The Liar Paradox or Liar Antinomy is an argument that arrives at a contradiction by reasoning about a Liar Sentence. The Classical Liar Sentence is the self-referential sentence, “This sentence is false,” which leads to the same difficulties as the sentence, “I am lying.”
Experts in the field of philosophical logic have never agreed on the way out of the trouble despite 2,300 years of attention. Here is the trouble—a sketch of the Liar Argument that reveals the contradiction:
Let L be the Classical Liar Sentence. If L is true, then L is false. But we can also establish the converse, as follows. Assume L is false. Because the Liar Sentence is just the sentence that ‘says’ L is false, the Liar Sentence is therefore true, so L is true. We have now shown that L is true if, and only if, it is false. Since L must be one or the other, it is both.
That contradictory result apparently throws us into the lion’s den of semantic incoherence. The incoherence is due to the fact that according to the rules of classical logic anything follows from a contradiction, even “1 + 1 = 3.” This article explores the details and implications of the principal ways out of the Paradox.
Most people, when first encountering the Liar Paradox, react in one of two ways. One reaction is to not take the Paradox seriously and say they won’t reason any more about it. The second and more popular reaction is to say the Liar Sentence must be meaningless. Both of these reactions are a way out of the Paradox. That is, they stop the argument of the Paradox. However, the first reaction provides no useful diagnosis of the problem that was caused in the first place. The second is not an adequate solution if it can answer the question, “Why is the Liar Sentence meaningless?” only with the ad hoc remark, “Otherwise we get a paradox.” An adequate solution should offer a more systematic treatment. For example, the self-referential English sentence, “This sentence is not in Italian,” is very similar to the Liar Sentence. Is it meaningless, too? Apparently not. So, what about the Liar Sentence makes it be meaningless while similar sentences such as “This sentence is not in Italian,” are not meaningless? Are conjunctions with the Liar Sentence meaningless? The questions continue, and an adequate solution should address them systematically.
Table of Contents
- History of the Paradox
- Overview of Ways Out of the Paradox
- The Main Ways Out
- References and Further Reading
Languages are expected to contain contradictions but not paradoxes. The sentence, “Snow is white, and snow is not white,” is just one more false sentence that can be expressed in the English language. But languages are not expected to contain paradoxes. A paradox is an apparently convincing argument leading to the conclusion that one of the language’s contradictions is true. One’s immediate and appropriate reaction to any paradox is to look for some unacceptable assumption made in the apparently convincing argument or else to find a faulty step in the reasoning. Only very reluctantly would one want to learn to live with the contradiction being true, or ignore the contradiction altogether.
The Liar Paradox has been discussed continually in philosophy since the middle of the 4th century B.C.E. The most ancient attribution is to Eubulides of Miletus who included it among a list of seven puzzles. He said, “A man says that he is lying. Is what he says true or false?” Eubulides’ commentary on his puzzle has not been found. An ancient gravestone on the Greek Island of Kos was reported by Athenaeus to contain this poem about the difficulty of solving the Paradox:
O Stranger: Philetas of Kos am I,
‘Twas the Liar who made me die,
And the bad nights caused thereby.
Theophrastus, Aristotle’s successor, wrote three papyrus rolls about the Liar Paradox, and the Stoic philosopher Chrysippus wrote six, but their contents are lost in the sands of time. Despite various comments on how to solve the Paradox, no Greek suggested that Greek itself was inconsistent; it was the reasoning within Greek that was considered to be inconsistent.
In the Late Medieval period in Europe, the French philosopher Jean Buridan put the Liar Paradox to devious use with the following proof of the existence of God. It uses the pair of sentences:
None of the sentences in this pair is true.
The only consistent way to assign truth values, that is, to have these two sentence be either true or false, requires making “God exists” be true. So, in this way, Buridan has “proved” that God does exist.
There are many other versions of the Paradox. Some liar paradoxes begin with a chain of sentences, no one of which is self-referential, although the chain as a whole is self-referential or circular:
The following sentence is true.
The following sentence is true.
The following sentence is true.
The first sentence in this list is false.
There are also Contingent Liars which may or may not lead to a paradox depending on what happens in the world beyond the sentence. For example:
It’s raining and this sentence is false.
If it’s sunny, then this sentence is false. But if it’s raining, then we have the beginning of a paradox.
The Strengthened Liar Paradox begins with the Strengthened Liar Sentence
This sentence is not true.
This version is called “Strengthened” because some promising solutions to the Classical Liar Paradox beginning with (L) fail when faced with the Strengthened Liar. So, finding one’s way out of the Strengthened Liar Paradox is the acid test of a successful solution.
Here is an example of the failure just mentioned. Consider the Strengthened Liar in the context of trying to solve the Liar Paradox by declaring that the Liar Sentence cannot be used to make a claim. It is neither true nor false. That will stop the argument of the Liar Paradox. But suppose this attempted solution is unsystematic and implies nothing about our various semantic principles and so implies nothing about the Strengthened Liar Sentence. Therefore, we could use that Strengthened Liar Sentence to create a new paradox by asking for its truth value, and we soon arrive at a contradiction. That is why we want any solution which says the Classical Liar Sentence has no truth value to be systematic enough that it can be applied to the Strengthened Liar Sentence and show that it, too, has no truth value. That way, we do not solve the Classical Liar only to be ensnared by the Strengthened Liar.
To put the Liar Paradox in perspective, it is essential to appreciate why such an apparently trivial problem is a deep problem. Solving the Liar Paradox is part of the larger project of understanding truth. Understanding truth involves finding a theory of truth or a definition of truth or a proper analysis of the concept of truth; researchers do not carefully distinguish these projects from each other.
Aristotle offered what many philosophers consider to be a correct proposal. Stripped of his overtones suggesting a correspondence theory of truth, Aristotle proposed (in Metaphysics 1011 b26) what is now called a precursor to Alfred Tarski’s Convention T:
(T) A sentence is true if, and only if, what it says is so.
Here we need to take some care with the use-mention distinction. If pairs of quotation marks serve to name or mention a sentence, then the above is requiring that the sentence “It is snowing” be true just in case it is snowing. Similarly, if the sentence about snow were named not with quotation marks but with the numeral 88 inside a pair of parentheses, then (88) would be true just in case it is snowing. What could be less controversial about the nature of truth? Unfortunately, this is neither obviously correct nor trivial; and the resolution of the difficulty is still an open problem in philosophical logic. Why is that? The brief answer is that (T) can be used to produce the Liar Paradox. The longer answer refers to Tarski’s Undefinability Theorem of 1936.
This article began with a mere sketch of the Liar Argument using sentence (L). To appreciate the central role of (T) in the argument, we need to examine more than just a sketch of the argument. Alfred Tarski proposed a more formal characterization of (T), which is called schema T or Convention T:
(T) X is true if, and only if, p,
where “p” is a variable for a grammatical sentence and “X” is a name for that sentence. Tarski was the first person to claim that any theory of truth that could not entail all sentences of this schema would fail to be an adequate theory of truth. If we want a theory of truth for English, and we want to state the theory using English, then the theory must entail the T-sentence:
“Snow is white” is true if, and only if, snow is white.
If we use English to state a theory of truth for German, then the theory should, among other things, at least entail the T-sentence:
“Der Schnee ist weiss” is true in German if, and only if, snow is white.
A great many philosophers believe Tarski is correct when he claims his Convention T is a necessary condition on any successful theory of truth. However, do we want all the T-sentences to be entailed and thus come out true? Probably not the T-sentence for the Liar Sentence. That T-sentence has the logical form T`s´ ↔ s, where s is the Liar Sentence, T is the truth predicate, and s is ~T`s´. Substituting the latter for s on the right of the biconditional yields the contradiction T`s´ ↔ ~T`s´. That is the argument of the Liar Paradox, very briefly.
Tarski added precision to the discussion of the Liar by focusing not on a natural language but on a classical, interpreted, formal language capable of expressing arithmetic. Here the difficulties produced by the Liar Argument became much clearer; and, very surprisingly, he was able to prove that Convention T plus the assumption that the language contains its own concept of truth do lead to semantic incoherence.
The proof requires the following assumptions in addition to Convention T. Here we quote from (Tarski 1944):
I. We have implicitly assumed that the language in which the antinomy is constructed contains, in addition to its expressions, also the names of these expressions, as well as semantic terms such as the term “true” referring to sentences of this language; we have also assumed that all sentences which determine the adequate usage of this term can be asserted in the language. A language with these properties will be called “semantically closed.”
II. We have assumed that in this language the ordinary laws of logic hold.
Tarski pointed out that the crucial, unacceptable assumption is that the language is semantically closed. For there to be a grammatical and meaningful Liar Sentence in the language, there must be a definable notion of “is true” which holds for the true sentences and fails to hold for the other sentences. If there were such a global truth predicate, then the predicate “is a false sentence” would also be definable; and [here is where we need the power of elementary number theory] a Liar Sentence would exist, namely a complex sentence ∃x(Qx & ~Tx), where Q and T are predicates which are satisfied by names of sentences. More specifically, T is the one-place, global truth predicate satisfied by all the names [that is, numerals for the Gödel numbers] of the true sentences, and Q is a one-place predicate that is satisfied only by the name of ∃x(Qx & ~Tx). But if so, then one can eventually deduce a contradiction. This deduction of Tarski’s is a formal analog of the informal argument of the Liar Paradox. The contradictory result tells us that the argument began with a false assumption. According to Tarski, the error that causes the contradiction is the assumption that the global truth predicate can be well-defined. Therefore, Tarski has proved that truth is not definable within a classical formal language—thus the name “Undefinability Theorem.” Tarski’s Theorem establishes that classically interpreted languages capable of expressing arithmetic cannot contain a global truth predicate. So his theorem implies that classical formal languages with the power to express arithmetic cannot be semantically closed.
There is no special difficulty is giving a careful definition of truth for a classical formal language, provided we do it outside the language; and Tarski himself was the first person to do this. In 1933 he created the first formal semantics for quantified predicate logic. Here are two imperfect examples of how he defines truth: Fa is true if, and only if, a is a member of the set of objects that are F. ∀Fx is true if, and only if, all the objects are members of the set of objects that are F. To repeat, a little more precisely but still imperfectly, Tarski’s theory implies that, if we have a simple, formal sentence `Fa´ in our object language, in which `a´ is the name of some object in the domain of discourse and `F´ is a predicate designating a property that perhaps some of those objects have, then `Fa´ is true in the object language if, and only if, a is a member of the set of all things having property F. For the more complex sentence `∀Fx´ in our object language, it is true just in case every object is a member of the extension of F, that is, set of all things having property F. These two definitions are still imprecise because the appeal to the concept of property should be eliminated, and the definitions should appeal to the notion of formulas being satisfied by sequences of objects. However, what we have here are two examples of partially defining truth for the object language, say language 0, but doing it from outside the language, in a meta-language, say language 1, that contains set theory. Tarski was able to show that in language 1 we satisfy Convention T because the equivalences
`Fa´ is true in language 0 if, and only if, Fa
`∀Fx´ is true in language 0 if, and only if, ∀Fx
are both deducible in language 1, as are the other T-sentences.
Despite Tarski’s having this success with defining truth for an object language in its meta-language, Tarski’s Undefinability Theorem establishes that there is apparently no hope of defining truth within the object language itself. Tarski then took on the project of discovering how close he could come to having a well-defined truth predicate within a classical formal language without actually having one. That project, his hierarchy of meta-languages, is also his key idea for solving the Liar Paradox. It will be discussed in a moment.
The key semantic concepts used to produce the Liar Paradox are truth, reference, and negation. No one wants to solve the Paradox by jettisoning any of these concepts. We need a finer diagnosis that makes more conservative changes to our concepts, logic and semantics. Where should we make the changes? If we adopt the metaphor of a paradox as being an argument which starts from the home of seemingly true assumptions and which travels down the garden path of seemingly valid steps into the den of a contradiction, then a solution to the Liar Paradox has to find something wrong with the home, find something wrong with the garden path, or find a way to live within the den. Less metaphorically, the main ways out of the Paradox are the following:
- The Liar Sentence is ungrammatical and so has no truth value (yet the argument of the Liar Paradox depends on it having a truth value).
- The Liar Sentence is grammatical but meaningless and so has no truth value.
- The Liar Sentence is grammatical and meaningful but still it has no truth value; it falls into the “truth gap.”
- The Liar Sentence is grammatical, meaningful and has a truth value, but one other step in the argument of the Liar Paradox is faulty.
- The argument of the Liar Paradox is acceptable, and we need to learn to live with the Liar Sentence being both true and false.
Two philosophers might take one of these ways out but for very different reasons, and they might offer different changes in our naive system of beliefs and concepts in order to take this way out.
There are many suggestions for how to deal with the Liar Paradox, but most are never developed to the point of giving a formal, detailed theory that can speak of its own syntax and semantics with precision. Some give philosophical arguments for why this or that conceptual reform is plausible as a way out of paradox, but then don’t show that their ideas can be carried through in a rigorous way. Other attempts at solutions will take the formal route and then require changes in standard formalisms so that a formal analog of the Liar Paradox’s argument fails, but then the attempted solution offers no philosophical argument to back up these formal changes. A decent theory of truth showing the way out of the Liar Paradox requires both a coherent formalism (or at least a systematic theory of some sort) and a philosophical justification backing it up. The point of the philosophical justification is an unveiling of some hitherto unnoticed or unaccepted rule of language for all sentences of some category which has been violated by the argument of the Paradox.
The leading solutions to the Liar Paradox, that is, the influential proposed solutions, all have a common approach, the “systematic approach.” The developers of these solutions agree that the Liar Paradox represents a serious challenge to our understanding the logic of natural language, and they agree that we must go back and systematically reform or clarify some of our original beliefs about language and the concept of truth, and provide a motivation for doing so other than that it blocks the Paradox.
This need to have systematic approach has been seriously challenged by Ludwig Wittgenstein. He says one should try to overcome ”the superstitious fear and dread of mathematicians in the face of a contradiction.” The proper way to respond to any paradox, he says, is by an ad hoc reaction and not by any systematic treatment designed to cure both it and any future ills. Symptomatic relief is sufficient. It may appear legitimate, at first, to admit that the Liar Sentence is meaningful and also that it is true or false, but the Liar Paradox shows that one should retract this admission and either just not use the Liar Sentence in any arguments, or say it is not really a sentence, or at least say it is not one that is either true or false. Wittgenstein is not particularly concerned with which choice is made. And, whichever choice is made, it need not be backed up by any theory that shows how to systematically incorporate the choice. He treats the whole situation cavalierly and unsystematically. After all, he says, the language can’t really be incoherent because we have been successfully using it all along, so why all this “fear and dread”? Most logicians want systematic removal of the Paradox, but Wittgenstein is content to say that we may need to live with this paradox and to agree never to utter the Liar Sentence, especially if it seems that removal of the contradiction could have worse consequences.
Influenced by Wittgenstein, P. F. Strawson has promoted the performative theory of truth. Strawson has argued that the proper way out of the Liar Paradox is to re-examine how the term “truth” is really used by speakers. In short, the Liar Sentence is meaningful but fails to express a proposition. To explore this response more deeply, notice that Strawson’s proposed solution depends on the distinction between a proposition and the declarative sentence used to express that proposition. A sentence, when uttered, either expresses a true proposition, expresses a false proposition, or fails to express any proposition. According to Strawson, when we say some proposition is true, we are not making a statement about the proposition. We are not ascribing a property to the proposition such as the property of correspondence to the facts, or coherence, or usefulness. Rather, when we call a proposition “true” we are only approving it, or praising it, or admitting it, or condoning it. We are performing an action of that sort. Similarly, when we say to our friend, “I promise to pay you fifty dollars,” we are not ascribing some property to the proposition, “I pay you fifty dollars.” Rather, we are performing the act of promising the $50. For Strawson, when speakers utter the Liar Sentence, they are saying something meaningful yet are attempting to praise a proposition that isn’t there, as if they were saying “Ditto” when no one has spoken. The person who utters the Liar Sentence is making a pointless utterance. According to this performative theory, the Liar Sentence is grammatical, but it is not being used to express a proposition and so is not something from which a contradiction can be derived.
The Liar Paradox can be expressed in terms of sentences, statements, or propositions. We can speak of the sentence “This sentence is false,” the statement that this statement is false, and the proposition that this proposition is false. Sentences are types of linguistic expressions whereas statements and propositions are not. Philosophers do not agree on what a sentence is, but they disagree more about what a statement is, and they disagree even more about what a proposition is. There are many suggestions about what a proposition is. In Bertrand Russell’s 1905 account of the proposition that snow is white, he requires snow itself to be constitutive of the proposition, much as snow is constitutive of the fact that snow is white. But in Gottlob Frege’s account of the proposition that snow is white, the proposition doesn’t contain snow, but rather the sense of the word ‘snow.’ Quine is a notorious opponent of propositions.
Here are some suggestions about a proposition is. It is the claim made by using a sentence; it is the meaning of the sentence; it is the statement made; it is what is expressed by the person uttering the sentence; it is what is held in common by all the sentences that are synonymous with the original sentence. And what about statements? To some researchers, statements are the same thing as propositions. To others, a statement is tied to a time, place, and situation or context that obtains when uttering the corresponding sentence, whereas a proposition does not have these ties. For example, the statement made by Alfred Tarski when saying, “He is Julius Moravcsik” while pointing to the person standing next to him can express the same proposition as the very different statement made when Julius Moravcsik says, “I am Julius Moravcsik.” Are statements the kinds of things such that one of them can be both true and false? Because it is now raining in some places but not in other places, the statement that it is now raining would be both true and false were we not to require the statement to be tied to the time and place.
There are some very good reasons why researchers who work on the Liar Paradox should focus on propositions rather than either sentences or statements, but those reasons will not be explored here. [For more, see ch.1 of (Barwise and Etchemendy 1987).] It will be assumed in the present article that propositions are expressed by speakers (or writers) using sentences, and that propositions are claims. More precisely, and using the principal sense of this ambiguous term, a proposition is what a sentence is used by a speaker on some occasion to claim about how the world is, when the sentence’s presuppositions are satisfied in the intended context.
There has been consider controversy in the philosophical literature about the ontological standing of propositions. We can go unicorn hunting without there being unicorns we are hunting. Do we analyze propositions without there being propositions we are analyzing? The present article will not take a stand on this question. The article will continue to speak primarily of sentences rather than propositions, though only for the purpose of simplicity.
We expect that any seriously proposed solution to the Liar Paradox will offer a better diagnosis of the problem than merely, “It stops the Liar Paradox.” A solution which says, “Quit using language” also will stop the Liar Paradox, but that is surely a very shallow diagnosis. The Liar Paradox can be stopped by making more conservative changes. Hopefully any proposal to refine our semantic principles will be conservative for another reason: We want to minimize changes because, all other things being equal, simple and intuitive semantic principles are to be preferred to complicated and less intuitive semantic principles.
Ideally, we would like for a proposed solution to the Liar Paradox to provide a solution to all the versions of the Liar Paradox, such as the Strengthened Liar Paradox, the version that led to Buridan’s proof of God’s existence, and the contingent versions of the Liar Paradoxes. It would be reasonable to expect it to tell us about the self-referential Truth-teller sentence:
This sentence is true.
It would also be reasonable to tell us how important self-reference is to the Liar Paradox. In the late 20th century, Stephen Yablo produced a semantic paradox that, he claims, shows that neither self-reference nor circularity is an essential feature of all the Liar paradoxes. In his paradox, there apparently is no way to coherently assign a truth value to any of the sentences in the countably infinite sequence of sentences of the form, “None of the subsequent sentences are true.” Imagine an unending line of people who say:
1. Everybody after me is lying.
2. Everybody after me is lying.
3. Everybody after me is lying.
Ask yourself whether the first person’s sentence in the sequence is true or false. Notice that no sentence overtly refers to itself. To produce the paradox it is crucial that the line of speakers be infinite. There is controversy in the literature about whether the paradox actually contains a hidden appeal to self-reference or circularity. See (Beall 2001) for more discussion.
An important goal for the best solution, or solutions, to the Liar Paradox is to offer us a deeper understanding of how our semantic mechanisms and principles worked to produce the Paradox in the first place, especially if a solution to the Paradox requires changing or at least clarifying one of those mechanisms or principles. But even if a change is recommended only in the syntax or logic of our language, it would still be helpful to understand the primary semantic mechanisms of truth, reference, and negation that are involved in the Paradox. In addition to these primary mechanisms there are the subsidiary mechanisms and related notions of self-reference, denial, naming, meaning, predicate, property, presupposition, antecedent, and operating on prior sentences to form newer meaningful ones rather than merely newer grammatical ones. We would like to know what limits there are on all these notions and mechanisms, and how one impacts another.
What are the important differences among the candidates for bearers of truth? The leading candidates are sentences, propositions, statements, claims, and utterances. Is one primary, while the others are secondary or derivative? And we would like know a great deal more about truth, especially truth, but also falsehood, and the related notions of fact, situation and state of affairs. We want to better understand what a language is and what the relationship is between an interpreted formal and a natural language, relative to different purposes. Finally, it would be instructive to learn how the Liar Paradoxes are related to all the other paradoxes. That may be a lot of ask, but then our civilization does have considerable time before the Sun expands and vaporizes our little planet.
There are many things we’d like to know about truth. Here are the most important ones, in no special order.
(1) Suppose we ask the large question, “What is truth?” and mean by this question to ask about the significant paths of life to be followed and the significant things to know in order to have the best grasp on reality. If so, the question is just too difficult, and also too vague, to be a center of attention for the analytic philosophers of the present age.
(2) Let us re-focus on truth in the sense of true sentences, true propositions, true beliefs, and so forth. When we investigate truth, we are always interested in truth for a specific language because what is true in one language is usually nonsense in another. Do we know a priori that truth has positive value, or is this something that we pick up empirically? The evidence that some false sentences do have positive explanatory value is that young people are still told by their teachers that atoms are miniature solar systems even though the teachers know this to be false.
(3) A theory of truth is different from, but related to, a theory of justification. A theory of justification of truth-claims might be expected to provide a detailed answer to this difficult set of epistemological questions: For each particular sentence, what would justify our deciding that this sentence is true, is probably true, is necessarily true, and is more probably true than that other sentence? Is there some practical way of deciding what is true and what is not?
(4) A theory of truth also is often expected to explain the logical liaisons between the word “true” and other related words in the language, such as the words “justified” and “fact.” For instance, is a well-justified belief a true belief, as John Dewey, William James and Michael Dummett have suggested? If so, then a theory of justification is a theory of truth. And since justification can come in degrees, can truth also come in degrees, as Brand Blanshard suggested?
(5) Turning away from a theory of justification to a theory of truth, one faces still more ambiguity because the term “theory of truth” means different things to different people. To some, it will at least tell us what the word “true” means. Is the word undefinable? Does it mean the same thing in the sentence, “You are a true friend of his,” as it does when we say some particular sentence is true?
(6) We would like to know what actions we are performing when we ascribe truth to a sentence [or to a proposition or statement or belief or utterance]. For example, what are we doing by saying, “‘Snow is white’ is true” that we are not doing by saying that snow is white? Frank Ramsey’s notorious answer was “Nothing.”
(7) For many philosophers who investigate truth, a central concern in finding a theory of truth is to find some general characteristics of all true sentences; this concern is reflected in asking how to fill in the blank in the general expression “A sentence is true if, and only if, _______,” without using the term “true” somewhere on the right. The term “if, and only if,” is ambiguous, but there has been considerable investigation of the project whose goal is to interpret “if, and only if,” as extensional equivalence rather than as equivalence in all possible worlds, or as synonymy. The goal is to fill in the blank with necessary and sufficient conditions for a sentence to be true (in the actual world). Proponents of the correspondence theory of truth fill in the blank this way: A sentence is true if, and only if, it agrees with reality in the sense of corresponding to the facts. The immediate metaphysical problem then is to be clearer about what correspondence is and to say what a fact is. These are difficult problems. Must a true sentence and its corresponding fact have a similar structure? There are disjunctive sentences that are true, but are there disjunctive facts? What is the fact making it true that there aren’t more than three unicorns there on the desk? Is it the same fact that makes it true that there aren’t two cows on the desk?
An important question regarding the Liar Paradox is: What is the relationship between a solution to the Paradox for (interpreted) formal languages and a solution to the Paradox for natural languages? There is significant disagreement on this issue. Is appeal to a formal language a turn away from the original problem, and so just changing the subject? Can one say we are still on the subject when employing a formal language because a natural language contains implicitly within it some formal language structure? Or should we be in the business of building an ideal language to replace natural language for the purpose of philosophical study? Or instead can a formal language be defended on the ground that natural language is inconsistent and the formal language is showing the best that can be done rigorously? Can sense even be made of the claim that a natural language is inconsistent, for isn’t consistency a property only of languages with a rigorous structure, namely formal languages and not natural languages? Should we say people can reason inconsistently in natural language without declaring the natural language itself to be inconsistent? This article raises, but will not resolve, these questions, although some are easier to answer than others.
Most of the most important ways out of the Liar Paradox recommend revising classical formal logic. Classical logic is the formal logic known to introductory logic students as “predicate logic” in which, among other things, (i) all sentences of the formal language have exactly one of two possible truth values (TRUE, FALSE), (ii) the rules of inference allow one to deduce any sentence from an inconsistent set of assumptions, (iii) all predicates are totally defined on the range of the variables, and (iv) the formal semantics is the one invented by Tarski that provided the first precise definition of truth for a formal language. A few philosophers of logic argue against any revision of classical logic by saying it is the incumbent formalism that should be accepted unless an alternative is required (probably it is believed to be incumbent because of its remarkable success in expressing most of modern mathematical inference). Still, most other philosophers argue that classical logic is not the incumbent which must remain in office unless an opponent can dislodge it. Instead, the office has always been vacant for the purpose of examining natural language and its paradoxes.
Some philosophers object to revising classical logic if the purpose in doing so is merely to find a way out of the Paradox. They say that philosophers shouldn’t build their theories by attending to the queer cases. There are more pressing problems in the philosophy of logic and language than finding a solution to the Paradox, so any treatment of it should wait until these problems have a solution. From the future resulting theory which solves those problems, one could hope to deduce a solution to the Liar Paradox. However, for those who believe the Paradox is not a minor problem but is one deserving of immediate attention, there can be no waiting around until the other problems of language are solved. Perhaps the investigation of the Liar Paradox will even affect the solutions to those other problems.
There have been many systematic proposals for ways out of the Liar Paradox. Below is a representative sample of five of the main ways out.
Bertrand Russell said natural language is incoherent, but its underlying sensible part is an ideal formal language which actually is an infinite hierarchy of formal languages (with each language being like an applied predicate logic of Principia Mathematica). He agreed with Henri Poincaré that the source of the Liar trouble is its use of self-reference. Russell wanted to rule out self-referential sentences as being ungrammatical or not well-formed in his ideal language, and in this way solve the Liar Paradox.
By using his ideal formal language, Russell produces a formal analog of the Liar sentence that has its self-reference removed. For that reason, we can say that his formal language actually does not contain a Liar sentence.
In any formal language of the hierarchy, if a term applies to another term, that second term must be lower in the hierarchy. A formal Liar Sentence would have to reside on more than one level simultaneously if it were to be a legitimate self-referential sentence. So, it is illegitimate. This way out of the Paradox is taken by Russell in his ramified type theory.
His solution has the drawback that it places so many subscript restrictions on what can refer to what. It is unfortunate that the Russell hierarchy is so severe that it requires even the apparently harmless self-referential sentences “This sentence is in English” and “This sentence is not in Italian” to be syntactically ill-formed. Bothered by this, Tarski took a different approach to the Liar Paradox.
Reflection on the Liar Paradox suggests that either informal English (or any other natural language) is not semantically closed or, if it is semantically closed as it appears to be, then it is inconsistent—assuming for the moment that it does make sense to apply the term “inconsistent” to a natural language with a vague structure. Because of the vagueness of natural language, Tarski quit trying to find the paradox-free structure within natural languages and concentrated on developing formal languages that did not allow the deduction of a contradiction, but which diverge from natural language “as little as possible.” Many other philosophers of logic have not drawn Tarski’s pessimistic conclusion (about not being able to solve the Liar Paradox for natural language). W. V. O. Quine, in particular, argued that informal English can be considered to implicitly contain the hierarchy of Tarski’s metalanguages. This hierarchy is the tool Tarski used to solve the Liar Paradox for formal languages.
One virtue of Tarski’s way out of the Paradox is that it does permit the concept of truth to be applied to sentences that involve the concept of truth, provided we apply level subscripts to the concept of truth and follow the semantic rule that any subscript inside, say, a pair of quotation marks is smaller than the subscript outside; any violation of this rule produces a meaningless, ungrammatical formal sentence, but not a false one. The language of level 1 is the meta-language of the object language in level 0. The (semi-formal) sentence “I0 am not true0” violates the subscript rule, as does “I1 am not true1” and so on up the numbered hierarchy. `I0´ is the name of the sentence “I0 am not true0,” which is the obvious candidate for being the Strengthened Liar Sentence in level 0, the lowest level. The rule for subscripts stops the formation of either the Classical Liar sentence or the Strengthened Liar Sentence anywhere in the hierarchy. The subscript rule permits forming the Liar-like sentence “I0 am not true1.” That sentence is the closest the Tarski hierarchy can come to having a Liar Sentence, but it is not really the intended Liar Sentence because of the equivocation with the concept of truth, and it is simply false and leads to no paradox.
This clever treatment of the Liar Paradox unfortunately has drawbacks: English has a single word “true,” but Tarski is replacing this with an infinite sequence of truth-like predicates, each of which is satisfied by the truths only of the language below it. Intuitively, a more global truth predicate should be expressible in the language it applies to, so Tarski’s theory cannot make formal sense of remarks such as “The Liar Sentence implies it itself is false” although informally this is a true remark. One hopes to be able to talk truly about one’s own semantic theory. Despite these restrictions and despite the unintuitive and awkward hierarchy, Quine defends Tarski’s way out of the Liar Paradox as follows. Like Tarski, he prefers to speak of the Antinomy instead of the Paradox.
Revision of a conceptual scheme is not unprecedented. It happens in a small way with each advance in science, and it happens in a big way with the big advances, such as the Copernican revolution and the shift from Newtonian mechanics to Einstein’s theory of relativity. We can hope in time even to get used to the biggest such changes and to find the new schemes natural. There was a time when the doctrine that the earth revolves around the sun was called the Copernican paradox, even by the men who accepted it. And perhaps a time will come when truth locutions without implicit subscripts, or like safeguards, will really sound as nonsensical as the antinomies show them to be. (Quine 1976)
Tarski adds to the defense by stressing that:
The languages (either the formalized languages or—what is more frequently the case—the portions of everyday language) which are used in scientific discourse do not have to be semantically closed. (Tarski, 1944)
(Kripke 1975) criticized Tarski’s way out for its inability to handle empirical versions of the Liar Paradox. Barwise and Etchemendy describe the inability: “Consider, for example, the following pair of sentences from Kripke’s paper.
(1.1) Most of Nixon’s assertions about Watergate are false.
(1.2) Everything Jones says about Watergate is true.
Now there is nothing intrinsically paradoxical about these sentences. It is easy to imagine all kinds of situations where either or both could be truly uttered. But Kripke observed that there are also circumstances in which they would be paradoxical: for example, if 1.1 is asserted by Jones, and it is in fact his only assertion about Watergate, while Nixon asserts 1.2, and the rest of Nixon’s assertions about Watergate are evenly balanced between the true and the false. Such examples show, as Kripke puts it, that ‘there can be no syntactic or semantic ‘sieve’ that will winnow out the ‘bad’ cases while preserving the ‘good’ ones.’ In particular, the sort of linguistic stratification suggested by Tarski would have to rule out sentences like these, in spite of the fact that they also have perfectly innocuous, non-paradoxical uses.” (Barwise and Etchemendy, 1987, pages 6-7)
Putnam criticized Tarski’s way out for another reason:
The paradoxical aspect of Tarski’s theory, indeed of any hierarchical theory, is that one has to stand outside the whole hierarchy even to formulate the statement that the hierarchy exists. But what is this “outside place”—“informal language”—supposed to be? It cannot be “ordinary language,” because ordinary language, according to Tarski, is semantically closed and hence inconsistent. But neither can it be a regimented language, for no regimented language can make semantic generalizations about itself or about languages on a higher level than itself. (Putnam 1990, 13)
Saul Kripke’s way out requires a less radical revision in our semantic principles than does the Tarski-Quine solution. Kripke retains the intuition that there is a semantically coherent and meaningful Liar Sentence, but argues that it is neither true nor false and so falls into a “truth value gap.” Tarski’s Undefinability Theorem does not apply to languages having sentences that are neither true nor false. Kripke trades Russell’s and Tarski’s infinite complexity of languages for infinite semantic complexity of a single formal language. He rejects Tarski’s infinite hierarchy of meta-languages in favor of one formal language having an infinite hierarchy of partial interpretations. Consider a formal language containing a predicate T for truth (that is, for truth-in-an interpretation, although Kripke allows the interpretation to change throughout the hierarchy); this predicate is given, in the base level of the hierarchy, an interpretation in which it is true of all sentences that do not actually contain the symbol ‘T’. The truth predicate T is the formal language’s only basic partially-interpreted predicate. Each step in Kripke’s semantic hierarchy is a partial interpretation of the language, and in these interpretations all the basic predicates except one must have their interpretations already fixed in the base level from which the first step up the hierarchy is taken. This one exceptional predicate T is intended to be the truth predicate for the previous level.
For example, at the lowest level in the hierarchy we have the (formal equivalent of the) true sentence 7 + 5 = 12. Strictly speaking it is not grammatical in English to say 7 + 5 = 12 is true. More properly we should say ‘7 + 5 = 12’ is true. In Kripke’s formal language, ‘7 + 5 = 12’ is true at the base level of the hierarchy. Meanwhile, the sentence that says it is true, namely ‘T(‘7+5=12’)’, is not true at that level, although it is true at the next higher level. Unfortunately at this new level, the even more complex sentence ‘T(‘T(‘7+5=12’)’)’ is still not yet true. It will become true at the next higher level. And so goes the hierarchy of interpretations as it attributes truth to more and more sentences involving the concept of truth itself. The extension of T grows but never contracts as we move up the hierarchy, and it grows by calling more true sentences true. Similarly the anti-extension of T grows but never contracts as more false sentence involving T are correctly said to be false.
Kripke says T eventually becomes a truth predicate for its own level when the interpretation-building reaches the unique lowest fixed point at a countably infinite height in the hierarchy. At a fixed point, no new sentences are declared true or false at the next level, but the language satisfies Tarski’s Convention T, so for this reason many philosophers are sympathetic to Kripke’s claim that T is a truth predicate at that point. At this fixed point, the Liar Sentence still is neither true nor false, and so falls into the truth gap, just as Kripke set out to show. In this way, the Liar Paradox is solved, the formal semantics is coherent, and many of our intuitions about semantics are preserved. Regarding our intuition that is expressed in Convention T, a virtue of Kripke’s theory is that, if ‘p’ abbreviates the name of the sentence X, it follows that Tp is true (or false) just in case X is true (or false).
However, there are difficulties with Kripke’s way out. The treatment of the Classical Liar stumbles on the Strengthened Liar and reveals why that paradox deserves its name. For a discussion of why, see (Kirkham 1992, pp. 293-4).
Some critics of Kripke’s theory say that in the fixed-point the Liar Sentence does not actually contain a real, total truth predicate but rather only a clever restriction on the truth predicate, and so Kripke’s Liar Sentence is not really the Liar Sentence after all; therefore we do not have here a solution to the Liar Paradox. Other philosophers would say this is not a fair criticism of Kripke’s theory since Tarski’s Convention T, or some other intuitive feature of our concept of truth, must be restricted in some way if we are going to have a formal treatment of truth. What can more easily be agreed upon by the critics is that Kripke’s candidate for the Liar sentence falls into the truth gap in Kripke’s theory at all levels of his hierarchy, so it is not true in his theory. [We are making this judgment that it is not true from within the meta-language in which sentences are properly said to be true or else not true.] However, in the object language of the theory, one cannot truthfully say this; one cannot say the Liar Sentence is not true since the candidate expression for that, namely ~Ts, is not true, but rather falls into the truth gap.
Robert Martin and Peter Woodruff created the same way out as Kripke, though a few months earlier and in less depth. Both their own treatment and Kripke’s suffer from, among other things, not having a solution to the Strengthened Liar Paradox.
Another way out says the Liar Sentence is meaningful and is true or else false, but one step of the argument in the Liar Paradox is incorrect (such as the inference from the Liar Sentence’s being false to its being true). Arthur Prior, following the informal suggestions of Jean Buridan and C. S. Peirce, takes this way out and concludes that the Liar Sentence is simply false. So do Jon Barwise and John Etchemendy, but they go on to present a detailed, formal treatment of the Paradox, although the details of their treatment will not be sketched here. Their treatment says the Liar Sentence is simply false on one interpretation but simply true on another interpretation, and that the argument of the Paradox improperly exploits this ambiguity. A positive feature of their solution is that it is able to solve the Strengthened Liar; but there is a price to pay:
Barwise and Etchemendy would rather keep classical logic and avoid contradiction, even at the price of never being able to talk about the whole world. (Kirkham 1992, p. 306)
A more radical way out of the Paradox is to argue that semantic incoherence is not necessarily caused by letting the Liar Sentence be both true and false. This solution, a version of dialethism, embraces the contradiction, then tries to limit the damage that is ordinarily a consequence of that embrace. This way out uses a paraconsistent logic. That solution, which was initially promoted mostly by Graham Priest, will not be developed in this article, but it succeeds in avoiding semantic incoherence while offering a formal, detailed treatment of the Paradox. A principal drawback of this treatment is the violence it does to our intuition that sentences can’t be both true and false in the same sense in the same situation.
Russell, Tarski, Kripke, Priest, Barwise and Etchemendy (among others) deserve credit for providing a philosophical justification for their proposed solutions while also providing a formal treatment in symbolic logic that shows in detail both the character and implications of their proposed solutions. The theories of Russell and of Quine-Tarski do solve the Strengthened Liar, but at the cost of assigning complex “levels” to the relevant sentences, although the Quine-Tarski solution does not take Russell’s radical step of ruling out all self-reference. Kripke’s elegant and careful treatment of the Classical Liar stumbles on the Strengthened Liar and reveals why that paradox deserves its name. Barwise and Etchemendy’s way out avoids these problems, but it requires accepting the idea that no sentence can be used to say anything about the whole world including the semantics of our language. Priest’s way out requires giving up our intuition that no context-free, unambiguous sentence is both true and false.
The interesting dispute continues over which is the best way out of the Liar Paradox—the best way to preserve the most important intuitions we have about semantics while avoiding semantic incoherence. In this vein, Hilary Putnam draws the following conclusion:
If you want to say something about the liar sentence, in the sense of being able to give final answers to the questions “Is it meaningful or not? And if it is meaningful, is it true or false? Does it express a proposition or not? Does it have a truth-value or not? And which one?” then you will always fail. In closing, let me say that even if Tarski was wrong (as I believe he was) in supposing that ordinary language is a theory and hence can be described as “consistent” or “inconsistent,” and even if Kripke and others have shown that it is possible to construct languages that contain their own truth-predicates, still, the fact remains that the totality of our desires with respect to how a truth-predicate should behave in a semantically closed language, in particular, our desire to be able to say without paradox of an arbitrary sentence in such a language that it is true, or that it is false, or that it is neither true nor false, cannot be adequately satisfied. The very act of interpreting a language that contains a liar sentence creates a hierarchy of interpretations, and the reflection that this generates does not terminate in an answer to the questions “Is the liar sentence meaningful or meaningless, or if it is meaningful, is it true or false?” (Putnam 2000)
See also Logical Paradoxes.
For further reading on the Liar Paradox that provides more of an introduction to it while not presupposing a strong background in symbolic logic, the author recommends the article below by Mates, plus the first chapter of the Barwise-Etchemendy book, and then chapter 9 of the Kirkham book. The rest of this bibliography is a list of contributions to research on the Liar Paradox, and all members of the list require the reader to have significant familiarity with the techniques of symbolic logic. In the formal, symbolic tradition, other important researchers in the last quarter of the 20th century were Burge, Gupta, Herzberger, McGee, Parsons, Routley, Skyrms, van Fraassen, and Yablo.
- Barwise, Jon and John Etchemendy. The Liar: An Essay in Truth and Circularity, Oxford University Press, 1987.
- Beall, J.C. (2001). “Is Yablo’s Paradox Non-Circular?” Analysis 61, no. 3, pp. 176-87.
- Burge, Tyler. “Semantical Paradox,” Journal of Philosophy, 76 (1979), 169-198.
- Dowden, Bradley. “Accepting Inconsistencies from the Paradoxes,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 13 (1984), 125-130.
- Gupta, Anil. “Truth and Paradox,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 11 (1982), 1-60. Reprinted in Martin (1984), 175-236.
- Herzberger, Hans. “Paradoxes of Grounding in Semantics,” Journal of Philosophy, 68 (1970), 145-167.
- Kirkham, Richard. Theories of Truth: A Critical Introduction, MIT Press, 1992.
- Kripke, Saul. “Outline of a Theory of Truth,” Journal of Philosophy, 72 (1975), 690-716. Reprinted in (Martin 1984).
- Martin, Robert. The Paradox of the Liar, Yale University Press, Ridgeview Press, 1970. 2nd ed. 1978.
- Martin, Robert. Recent Essays on Truth and the Liar Paradox, Oxford University Press, 1984.
- Martin, Robert and Peter Woodruff. “On Representing ‘True-in-L’ in L,” Philosophia, 5 (1975), 217-221.
- Mates, Benson. “Two Antinomies,” in Skeptical Essays, The University of Chicago Press, 1981, 15-57.
- McGee, Vann. Truth, Vagueness, and Paradox: An Essay on the Logic of Truth, Hackett Publishing, 1991.
- Priest, Graham. “The Logic of Paradox,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 8 (1979), 219-241; and “Logic of Paradox Revisited,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 13 (1984), 153-179.
- Priest, Graham, Richard Routley, and J. Norman (eds.). Paraconsistent Logic: Essays on the Inconsistent, Philosophia-Verlag, 1989.
- Prior, Arthur. “Epimenides the Cretan,” Journal of Symbolic Logic, 23 (1958), 261-266; and “On a Family of Paradoxes,” Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 2 (1961), 16-32.
- Putnam, Hilary. Realism with a Human Face, Harvard University Press, 1990.
- Putnam, Hilary. “Paradox Revisited I: Truth.” In Gila Sher and Richard Tieszen, eds., Between Logic and Intuition: Essays in Honor of Charles Parsons, Cambridge University Press, (2000), 3-15.
- Quine, W. V. O. “The Ways of Paradox,” in his The Ways of Paradox and Other Essays, rev. ed., Harvard University Press, 1976.
- Russell, Bertrand. “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types,” American Journal of Mathematics, 30 (1908), 222.
- Skyrms, Brian. “Return of the Liar: Three-valued Logic and the Concept of Truth,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 7 (1970), 153-161.
- Strawson, P. F. “Truth,” in Analysis, 9, (1949).
- Tarski, Alfred. “The Concept of Truth in Formalized Languages,” in Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics, pp. 152-278, Clarendon Press, 1956.
- Tarski, Alfred. “The Semantic Conception of Truth and the Foundations of Semantics,” in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, Vol. 4, No. 3 (1944), 341-376.
- Van Fraassen, Bas. “Truth and Paradoxical Consequences,” in (Martin 1970).
- Woodruff, Peter. “Paradox, Truth and Logic Part 1: Paradox and Truth,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 13 (1984), 213-231.
- Wittgenstein, Ludwig. Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics, Basil Blackwell, 3rd edition, 1978.
- Yablo, Stephen. (1993). “Paradox without Self-Reference.” Analysis 53: 251-52.
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