These establishments were used for training youths in boxing and wrestling and were also frequented by Socrates and other philosophers. This article contains a discussion of the locations of the palaestrae (wrestling schools) that are known to have existed in Athens, and the the function of these establishments.
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Palaestrae were an integral part of larger gymnasia (areas for general physical training and athletics) and are attested for the three well-known gymnasia areas of Athens (the Academy [Hyperides,Demosthenes, fr. 6], Cynosarges [Diogenes Laertius, 6.30.8 and Aelian, True History 8.14.3], and Lyceum [Pseudo-Plutarch, Lives of the Orators 841d and 843f]). These schools for training in combat sports also existed separately from gymnasia in the city of Athens itself and in the countryside.
As a result of the difficulty of archaeological exploration amidst the urban sprawl of modern Athens, even the general locations of most of the palaestrae outside the major gymnasia areas of Archaic and Classical Athens and Attica are not known with certainty. Only two urban Athenian palaestrae may be roughly located: the palaistra of Taureas and the palaistra where Mikkos was a sophist. The palaistra of Taureas is said by Plato ( Charmides 153a, Lucian, Parasite 43) to have been opposite the sanctuary of Basile. Neither the sanctuary nor the palaistra may be located with any certainty, however, despite Travlos’ confident statement that a boundary stone marking an unnamed sanctuary near the corner of modern Syngrou Blvd. and Hatzichristou St. refers to the sanctuary of Basile (Travlos, PDA 332 and fig. 435). The palaistra where Mikkos taught is said by Plato to have been near the Panops fountain, which has been placed in the neighborhood of the Diochares Gates in Northeast Athens (Ritchie, “Lyceum” 253-254 and Travlos, PDA 159-160).
There were palaestrae in the Attic countryside as well. For example, the sanctuary of Artemis at Brauron had both a gymnasium and a palaestra (SEG XL 91). Kephissia possessed a palaistra ( SEG XXXII 147) and it is likely that many of the other demes, especially large ones like Acharnae and Aphidna, had their own as well. There is also the case of the so-called “Palaestra of Cercyon,” a palaestra belonging to a mythical person, but associated with an actual place along the Eleusis-Megara road (Bacchylides 18.26, Scholia of Arethas on Lucian 21.21). The travel writer Pausanias (1.39.3) himself visited the site.
Other palaestrae mentioned by the ancient sources include the place where Ariston of Argos trained Plato as a youth (Apuleius, On Plato 1.2 and Suda, s.v. Platon), the palaestra of Hippocrates (Pseudo-Plutarch, Lives of the Orators 837e) where Isocrates died in 337 BC, and the palaestra of Sibyrtios (Plutarch, Alcibiades 3) where a follower of Alcibiades was killed. For the other palaestrae mentioned by the ancient sources there is no indication of place or even number (Kratinos, fr. 176, Lysias, fr. 6.1Teisis, Theophrastus, Characters 7.5, Aelian Varia Historia 4.24.2, Pollux, Onomastica 2.13); some of these unnamed palaestrae may refer to the same structures or they may be independent facilities.
The palaestrae in the Academy, Brauron, Cynosarges, and Lyceum would have come under the superintendence of the cult officials who oversaw the larger gymnasia areas. Other palaestrae appear to have been overseen and regulated by public officials, such as the paidotribes or epistates (Aeschines,Against Timarchus 10). The only firm evidence for the private ownership of a palaestra comes from Theophrastus, who appears in this instance to be describing in extreme and unflattering terms a small, poorly constructed home palaestra (Theophrastus, Characters 21.15-16).
The very name palaestra derives from the verb palaiein, meaning “to wrestle.” Palaestrae had three basic functions: (1) as training areas for combat sports such as wrestling and boxing, (2) as areas for cult activity, and (3) as meeting places for discussion, philosophical and otherwise. Plato’s depiction of Socrates engaging in philosophical discourse provides a most vivid picture of life in the Classical Athenian palaestrae. For example, in Plato’s Lysis, it is a palaistra into which Socrates is drawn for a discussion of Eros (Sexual Love) and Philia (Friendship). Within the palaestra, boys play at games with knucklebones and engage in the more serious business of sacrificing to Hermes (Plato, Lysis 206c, Scholia of Arethas on Plato Lysis 206c, Proklos On Plato’s Alcibiades 1.195.4). Older men sit on the edges of the enclosure discussing the physical and moral merits of the young men. In P lato’s Charmides a similar scene is painted. In this dialogue Socrates returns from battle at Potidaea to the palaestra of Taureas, which is described as one of his regular haunts, and engages Critias and his young cousin Charmides in a discussion of sophrosyne or “temperance.”
Plato’s choice of the palaestra as a setting for two Socratic dialogues is no accident. Wrestling metaphors recur throughout the Platonic dialogues. For example, in the Phaedrus the conquest of the baser part of the soul by the virtuous part is compared with a wrestling victory in the Olympic games (256b, also compare Protagoras 350e). In part, this use of wrestling metaphors may be an autobiographical touch on the part of Plato, as later tradition tells us that he himself was successful as a young wrestler at the Nemean games (Suda, s.v. Platon). However, the placement of Socrates, a philosopher of the most active sort, amidst those training to fight is most apt. After all, Socrates always sought intellectual contests, not so much for the winning, he would say, but for gaining insight into the truth.
Both as a locale for philosophical discussion and teaching and as a metaphor for a struggle for the truth, palaestrae would continue to be used by philosophers throughout antiquity and become a common leitmotif in the writings of the Church Fathers of Late Antiquity and the Early Middle Ages.
Grand Valley State University
Last updated: April 18, 2005 | Originally published: