killing that the pacifist prohibits, or only those of innocents lives, or those in foreign territories? Or does the pacifist draw a distinction between killing and murder, with the implication that killing could be morally acceptable (e.g., abortion, euthanasia, capital punishment), whereas the intentional killing of an innocent be absolutely immoral? Even so, a pacifist could consistently claim that he would prefer to die rather than raise his fist to protect himself. Kahlil Gibran argues: “If my survival caused another to perish, then death would be sweeter and more beloved.” (The Voice of the Poet). In such ethics, the evil of killing in self-defense outweighs the moral value of the victim s own life and the moral purity of the pacifist is to be upheld as the governing ethic. But self-immolation and especially sacrifice are ultimately illogical, for if all were to sacrifice themselves in the quest for moral purity, none would be left to continue the human race. However, the pursuit of purity can also be criticized for being other-worldly, unrealistic, and utopian, and in turn purification policies have also often become crusades against sinners and heretics (cf. Barrington Moore s Moral Purity and Persecution in History), which even the Buddhist religion is not averse to accepting. The pacifist who seeks, regardless of the actions of others, moral purity often requires subsidizing or free rides on the moral impurity of others. The pacifist may reply that it is the duty of only a select élite to be morally pure (a priestly class) or that only a select élite are capable of such purity and that they must so act to become semi-divine agents on earth. The reply is cogent, however it admits a moral division in humanity, namely that some are morally better than others and that others live to serve the priests, an argument that moral egalitarians (“each to count for one and no more than one” Bentham) would reject.
While a few pacifists (especially in the religious vein) may accept the absolute ideal of peace, most have to justify their enjoyment of peace at the expense of others who actively defend the lives of their fellow citizens as well as those of the pacifists. The dilemma is captured well in a quotation from Clifford Simmons in Paskins and Dockrill s Ethics of War.
“I could not stand aside from the experiences of others…I still believed that the position of the pacifist was ultimately right but I was beginning to realize that, at the same time, I could not stand aside from the struggle which was engulfing my contemporaries.” (p.182)
There are two solutions for the pacifist at this junction. Firstly, to prohibit any form of self-preservation that requires harming another, even if he is an aggressor, in the belief that one s life is less morally valuable than one s pure death. The criticism is that this rewards aggression, for “evil will always flourish when good men do nothing” (Edmund Burke), to which the pacifist may reply that the rewards for moral purity are not to be found in this life but in the after-life, a reply that is not attractive to those who do not believe in life after death. The second solution is to divide humanity into those who may seek and attain moral purity and those who cannot or should not. This avoids any need to resort to postmortem tales of heavenly rewards, but then raises a host of political and ethical questions as to the membership of the pure élite.
The next philosophical problem that pacifism has to deal with is what is meant by violence. The adjective violent applies to many situations that the nominal pacifist would not necessarily oppose, from its uses to describe agitated or passionate behavior to morally legitimately violent actions against the self or another person. For example, the martial and pugnacious sports involve a violence that the pacifist could accept, although many would decry such institutions as being part of the culture of violence that pervades aggressive nations (and hence are deemed potential causal factors in war) and which ought to be banned or severely limited. Yet the violence meted out on, say a person s body in surgery is not something that most pacifists would accept deserving abolition.
Pacifists may also accept that a violent passion or argument is not something that should be prohibited or morally censured, although there are thinkers here, say, in the Chinese Confucian philosophy that aspire to the calmer control of the mind/spirit over the emotions, and any violent reaction (hysterical laughter, grief, etc.) or reversion to a violent manner disrupts the inner calm a man should seek, which in turn forms the basis of a peaceful community. Similarly, those who claim that reason is man s most important faculty, and that it can and should rule the body and its conflicting emotions, assert that violent behavior or action against another is inimical to the life of a rational being and should be avoided absolutely.
Connected to issues of violence is the use of force against another person which a pacifist must consider. The use of force (again a complex area of study in itself) can take many forms including legal restraint as well as bodily restraint. Effectively both seek to confine the movement of the individual and pacifists may or may not reject the use of force in civil society. The use of force need not be violent, or do physical damage, but does imply some infringement on the free activity of an agent. The philosophical discussion revolves around the justification of that infringement, whether, for example, it can be legitimate or justifiable in any situation. Some, on the anarchist wing, can claim that any use of force is an abrogation of morality, whereas most pacifists accept the need to restrain dangerous individuals from harming others. A question that may be put to such thinkers is why should there be a distinction between protecting people from dangerous civilians and protecting from dangerous nations. In other words, the pacifist has to consider the moral nature of political sovereignty and, if necessary, justify the reason why the use of force is permitted domestically but not internationally for similar issues.
Generally, those that oppose the use of force or violence in society deplore the use of physical means to intervene in another person s behavior, although some are willing to expand the concept of force or violence to include emotional abuse, cultural prejudices, mental games that is, forms of psychological warfare and propaganda designed to undermine the dignity of the individual.
Who is the target of any war, violence, force, or restraint also has to be considered by the pacifist. Few would admit that a dangerous person should not be restrained in some form or other, and most pacifists would accept injuring or even killing a dangerous criminal if the circumstances admit it, although the argument for retaining a moral purity can be deployed here, leaving the pacifist to justify permitting aggression to flourish.
In this case, the pacifist has to evaluate the moral nature of the particular threat against duties towards others and their right to peace. Deontological pacifists, those who assert that peaceful interaction is a duty to be supported, must weigh their pacifism against the violation of that peace by criminals or dangerous persons. Some pacifists here resort to defining innocents as people deserving their dignity and peace and whose lives ought to be protected against violent offenders. Violence and the use of force by domestic authorities may be thus permitted by pacifists, who reject war or interventions across borders, but they would emphasize that any infringement should be reasonable and be legitimate and should avoid any unnecessary violence. Once an interventionist war is morally permitted the pacifist becomes at least pacificist (see below).
The most intricate difficulty facing the general pacifist is the link between personal pacifism and international pacifism, which is not very clear-cut in most writings. Some pacifists, as we have seen, may admit the use of internal aggression to sustain law and order but be set against the use of aggression for resolving international disputes. Unlike domestic issues, they can argue, international affairs is subject to no overriding supreme authority that can be turned to for conflict resolution, and here the pacifist would argue that war should never be employed as a means for resolving disputes between morally or politically equal corporate entities. However, the question can be raised as to why the use of force is morally legitimate within a nation s borders (to restrain criminals) but not so beyond them (to restrain international criminals), especially if the case involves halting the illegitimate use of aggression by one party against innocents.
As noted above, pacifist ethics can be described from two main viewpoints. Firstly, the deontological position which decrees that moral agents have an absolute duty to avoid aggressing or waging war against others. Secondly, the consequentialist position which asserts that no good ever comes from aggressive actions or war and it is thereby prohibited, not because it is an evil in itself, but because it always leads to a worse off position for the majority. This section investigates firstly the absolutist doctrine, then conditional pacifism from both perspectives.
Held as a duty, it is incumbent on the pacifist never to aggress, use force, or support or engage in war against another. Duties are moral actions that are required or demanded in all pertinent circumstances.
The first problem for deontological pacifism is the potential collision of duties. What if force is to be used to halt an aggressor who endangers the pacifist s life, or the life of an innocent? Regarding the pacifist s own life, it can be argued that he or she possesses no right of self-defense (and must “turn the other cheek”), although this is typically the position of those who place not much value on living this life in favor of living a life in the realms beyond. Among such adherents are religious pacifists. Another example: does the duty to respect others outweigh the duty to respect oneself? The aggressor obviously transcends any duty of respect he should have towards his victim but does that warrant the forfeiture of his life? Those pacifists who admit the right to defend the self against a threat can admit the use of restraining or disabling force and even, if the threat is deadly, the right to kill an assailant. Deontological pacifists can claim that others rights to life are of a higher order duty than the duty to intervene to save oneself. But that hinges upon a moral evaluation of the self compared to others, and it is not clear why others should accord a higher moral evaluation: for after all the self is in turn one amongst many others from a different subject s point of view.
If the pacifist argues that his life is his own to lay down in the face of aggression (as a moral principle, as a moral example, as an example of martyrdom, etc), the problem intensifies when the life of another is threatened, whom the pacifist is in a position to assist, and who, as a living subject, may prefer life over death.
The pacifist who claims that he has no duty to intervene in saving others affairs treads a precarious moral path here; the immediate retort is why should the moral life of the pacifist be morally more important than the life of the threatened innocent? For the sake of his own beliefs, could the pacifist consistently ignore the violence meted upon others? Yes, from two possible perspectives. The first is that the ideal of pacifism retains a supremacy over all other ideals and is not to be compromised. The second is that the life of the pacifist is morally superior to the life of the threatened innocent, even if that innocent happens to be a fellow absolute pacifist.
Deontologists argue that certain kinds of moral actions are good in themselves, hence deontological pacifists claim peace to be a duty to be categorically upheld; however, other moralists argue for pacifism on the basis of its beneficial consequences rather than any intrinsic notion of the good these are consequentialist pacifists.
Pacifism can be supported by moral consequentialists who assert that the evils procured by violence, force, or war, far outweigh any of the good that may arise. For example, rule utilitarians claim that if certain inimical consequences flow from particular actions, a blanket prohibition on such actions is morally required, which, in terms of the implications of the argument brings them close to the deontological position of an absolute prohibition of war, etc.
Rule utilitarianism holds that a behavioral code or rule is morally right if the consequences of adopting that rule are more favorable than unfavorable to everyone. Accordingly, rule utilitarian pacifists claim that the avoidance of war (or violence, or force) should be a moral rule since its abrogation would be less beneficial to all. For example, if, on balance, all hitherto wars are perceived as producing effects that none would have wanted prior to the war, then a rule against war should be adopted. The rule outlaws war in the particular and in general, even if a particular war could produce better consequences it should not be accepted on the grounds that it violates a moral rule, and that moral rule claims more favorable consequences for entire world if war is absolutely prohibited.
However, absolute consequentialist principles are exceedingly difficult to sustain, for they are firstly based on a particular reading of history a reading that can emphasize ruinous results over any good that may ultimately have arisen. They are empirical judgements on the past and as such open to not only historical critique but also the logical argument that what was true yesterday may not be true tomorrow (or at least cannot be proven to be so). That is, while past wars were wholly detrimental to the human race as a whole, tomorrow s wars, because of new technology or strategy, or even a new ethic, may not be. Accordingly, the moral rule may in principle change and therefore cannot be held absolutely.
It is possible, for example, to consider that the Second World War (and all the untoward deaths and destruction that it brought) ultimately promoted the greater good of a peaceful Europe and enhanced international co-operation. It is difficult to empirically sustain that nothing good ever came from war , for critics can always point to something good whose value may be suitably expanded to provide an argument; in which case the argument becomes a comparison of goods and their respective moral weightings (20 million deaths versus fifty plus years of European peace for hundreds of millions).
In summary, the absolute pacifist of both ethical persuasions prohibits war regardless of particular circumstances. As a doctrine, the onus in on justifying the pacifist principle against arguments for aggression and war. What, it may be asked, should be the appropriate response to a person who believes that violence is a morally appropriate method to gain values? The absolute pacifist thus has to justify not retaliating or defending himself or others (innocents or not) in the face of aggression. Often the recourse is to non-earthly values such as the Kingdom of Heaven, i.e., death is morally superior to violent resistance, deterrence, or aggression, or to a moral division between peoples, between the superior pacifists and the impure aggressors.
Against the doctrinal absolute prohibition of the use of violence or war, conditional pacifism admits its use under certain circumstances. Again, the analysis can begin with an examination of deontological or consequentialist positions
Conditional pacifism from the deontological perspective admits that the enactment of duties cannot be considered in isolation, for they may overlap and hence require a conditional acceptance or a moral weighing. For the conditional pacifist, the duty to uphold peace and non-violence may conflict with the duty to save or defend lives against aggression, if the latter duty is accepted. Therefore, in cases of what Walzer calls supreme emergencies (Just and Unjust Wars), the duty to peace may be trumped by alternative ethical requirements.
To take an example from political theory that is an appropriate area of discussion here: a common defense of the use of violence or war is that it is a justifiable or legitimate procedure to defend rights, and rights theories are often supported from a conditional deontological position. The pacifist counters that the argument to violate rights to protect rights is incoherent, for the use of force inherently violates the rights it is supposed to defend or protect. The alleged paradox is resolved, it can be argued, by asserting that rights are things to be upheld and defended, firstly as negative claims requiring an absence of violation, and secondly as positive claims that require freedom to pursue goals. An aggressor violates both elements. A right cannot be a value unless it is defensible, but it does not mean that the rights of aggressors are infringed in defending one s rights, for, as Lockean theorists argue, aggressors lose rights in attacking others. Pacifists can disagree with this and argue that if rights theory is to be coherent, rights ought to be inviolable and inalienable. Hence if they are contingently held they cannot be deemed inviolable rights but conditional privileges , which may accordingly be removed if someone abuses their own rights entitlements by violating those of others.
For the consequentialist, all moral guides are conditional on the circumstances and protracted outcomes of an action. In the case of conditional pacifism, a utilitarian ascribes to act utilitarianism in which each particular act, war, battle, etc., is examined from the moral perspective of what outcome is likely to produce more favorable results. Accordingly, whilst the pacifist may claim that wars generally do not produce more favorable results, in specific examples they can be acceptable. Such examples may include wars of self-defense, or wars of intervention to protect a people from genocidal campaigns. But the further removed the pacifist gets from the peaceful ideal, the more he or she moves into the just war realm, or the theory called pacificism .
Pacificism, defined by Martin Caedel (Thinking about War and Peace, 1987), is a useful term to describe those who prefer peaceful conditions to war but who accept that some wars may be necessary if they advance the cause of peace. In a sense this is a further step away from conditional pacifism which rules out war or the use of force except in very exceptional circumstances. In this case, the political achievements that have generated peace may be defended militarily if necessary for the overriding goal of global peace.
Following Richard Norman (Ethics, Killing, and War, 1995), pacificism falls between pacifism and defencism, where defencism is the theory that accepts all defensive wars and acts of deterrence as just (but which rules out aggressive wars). It implies an interesting justification of war for peace s sake that is not essential to defencism but which also steps beyond the sometimes non-worldly or unrealistic vision of pacifism. Pacificism can reject a defensive war if it undermines the overall concord that may be latent in the international (or national in the case of civil war) situation. This reaches into some intriguing territory, for its remit is vague but also flexible.
On the vague side, pacificism falls back onto similar problems that general consequentialism faces, namely the inability to propose a rule or guiding principle that is not affected by either new events or alternative interpretations of the same event. This, like general consequentialism, provides the theory with flexibility, but where this does become an issue is in the logical extension of the theory to proclaim the war to end all wars as a pacificistic ideal, which logically it does entail.
A defensive war, justified on the traditional grounds of just war theory, may be rejected as causing greater overall international instability, but on the other hand it does not thoroughly rule out an aggressive war of intervention or of imperialism to impose peace, although most pacificists would say that it does, on the grounds that all aggressive wars should be ruled out. But why? If two neighboring nations are about to wage a war that will create greater global instability and the chance is there to contain the momentum with an aggressive policing action, then so long as peace is the ultimate goal, the means become morally acceptable.
Pacificism can be acceptable to many shades of opinion. Very few thinkers assert that war should be waged for its own sake, which poses logical problems of its own for often war is to be waged for glory or for valor or for land or for values. But most thinkers will argue that peace is the most favorable condition for man within which to reside: peace enables enterprise, families, and life in general to flourish. Accordingly, such thinkers will accept that to secure peaceful conditions, war may have to be waged, but that it can only be waged for the sake of peace. We read this in Plato, Aristotle, and the host of philosophers and jurists that they influenced. But if peace is the overriding goal, the means to secure peace can really include anything.
For example, one of the longest recorded reigns of human peace lasted in Egypt between 5000 and 2000 BC, partly as a result of geographical isolation and partly as a result of the strict and unchanging social system that prevailed; the imposition of central control may enforce a long term peace, but it is not a means that all may be willing to accept. A strong central state, as Plato argues for in The Republic, could impose peace by permitting no change or allowing any conditions conducive to change. But, arguably, such an environment leads to the stultification of the mind, and if the individual mind is not free to challenge the present order, to disrupt or create, then society is not in a position to adapt, which ultimately does not augur well for any society once change comes from outsiders or changes in the environment for example.
Imperialism often imposes an international peace that few today would accept, but if peace is secured why should the nature of the political institution be rejected if it works? The Romans provided the pax romana and the British attempted a similar pax britannica, that secured peace amongst hitherto belligerent and restless tribes. Most present thinkers reject imperialism yet some such as Michael Ignatieff do wonder whether its benefits may outweigh the costs (The Warrior s Honor). Empirically, it can be claimed that imperialism is globally more stable and peaceful than tribalism and its larger brother, nationalism, both of which have generated a great portion of the world s wars.
On the other hand, a federation of states, as considered by the Abbé Saint-Pierre in his Perpetual Peace and Immanuel Kant in his more famous work of the same name, proposes that while peace is the ultimate end to be secured, a federation of equal states is the appropriate political vehicle.
Kant argues that peoples will be drawn closer together through commercial ties and nature will prompt them to follow the dictates of reason that encourage the more beneficial peaceful enterprises over mutual animosity. Kant suggests that the process towards perpetual peace the pacifistic goal is inevitable, given the manner in which people deal with one another. Yet the optimism of the Age of Enlightenment was soon demolished by counter-acting principles of thought and politics that emphasized the glories of nationalism, of isolationism, and implicitly or explicitly, the benefits that war can bring.
Peaceful intercourse is easily rejected by those who assert the benefits of the martial values, who claim that a war brings out the best of people and of a society, that wars heighten humanity s perception of itself in the great existentialist quest between life and death, that war relieves the monotony of consumerism and so on.
This highlights one of the most difficult aspects of pacificism, that the goal of peace and of tranquillity may not suffice human nature. The persistent nagging of bellicosity, of adventure, personal and collective glory, whether it derives from something genetic or culturally deeply embedded in most societies, remains an easily revitalized clarion call to war. The culture of peace is often very shallow, taking many generations to produce, and even then can be swiftly eroded with atavistic rhetoric. Often what secures the maintenance of peace are the rule of law and the expansion of commercial ties, as Kant foresaw. But these achievements require, in the case of the rule of law, a determined political acceptance of the law and its impartial application, and in the case of commercial ties, a sphere of individual freedom that permits the growth of mutually beneficial ties that most philosophers who look at the world in terms of what needs to be controlled are unable to accept. The crumbling of the rule of law undermines the potential for any society to exist peacefully, but so too does constant intervention in market processes which connects to the need for the rule of law.
Commercial pacificists, those who see in the expansion of the market order the foundations of future peace, point to the nature of domestic peace as the blueprint for international peace. In the past a war between two English counties was quite an acceptable event (The Wars of the Roses between the houses representing Yorkshire and Lancashire) but today a similar proclamation of war would be absurd. In more recent history, the US was torn in two by the States fighting the Civil War, yet war between them today could not be seriously entertained. What has brought peace to these one-time enemies needs to be understood if peace is to be secured between larger or more independent political units.
The optimism of commercial pacificists is criticized on two grounds. Firstly, it may take a longer time to secure peace than the present generation is willing to permit, and secondly, the beneficial processes of market trading and the rule of law may not be acceptable to the target nation or people. In both cases an imposed order of peace may be preferred on consequentialist reasons, that less harm is done in the long run by enforcing a peace today. However, it can be reasonably countered that the imposition of peace on cultures not prepared to shed centuries of belligerence will not secure peace in the long run; various thinkers here, most notably John Stuart Mill, argue that societies must find their own ways to peace (freedom, self-determination) otherwise they will not appreciate them.
The article has provided a very general overview of some of the forms pacifism can take, as well as some of the issues it invokes. The area is philosophically broad and intricate, which the expanse of relevant literature reflects. The ethical positions described in the essay divide between deontological and consequentialist positions, but virtue theory is also highly applicable: what kind of person are you if you wield force or if you do turn the other cheek? Is a peaceful life more or less virtuous compared to a life of violence, and on what grounds? I have touched on the religious moral dimension of pacifism, which typically holds that secular life is of a lower value than the protracted life after death, but justice cannot be done to the variety of theological systems and nuances that produce such an ethic. Justifying pacifism from purely secular premises is a much harder task for any thinker who cannot have recourse to rewards in heaven and it is a challenge that is worth exploring for its own sake by any philosopher interested in war or peace.
Last updated: April 19, 2005 | Originally published: