Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

William Paley (1743—1805)

paleyEnglish theologian; born at Peterborough (37 miles northeast of Northampton) July, 1743; died at Lincoln May 25, 1805. His mother was a keen, thrifty woman of much intelligence, and his father was a minor canon at Peterborough and a pedagogue. In 1758 Paley entered, as sizar, Christ College, Cambridge. He had been a fair scholar at his father’s school, especially interested in mathematics. After taking his degree in 1763, he became usher at an academy in Greenwich and, in 1766, was elected fellow of Christ College, where he became an intimate friend of John Law and lectured successfully on metaphysics, morals, and the Greek Testament. He offered lectures on Locke, Clark’s Attributes, and Butler’s Analogy; and in his lectures on divinity took the ground maintained in his Moral Philosophy that the Thirty- nine Articles were merely articles of peace, inasmuch as they contained about 240 distinct propositions, many of them inconsistent with each other. He had been ordained a priest in 1767, and was appointed to the rectory of Musgrave in Cumberland, which be resigned in 1776, to take the vicarage of the two parishes, Appleby and Dalston. In 1780, he was installed prebendary at Carlisle, and resigned Appleby on becoming archdeacon in 1782. At the close of 1785, he became chancellor of the diocese and (1789-92) figured as an active opponent of the slave-trade. Presented to the vicarage of Aldingham in 1792, he vacated Dalston for Stanwix in 1793. In recognition of his apologetic writings, he was given the prebend of St. Pancras in St. Paul’s Cathedral; the subdeanery of Lincoln, in 1795; and the rectory of Bishop Warmouth in 1795; and transferred his residence to Lincoln shortly before his death.

Paley excelled as a writer of textbooks. He is an unrivaled expositor of plain arguments, but without much originality. His moral system, in which he is said to have anticipated Bentham, is the best statement of the utilitarianism of the eighteenth century. In theology and philosophy his common-sense method, which showed his limitations of intellect, by ignoring commonly perceived difficulties and by easily accepting conclusions, has been discarded. In the former he seems to have followed a liberal construction of orthodox views, sincerely convinced that his doctrines could be logically proved by rationalistic argument. His alleged plagiarism, even as to the classical illustration of the universe by a watch, must be understood in the light of his purpose in compiling text-books. Upon being urged by Law to expand his lectures he published The Moral and Political Philosophy (London, 1786). His most original work was Horce Paulince; or the Truth of the Scripture History of St. Paul evinced, by a Comparison of the Epistles which bear his name with the Acts of the Apostles and with one another (London, 1790; subsequent editions are by J. Tate, 1840; T. R. Birks, 1850; J. S. Howson, 1877; German ed. with annotations, H. P. C. Henke, Helmstadt, 1797). His prominent apologetic works are, A View of the Evidences of Christianity (London, 1794) and Natural History: or, Evidences of the Existence and Attributes of the Deity, Collected from the Appearances of Nature (1802): the first a compendium of the arguments against the eighteenth-century deists, and the second a clear account of the a posteriori argument from the facts of early Christianity. The Natural Theology, used for many years as a foremost text-book classic, has been superseded on account of the shifting of ground from the mechanical objective to the immanent subjective theory of the universe. Paley advances the teleological argument from design for the existence of God, an argument founded on the unity and adaptability of created things. This argument was based on rationalistic grounds; yet did not ultimately prove conclusive to rationalists themselves, and has not been able to survive criticism. His analogical method has run its course; the idea of a complex, perfected organism dropping suddenly amidst foreign surroundings, as illustrated by the finding of a watch, was the dogmatic externalism the rebound from which gave birth to the subsequent hypotheses of natural selection and adaptation to environment and the theory of evolution as a whole. In the Evidences, Paley proceeds along historical lines to affirm the truth of Christianity by two propositions; namely, that “there is clear proof that the apostles and their successors underwent the greatest hardships rather than give up the Gospel and cease to obey its precepts” and that “other miracles than those of the Gospel are not satisfactorily attested.” To these he appends “auxiliary” arguments drawn from the “morality of the Gospel,” “originality of Christ’s character,” and others. The argument is one- sided on account of its disregard of the field of Christian consciousness.

Paley also published Reasons for Contentment; addressed to the Laboring Part of the British Public (1793). Individual sermons which may be mentioned are: Dangers Incidental to the Clerical Character (1795); Assize Sermon at Durham (1795); as well as the compilations Sermons on Several Subjects and Sermons and Tracts (1808). The first collected edition of the works of William Paley appeared in 1805-08; one by A. Chalmers with biography (5 vols., London, 1819); one by E. Lynam (1825); and one by his son, E. Paley (1825).

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Last updated: April 19, 2005 | Originally published: