Liar Paradox

The Liar Paradox is an argument that arrives at a contradiction by reasoning about a Liar Sentence. The Classical Liar Sentence is the self-referential sentence, “This sentence is false,” which leads to the same difficulties as the sentence, “I am lying.”

Experts in the field of philosophical logic have never agreed on the way out of the trouble despite 2,300 years of attention. Here is the trouble—a sketch of the Liar Argument that reveals the contradiction:

Let L be the Classical Liar Sentence. If L is true, then L is false. But we can also establish the converse, as follows. Assume L is false. Because the Liar Sentence is just the sentence that ‘says’ L is false, the Liar Sentence is therefore true, so L is true. We have now shown that L is true if, and only if, it is false. Since L must be one or the other, it is both.

That contradictory result apparently throws us into the lion’s den of semantic incoherence. The incoherence is due to the fact that, according to the rules of classical logic, anything follows from a contradiction, even "1 + 1 = 3." This article explores the details and implications of the principal ways out of the Paradox, that is, the ways of preserving or restoring semantic coherence.

Most people, when first encountering the Liar Paradox, react in one of two ways. One reaction is to not take the Paradox seriously and say they won't reason any more about it. The second and more popular reaction is to say the Liar Sentence must be meaningless. Both of these reactions are a way out of the Paradox. That is, they stop the argument of the Paradox. However, the first reaction provides no useful diagnosis of the problem that was caused in the first place. The second is not an adequate solution if it can answer the question, “Why is the Liar Sentence meaningless?”  only with the ad hoc remark, “Otherwise we get a paradox.” An adequate solution should offer a more systematic treatment. For example, the self-referential English sentence, “This sentence is not in Italian,” is very similar to the Liar Sentence. Is it meaningless, too?  Apparently not. So, what feature of the Liar Sentence makes it be meaningless while “This sentence is not in Italian,” is not meaningless? The questions continue, and an adequate solution should address them systematically.

Table of Contents

  1. History of the Paradox
    1. Strengthened Liar
    2. Why the Paradox is a Serious Problem
    3. Tarski’s Undefinability Theorem
  2. Overview of Ways Out of the Paradox
    1. Five Ways Out
    2. Sentences, Statements, and Propositions
    3. An Ideal Solution to the Paradox
    4. Should Classical Logic be Revised?
  3. The Main Ways Out
    1. Russell’s Type Theory
    2. Tarski’s Hierarchy of Meta-Languages
    3. Kripke’s Hierarchy of Interpretations
    4. Barwise and Etchemendy
    5. Paraconsistency
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. History of the Paradox

Languages are expected to contain contradictions but not paradoxes. The sentence, “Snow is white, and snow is not white,” is just one of the many false sentences in the English language. But languages are not expected to contain paradoxes. A paradox is an apparently convincing argument leading to the conclusion that one of the language’s contradictory sentences is true. Why is that a problem? Well, let L be the Liar sentence, and let Q be a sentence we already know cannot be true, say "1 + 1 = 3". Then we can reason this way:

1. L and not-L from the Liar Paradox
2. L from 1
3. L or Q from 2 using the Law of Addition
4. not-L from 1
5. Q from 3 and 4

The consequence is outrageous. So, an appropriate reaction to any paradox is to look for some unacceptable assumption made in the apparently convincing argument or else to look for a faulty step in the reasoning. Only very reluctantly would one want to learn to live with the contradiction being true, or ignore the contradiction altogether.

By the way, what this article calls "paradoxes" are called "antinomies" by Quine, Tarski and some other authors, but this article does not speak of the Liar Antinomy nor of Zeno's Antinomies. Zeno's Paradoxes were discovered in the 5th century B.C.E., and the Liar Paradox was discovered in the middle of the 4th century B.C.E., both paradoxes arising in ancient Greece. The oldest attribution of the Liar is to Eubulides of Miletus who included it among a list of seven puzzles. He said, “A man says that he is lying. Is what he says true or false?” Eubulides’ commentary on his puzzle has not been found. An ancient gravestone on the Greek Island of Kos was reported by Athenaeus to contain this poem about the difficulty of solving the Paradox:

O Stranger: Philetas of Kos am I,

‘Twas the Liar who made me die,

And the bad nights caused thereby.

Theophrastus, Aristotle’s successor, wrote three papyrus rolls about the Liar Paradox, and the Stoic philosopher Chrysippus wrote six, but their contents are lost in the sands of time. Despite various comments on how to solve the Paradox, no Greek suggested that Greek itself was inconsistent; it was the reasoning within Greek that was considered to be inconsistent.

In the Late Medieval period in Europe, the French philosopher Jean Buridan put the Liar Paradox to devious use with the following proof of the existence of God. It uses the pair of sentences:

God exists.

None of the sentences in this pair is true.

The only consistent way to assign truth values, that is, to have these two sentence be either true or false, requires making “God exists” be true. So, in this way, Buridan has “proved” that God does exist.

There are many other versions of the Paradox. Some liar paradoxes begin with a chain of sentences, no one of which is self-referential, although the chain as a whole is self-referential or circular:

The following sentence is true.

The following sentence is true.

The following sentence is true.

The first sentence in this list is false.

There are also Contingent Liars which may or may not lead to a paradox depending on what happens in the world beyond the sentence. For example:

It’s raining, and this sentence is false.

Paradoxicality now depends on the weather. If it’s sunny, then the sentence is simply false, but if it’s raining, then we have the beginning of a paradox.

a. Strengthened Liar

The Strengthened Liar Paradox begins with the Strengthened Liar Sentence L':

This sentence is not true.

This version is called “Strengthened” because some promising solutions to the Classical Liar Paradox beginning with (L) fail when faced with the Strengthened Liar (L'). So, finding one’s way out of the Strengthened Liar Paradox is the acid test of a successful solution.

The Classical Liar Paradox used the assumption, "Since L must be one or the other..." namely that any declarative sentence is either true or false. This assumption is called "bivalence." Simply rejecting bivalence and, more specifically, rejecting the assumption that the Classical Liar Sentence has a truth value, will successfully stop the Classical Liar Paradox but not the Strengthened Liar Paradox. Here is why. What is the truth value of L'? If it were to be true, then it would not be true. But if it were not true, then it would therefore be true. But surely L' is either true or it's not; that follows from the very definition of negation. So, L'  is both true and not true. Now we have arrived at a contradiction without relying on bivalence.

We do not want to solve the Classical Liar only to be ensnared by the Strengthened Liar.

b. Why the Paradox is a Serious Problem

To put the Liar Paradox in perspective, it is essential to appreciate why such an apparently trivial problem is a deep problem. Solving the Liar Paradox is part of the larger project of understanding truth. Understanding truth involves finding a theory of truth or a definition of truth or a proper analysis of the concept of truth. These are distinct projects, but the current article does not take great care in distinguishing them from each other.

Aristotle offered what most philosophers consider to be a correct proposal. Stripped of his overtones suggesting a correspondence theory of truth, Aristotle proposed (in Metaphysics 1011 b26) what is now called a precursor to Alfred Tarski's Convention T:

(T) A sentence is true if, and only if, what it says is so.

Here we need to take some care with the use-mention distinction. If pairs of quotation marks serve to name or mention a sentence, then the above is requiring that the sentence “It is snowing” be true just in case it is snowing. Similarly, if the sentence about snow were named not with quotation marks but with the numeral 88 inside a pair of parentheses, then (88) would be true just in case it is snowing. What could be less controversial about the nature of truth? Unfortunately, this is neither obviously correct nor trivial; and the resolution of the difficulty is still an open problem in philosophical logic. Why is that? The brief answer is that (T) can be used to produce the Liar Paradox. The longer answer refers to Tarski’s Undefinability Theorem of 1936.

c. Tarski’s Undefinability Theorem

tarskiThis article began with a mere sketch of the Liar Argument using sentence (L). To appreciate the central role of (T) in the argument, we need to examine more than just a sketch of the argument. Alfred Tarski proposed a more formal characterization of (T), which is called schema T or Convention T:

(T) X is true if, and only if, p,

where “p” is a variable for a grammatical sentence and “X” is a name for that sentence. Tarski was the first person to claim that any theory of truth that could not entail all sentences of this schema would fail to be an adequate theory of truth. Here is what Tarski is requiring. If we want to build a theory of truth for English, and we want to state the theory using English, then the theory must entail the T-sentence:

“Snow is white” is true if, and only if, snow is white.

If we want instead to build a theory of truth for German and use English to state the theory, then the theory should, among other things, at least entail the T-sentence:

“Der Schnee ist weiss” is true in German if, and only if, snow is white.

A great many philosophers believe Tarski is correct when he claims his Convention T is a necessary condition on any successful theory of truth for any language. However, do we want all the T-sentences to be entailed and thus come out true? Probably not the T-sentence for the Liar Sentence. That T-sentence has the logical form:

T`s´ if and only if s.  

Here T is the truth predicate (informally it is the predicate "is a true sentence"), and s is the Liar Sentence, namely ~T`s´. Substituting the latter for s on the right of the biconditional yields the contradiction:

T`s´ if and only if ~T`s´.

That is the argument of the Liar Paradox, very briefly. Tarski wanted to find a way out.

Tarski added precision to the discussion of the Liar by focusing not on a natural language but on a classical, interpreted, formal language capable of expressing arithmetic. Here the difficulties produced by the Liar Argument became much clearer; and, very surprisingly, he was able to prove that Convention T plus the assumption that the language contains its own concept of truth do lead to semantic incoherence.

The proof requires the following assumptions in addition to Convention T. Here we quote from (Tarski 1944):

I. We have implicitly assumed that the language in which the antinomy is constructed contains, in addition to its expressions, also the names of these expressions, as well as semantic terms such as the term "true" referring to sentences of this language; we have also assumed that all sentences which determine the adequate usage of this term can be asserted in the language. A language with these properties will be called "semantically closed."

II. We have assumed that in this language the ordinary laws of logic hold.

Tarski pointed out that the crucial, unacceptable assumption of the formal version of the Liar Argument is that the language is semantically closed. For there to be a grammatical and meaningful Liar Sentence in that language, there must be a definable notion of “is true” which holds for the true sentences and fails to hold for the other sentences. If there were such a global truth predicate, then the predicate “is a false sentence” would also be definable; and [here is where we need the power of elementary number theory] a Liar Sentence would exist, namely a complex sentence ∃x(Qx & ~Tx), where Q and T are predicates which are satisfied by names of sentences. More specifically, T is the one-place, global truth predicate satisfied by all the names [that is, numerals for the Gödel numbers] of the true sentences, and Q is a one-place predicate that is satisfied only by the name of ∃x(Qx & ~Tx). But if so, then one can eventually deduce a contradiction. This deduction of Tarski’s is a formal analog of the informal argument of the Liar Paradox. The contradictory result tells us that the argument began with a false assumption. According to Tarski, the error that causes the contradiction is the assumption that the global truth predicate can be well-defined. Therefore, Tarski has proved that truth is not definable within a classical formal language—thus the name “Undefinability Theorem.” Tarski’s Theorem establishes that classically interpreted languages capable of expressing arithmetic cannot contain a global truth predicate. So his theorem implies that classical formal languages with the power to express arithmetic cannot be semantically closed.

There is no special difficulty in giving a careful definition of truth for a classical formal language, provided we do it outside the language; and Tarski himself was the first person to do this. In 1933 he created the first formal semantics for quantified predicate logic. Here are two imperfect examples of how he defines truth. First, the simple sentence 'Fa' is true if, and only if, a is a member of the set of objects that are F. Notice that the English truth predicate "is true" occurring in this definition of truth for the formal language does not also occur within the formal language. The formal language being examined, that is, being given a theory of truth, is what Tarski calls the "object language." The definition of truth for the object language occurs in the meta-language, which in this case is English.

For a second example of defining truth, Tarski says the universally quantified sentence '∀xFx' is true if, and only if, all the objects in the domain are members of the set of objects that are F. To repeat, a little more precisely but still imperfectly, Tarski's theory implies that, if we have a simple, formal sentence `Fa´ in our formal language, in which ` is the name of some object in the domain of discourse (that is, what we can talk about) and if ` is a predicate designating a property that perhaps some of those objects have, then `Fa´ is true in the object language if, and only if, a is a member of the set of all things having property F. For the more complex sentence `∀xFx´ in our language, it is true just in case every object is a member of the set of all things having property F.

These two definitions are still imprecise because the appeal to the concept of property should be eliminated, and the definitions should appeal to the notion of formulas being satisfied by sequences of objects. However, what we have here are two examples of partially defining truth for the object language, say language 0, but doing it from outside language 0, in a meta-language, say language 1, that contains set theory and that might or might not contain language 0 itself. Tarski was able to show that in language 1 we satisfy Convention T for the object language 0, because the equivalences

`Fa´ is true in language 0 if, and only if, Fa

`∀xFx´ is true in language 0 if, and only if, ∀xFx

are both deducible in language 1, as are the other T-sentences.

Despite Tarski's having this success with defining truth for an object language in its meta-language, Tarski's Undefinability Theorem establishes that there is apparently no hope of defining truth within the object language itself. Tarski then took on the project of discovering how close he could come to having a well-defined truth predicate within a classical formal language without actually having one. That project, his hierarchy of meta-languages, is also his key idea for solving the Liar Paradox. It will be discussed in a moment.

2. Overview of Ways Out of the Paradox

a. Five Ways Out

We should avoid solving the Liar Paradox merely by declaring that our logic obeys the principle "Avoid paradoxes." That gives us no guidance about how to avoid them. Since the Liar Paradox depends crucially upon our ideas about how to make inferences and how to understand the key semantic concepts of truth, reference, and negation, one might reasonably suppose that one of these needs revision. No one wants to solve the Paradox by being heavy-handed and jettisoning more than necessary—but any changes we do make may have their own drawbacks.

Where should we make the changes? If we adopt the metaphor of a paradox as being an argument which starts from the home of seemingly true assumptions and which travels down the garden path of seemingly valid steps into the den of a contradiction, then a solution to the Liar Paradox has to find something wrong with the home, find something wrong with the garden path, or find a way to live within the den. Less metaphorically, the main ways out of the Paradox are the following:

  1. The Liar Sentence is ungrammatical and so has no truth value (yet the argument of the Liar Paradox depends on it having a truth value).
  2. The Liar Sentence is grammatical but meaningless and so has no truth value.
  3. The Liar Sentence is grammatical and meaningful but still it has no truth value; it falls into the “truth gap.”
  4. The Liar Sentence is grammatical, meaningful and has a truth value, but one other step in the argument of the Liar Paradox is faulty.
  5. The argument of the Liar Paradox is acceptable, and we need to learn how to live with the Liar Sentence being both true and false.

Two philosophers might take the same way out, but for different reasons.

In presenting any of these five solutions to the Paradox, it is helpful to explore the details and the implications. For example, do they accept or revise the Law of Addition that was appealed to in step 3 of the Liar Argument back in Section 1 of this article?  A solution is unacceptably vague if it cannot answer this question and give it a principled justification of some sort.

There are many suggestions for how to deal with the Liar Paradox, but most are never developed to the point of giving a formal, detailed theory that can speak of its own syntax and semantics with precision. Some give philosophical arguments for why this or that conceptual reform is plausible as a way out of paradox, but then don’t show that their ideas can be carried through in a rigorous way. Other attempts at solutions will take the formal route and then require changes in standard formalisms so that a formal analog of the Liar Paradox’s argument fails, but then the attempted solution offers no philosophical argument to back up these formal changes. A decent theory of truth showing the way out of the Liar Paradox requires both a coherent formalism (or at least a systematic theory of some sort) and a philosophical justification backing it up. The point of the philosophical justification is an unveiling of some hitherto unnoticed or unaccepted rule of language for all sentences of some category which has been violated by the argument of the Paradox.

The leading solutions to the Liar Paradox, that is, the influential proposed solutions, all have a common approach, the “systematic approach.” The developers of these solutions agree that the Liar Paradox represents a serious challenge to our understanding the concepts, rules, and logic of natural language; and they agree that we must go back and systematically reform or clarify some of our original beliefs, and provide a motivation for doing so other than that doing so blocks the Paradox.

This need to have a systematic approach has been seriously challenged by Ludwig Wittgenstein (in 1938 in a discussion group with Alan Turing on the foundations of mathematics). He says one should try to overcome ”the superstitious fear and dread of mathematicians in the face of a contradiction.” The proper way to respond to any paradox, he says, is by an ad hoc reaction and not by any systematic treatment designed to cure both it and any future ills. Symptomatic relief is sufficient. He says it may appear legitimate, at first, to admit that the Liar Sentence is meaningful and also that it is true or false, but the Liar Paradox shows that one should retract this admission and either just not use the Liar Sentence in any arguments, or say it is not really a sentence, or at least say it is not one that is either true or false. Wittgenstein is not particularly concerned with which choice is made. And, whichever choice is made, he believes it need not be backed up by any theory that shows how to systematically incorporate the choice. He treats the whole situation cavalierly and unsystematically. After all, he says, the language can’t really be incoherent because we have been successfully using it all along, so why all this “fear and dread”? Most logicians want systematic removal of the Paradox, but Wittgenstein is content to say that we may need to live with this paradox and to agree never to utter the Liar Sentence, especially if it seems that removal of the contradiction could have worse consequences.

P. F. Strawson has promoted the performative theory of truth as a way out of the Liar Paradox. Strawson has argued that the proper way out of the Liar Paradox is to carefully re-examine how the term “truth” is really used by speakers. He says such an investigation will reveal that the Liar Sentence is meaningful but fails to express a proposition. To explore this response more deeply, notice that Strawson’s proposed solution depends on the distinction between a proposition and the declarative sentence used to express that proposition. The next section explores what a proposition is, but let's agree for now that a sentence, when uttered, either expresses a true proposition, expresses a false proposition, or fails to express any proposition. According to Strawson, when we say some proposition is true, we are not making a statement about the proposition. We are not ascribing a property to the proposition such as the property of correspondence to the facts, or coherence, or usefulness. Rather, when we call a proposition “true,” we are only approving it, or praising it, or admitting it, or condoning it. We are performing an action of that sort. Similarly, when we say to our friend, “I promise to pay you fifty dollars,” we are not ascribing some property to the proposition, “I pay you fifty dollars.” Rather, we are performing the act of promising the $50. For Strawson, when speakers utter the Liar Sentence, they are attempting to praise a proposition that is not there, as if they were saying “Ditto” when no one has spoken. The person who utters the Liar Sentence is making a pointless utterance. According to this performative theory, the Liar Sentence is grammatical, but it is not being used to express a proposition and so is not something from which a contradiction can be derived.

Some proponents of their favorite solution to the paradox agree that a formal, systematic approach to the paradox is valuable, and they point out that in some formalism, say first-order arithmetic, the Liar argument cannot be reconstructed. For one example, perhaps the proponents will argue that the prong of the argument from the Liar sentence being true to its being false is acceptable, but the prong from the Liar sentence being false to its being true cannot be reconstructed in the formalism. From this they conclude that the Liar sentence is simply false and paradox-free. This may be the key to solving the Paradox, but it is not successful if there is no satisfactory response to the complaint that perhaps their reconstruction using that formalism shows more about the inadequacy of the formalism than the proper way out of the paradox.

b. Sentences, Statements, and Propositions

The Liar Paradox can be expressed in terms of sentences, statements, or propositions. We appropriately speak of the sentence, “This sentence is false,” and of the statement that this statement is false, and of the proposition that this proposition is false. Sentences are linguistic expressions whereas statements and propositions are not. When speaking about sentences, we are nearly always speaking about sentence types, not tokens. A token is the sound waves or the ink marks; these are specific collections of molecules. Philosophers do not agree on what a sentence is, but they disagree more about what a statement is, and they disagree even more about what a proposition is.

Despite Quine's famous complaint that there are no propositions because there can be no precise criteria for deciding whether two different sentences are being used to express identical propositions, there are some good reasons why researchers who work on the Liar Paradox should focus on propositions rather than either sentences or statements, but those reasons will not be explored here. [For a discussion, see (Barwise and Etchemendy 1987).] The present article will continue to speak primarily of sentences rather than propositions, though only for the purpose of simplicity.

c. An Ideal Solution to the Liar Paradox

We expect that any seriously proposed solution to the Liar Paradox will offer a better diagnosis of the problem than merely, “It stops the Liar Paradox.” A solution which says, “Quit using language” also will stop the Liar Paradox, but the Liar Paradox can be stopped by making more conservative changes than this. Hopefully any proposal to refine our semantic principles will be conservative for another reason: We want to minimize the damage; we want to minimize the amount and drastic nature of the changes because, all other things being equal, simple and intuitive semantic principles are to be preferred to complicated and less intuitive semantic principles. The same goes for revision of a concept or revision of a logic.

Ideally, we would like for a proposed solution to the Liar Paradox to provide a solution to all the versions of the Liar Paradox, such as the Strengthened Liar Paradox, the version that led to Buridan’s proof of God’s existence, and the contingent versions of the Liar Paradoxes. The solution should solve the paradox both for natural languages and formal languages, or provide a good explanation of why the paradox can be treated properly only in a formal language. The contingent versions of the Liar Paradox are going to be especially troublesome because if the production of the paradox doesn't depend only on something intrinsic to the sentence but also depends on what circumstances occur in the world, then there needs to be a detailed description of when those circumstances are troublesome and when they are not, and why.

It would be ideal if we had both a solution to the Liar Paradox and also to Curry's Paradox, another paradox that turns on self-reference but not on negation. Curry's Paradox will not be explored in this article.

It would also be reasonable to tell us how important self-reference is to the Liar Paradox. In the late 20th century, Stephen Yablo produced a semantic paradox that, he claims, shows that neither self-reference nor circularity is an essential feature of all the Liar paradoxes. In his paradox, there apparently is no way to coherently assign a truth value to any of the sentences in the countably infinite sequence of sentences of the form, “None of the subsequent sentences are true.” Imagine an unending line of people who say:

1. Everybody after me is lying.

2. Everybody after me is lying.

3. Everybody after me is lying.


Ask yourself whether the first person's sentence in the sequence is true or false. Notice that no sentence overtly refers to itself. To produce the paradox it is crucial that the line of speakers be infinite. There is controversy in the literature about whether the paradox actually contains a hidden appeal to self-reference or circularity. See (Beall 2001) for more discussion.

An important goal for the best solution, or solutions, to the Liar Paradox is to offer us a deeper understanding of how our semantic concepts and principles worked to produce the Paradox in the first place, especially if a solution to the Paradox requires changing or at least clarifying them. We want to understand the concepts of truth, reference, and negation that are involved in the Paradox. In addition to these, there are the subsidiary principles and related notions of denial, definability, naming, meaning, predicate, property, presupposition, antecedent, and operating on prior sentences to form newer meaningful ones rather than merely newer grammatical ones. We would like to know what limits there are on all these notions and mechanisms, and how one impacts another.

What are the important differences among the candidates for bearers of truth? The leading candidates are sentences, propositions, statements, claims, and utterances. Is one primary, while the others are secondary or derivative? And we would like know a great deal more about truth, especially truth, but also falsehood, and the related notions of fact, situation and state of affairs. We want to better understand what a language is and what the relationship is between an interpreted formal language and a natural language, relative to different purposes. Finally, it would be instructive to learn how the Liar Paradoxes are related to all the other paradoxes. That may be a lot of ask, but then our civilization does have considerable time before the Sun expands and vaporizes our little planet.

d. Should Classical Logic be Revised?

An important question regarding the Liar Paradox is: What is the relationship between a solution to the Paradox for (interpreted) formal languages and a solution to the Paradox for natural languages? There is significant disagreement on this issue. Is appeal to a formal language a turn away from the original problem, and so just changing the subject? Can one say we are still on the subject when employing a formal language because a natural language contains implicitly within it some formal language structure? Or should we be in the business of building an ideal language to replace natural language for the purpose of philosophical study?

Do we always reason informally in a semantically closed language, namely ordinary English? Or is it not clear what logic there is in English, and perhaps we should conclude from the Liar Paradox that the logic of English cannot be standard logic but must be one that restricts the explosion that occurs due to our permitting the deduction of anything whatsoever from a contradiction? Should we say English really has truth gaps or perhaps occasional truth gluts (sentences that are both true and false)?

Or instead can a formal language be defended on the ground that natural language is inconsistent and the formal language is showing the best that can be done rigorously? Can sense even be made of the claim that a natural language is inconsistent, for is not consistency a property only of languages with a rigorous structure, namely formal languages and not natural languages? Should we say people can reason inconsistently in natural language without declaring the natural language itself to be inconsistent? This article raises, but will not resolve, these questions, although some are easier to answer than others.

Many of the most important ways out of the Liar Paradox recommend revising classical formal logic. Classical logic is the formal logic known to introductory logic students as "predicate logic" in which, among other things, (i) all sentences of the formal language have exactly one of two possible truth values (TRUE, FALSE), (ii) the rules of inference allow one to deduce any sentence from an inconsistent set of assumptions, (iii) all predicates are totally defined on the range of the variables, and (iv) the formal semantics is the one invented by Tarski that provided the first precise definition of truth for a formal language in its metalanguage. A few philosophers of logic argue against any revision of classical logic by saying it is the incumbent formalism that should be accepted unless an alternative is required (probably it is believed to be incumbent because of its remarkable success in expressing most of modern mathematical inference). Still, most other philosophers argue that classical logic is not the incumbent which must remain in office unless an opponent can dislodge it. Instead, the office has always been vacant (for the purpose of examining natural language and its paradoxes).

Some philosophers object to revising classical logic if the purpose in doing so is merely to find a way out of the Paradox. They say that philosophers shouldn’t build their theories by attending to the queer cases. There are more pressing problems in the philosophy of logic and language than finding a solution to the Paradox, so any treatment of it should wait until these problems have a solution. From the future resulting theory which solves those problems, one could hope to deduce a solution to the Liar Paradox. However, for those who believe the Paradox is not a minor problem but is one deserving of immediate attention, there can be no waiting around until the other problems of language are solved. Perhaps the investigation of the Liar Paradox will even affect the solutions to those other problems.

3. The Main Ways Out

There have been many systematic proposals for ways out of the Liar Paradox. Below is a representative sample of five of the main ways out.

a. Russell’s Type Theory

Bertrand Russell said natural language is incoherent, but its underlying sensible part is an ideal formal language (such as the applied predicate logic of Principia Mathematica). He agreed with Henri Poincaré that the source of the Liar trouble is its use of self-reference. Russell wanted to rule out self-referential sentences as being ungrammatical or not well-formed in his ideal language, and in this way solve the Liar Paradox.

In 1908 in his article “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types” that is reprinted in (Russell 1956, p. 79), Russell solves the Liar with his ramified theory of types. This is a formal language involving an infinite hierarchy of, among other things, orders of propositions:

If we now revert to the contradictions, we see at once that some of them are solved by the theory of types. Whenever ‘all propositions’ are mentioned, we must substitute ‘all propositions of order n’, where it is indifferent what value we give to n, but it is essential that n should have some value. Thus when a man says ‘I am lying’, we must interpret him as meaning: ‘There is a proposition of order n, which I affirm, and which is false’. This is a proposition of order n+1; hence the man is not affirming any propositions of order n; hence his statement is false, and yet its falsehood does not imply, as that of ‘I am lying’ appeared to do, that he is making a true statement. This solves the liar.

Russell’s implication is that the informal Liar Sentence is meaningless because it has no appropriate translation into his formal language since an attempted translation violates his type theory. This theory is one of his formalizations of the Vicious-Circle Principle: Whatever involves all of a collection must not be one of the collection. Russell believed that violations of this principle are the root of all the logical paradoxes.

His solution to the Liar Paradox has the drawback that it places so many subscript restrictions on what can refer to what. It is unfortunate that the Russell hierarchy requires even the apparently harmless self-referential sentences “This sentence is in English” and "This sentence is not in Italian" to be syntactically ill-formed. The type theory also rules out saying that legitimate terms must have a unique type, or that properties have the property of belonging to exactly one category in the hierarchy of types, which, if we step outside the theory of types, seems to be true about the theory of types. Bothered by this, Tarski took a different approach to the Liar Paradox.

b. Tarski’s Hierarchy of Meta-Languages

Reflection on the Liar Paradox suggests that either informal English (or any other natural language) is not semantically closed or, if it is semantically closed as it appears to be, then it is inconsistent—assuming for the moment that it does make sense to apply the term "inconsistent" to a natural language with a vague structure. Because of the vagueness of natural language, Tarski quit trying to find the paradox-free structure within natural languages and concentrated on developing formal languages that did not allow the deduction of a contradiction, but which diverge from natural language "as little as possible." Tarski emphasized that we should not be investigating a language-unspecific concept of truth, but only truth for a specific formal language. Many other philosophers of logic have not drawn Tarski’s pessimistic conclusion (about not being able to solve the Liar Paradox for natural language). W. V. O. Quine, in particular, argued that informal English can be considered to implicitly contain the hierarchy of Tarski’s metalanguages. This hierarchy is the tool Tarski used to solve the Liar Paradox for formal languages, although he gave no other justification for distinguishing a language from its metalanguage.

One virtue of Tarski's way out of the Paradox is that it does permit the concept of truth to be applied to sentences that involve the concept of truth, provided we apply level subscripts to the concept of truth and follow the semantic rule that any subscript inside a pair of quotation marks is smaller than the subscript outside but still within the sentence; any violation of this rule produces a meaningless, ungrammatical formal sentence, but not a false one. The language of level 1 is the meta-language of the object language in level 0. Level 0 sentences don't contain truth or similar terms, but would contain, say, "Paris is the capital of France." The sentence saying this level 0 sentence is true occurs in level 1. It would be: "'Paris is the capital of France' is true0."

The rule for subscripts stops the formation of both the Classical Liar Sentence and the Strengthened Liar Sentence anywhere within the hierarchy. The subscripting also stops paradoxical chains that start as follows:

The next sentence is true.

The previous sentence is false.

Another virtue of the Quine-Tarski way out is that it provides a way out of the Yablo Paradox.

Russell's solution calls “This sentence is in English” ill-formed, but Tarski's solution does not, so that feature is also virtue of Tarski's way out. Tarski allows some self-reference.

Tarski's clever treatment of the Liar Paradox unfortunately has drawbacks. English has a single word “true,” but Tarski is replacing this with an infinite sequence of truth-like predicates, each of which is satisfied by the truths only of the language below it. Intuitively, a more global truth predicate should be expressible in the language it applies to, so Tarski’s theory cannot make formal sense of the true remark, “The Liar Sentence implies that it itself is false.” One hopes to be able to talk truly about one’s own semantic theory. The Tarski way out does not allow us even to say that all sentences are true or not true.

Despite these restrictions and despite the unintuitive and awkward hierarchy, Quine defends Tarski's way out as the best of the ways. Like Tarski, he prefers to speak of the Antinomy instead of the Paradox. Here is Quine's defense:

Revision of a conceptual scheme is not unprecedented. It happens in a small way with each advance in science, and it happens in a big way with the big advances, such as the Copernican revolution and the shift from Newtonian mechanics to Einstein's theory of relativity. We can hope in time even to get used to the biggest such changes and to find the new schemes natural. There was a time when the doctrine that the earth revolves around the sun was called the Copernican paradox, even by the men who accepted it. And perhaps a time will come when truth locutions without implicit subscripts, or like safeguards, will really sound as nonsensical as the antinomies show them to be. (Quine 1976)

 Tarski adds to the defense by stressing that:

The languages (either the formalized languages or—what is more frequently the case—the portions of everyday language) which are used in scientific discourse do not have to be semantically closed. (Tarski, 1944)

(Kripke 1975) criticized Tarski’s way out for its inability to handle contingent versions of the Liar Paradox such as one that begins with

It’s raining and this sentence is false

because Tarski cannot describe the contingency. That is, Tarski's solution does not provide a way to specify the circumstances in which a sentence leads to a paradox and the other circumstances in which that same sentence is paradox-free.

Putnam criticized Tarski's way out for another reason:

The paradoxical aspect of Tarski’s theory, indeed of any hierarchical theory, is that one has to stand outside the whole hierarchy even to formulate the statement that the hierarchy exists. But what is this “outside place”—“informal language”—supposed to be? It cannot be “ordinary language,” because ordinary language, according to Tarski, is semantically closed and hence inconsistent. But neither can it be a regimented language, for no regimented language can make semantic generalizations about itself or about languages on a higher level than itself. (Putnam 1990, 13)

Within the formal languages, we cannot say, “Every language has true sentences,” even though outside the hierarchy this is clearly a true remark about the hierarchy.

c. Kripke’s Hierarchy of Interpretations

Saul Kripke was the first person to emphasize that the reasoning of ordinary speakers often can produce a Liar Paradox. Statement (1) below can do so. Quoting from (Kripke 1975),

Consider the ordinary statement, made by Jones:

(1) Most (i.e., a majority) of Nixon's assertions about Watergate are false.

Clearly, nothing is intrinsically wrong with (1), nor is it ill-formed. Ordinarily the truth value of (1) will be ascertainable through an enumeration of Nixon's Watergate-related assertions, and an assessment of each for truth or falsity. Suppose, however, that Nixon's assertions about Watergate are evenly balanced between the true and the false, except for one problematic case,

(2) Everything Jones says about Watergate is true.

Suppose, in addition, that (1) is Jones's sole assertion about Watergate.... Then it requires little expertise to show that (1) and (2) are both paradoxical: they are true if and only if they are false.

The example of (1) points up an important lesson: it would be fruitless to looks for an intrinsic criterion that will enable us to sieve out—as meaningless, or ill-formed—those sentences which lead to paradox.

In that last sentence, Kripke attacks the solutions of Russell and Tarski. The additional lesson to learn from Kripke's example of the Contingent Liar involving Nixon's assertions about Watergate is that if a solution to the Liar Paradox is going to say that certain assertions such as this one fail to have a truth value in some circumstances but not in all circumstances, then the solution should tell us what those circumstances are, other than saying the circumstances are those that lead to a paradox.

Kripke’s way out requires a less radical revision in our semantic principles than does the Russell solution or the Tarski-Quine solution. Kripke retains the intuition that there is a semantically coherent and meaningful Liar Sentence, but argues that it is neither true nor false and so falls into a “truth value gap.” Tarski's Undefinability Theorem does not apply to languages having sentences that are neither true nor false.

Kripke trades Russell's and Tarski's infinite complexity of languages for infinite semantic complexity of a single formal language. He rejects Tarski's infinite hierarchy of meta-languages in favor of one formal language having an infinite hierarchy of partial interpretations. Consider a formal language containing a predicate T for truth (that is, for truth-in-an interpretation, although Kripke allows the interpretation to change throughout the hierarchy). In the base level of the hierarchy, this predicate T is given an interpretation in which it is true of all sentences that do not actually contain the symbol ‘T’. The predicate T is the formal language’s only basic partially-interpreted predicate. Each step up Kripke’s semantic hierarchy is a partial interpretation of the language, and in these interpretations all the basic predicates except one must have their interpretations already fixed in the base level from which the first step up the hierarchy is taken. This one exceptional predicate T is intended to be the truth predicate for the previous lower level.

For example, at the lowest level in the hierarchy we have the (formal equivalent of the) true sentence 7 + 5 = 12. Strictly speaking it is not grammatical in English to say 7 + 5 = 12 is true. More properly we should add quotation marks and say ‘7 + 5 = 12’ is true. In Kripke’s formal language, ‘7 + 5 = 12’ is true at the base level of the hierarchy. Meanwhile, the sentence that says it is true, namely ‘T(‘7+5=12’)’, is not true at that level, although it is true at the next higher level. Unfortunately at this new level, the even more complex sentence ‘T(‘T(‘7+5=12’)’)’ is still not yet true. It will become true at the next higher level. And so goes the hierarchy of interpretations as it attributes truth to more and more sentences involving the concept of truth itself. The extension of T, that is, the class of names of sentences that satisfy T, grows but never contracts as we move up the hierarchy, and it grows by calling more true sentences true. Similarly the anti-extension of T grows but never contracts as more false sentence involving T are correctly said to be false.

Kripke says T eventually becomes a truth predicate for its own level when the interpretation-building reaches the unique lowest fixed point at a countably infinite height in the hierarchyAt a fixed point, no new sentences are declared true or false at the next level, but the language satisfies Tarski’s Convention T, so for this reason many philosophers are sympathetic to Kripke’s claim that T is a truth predicate at that point. At this fixed point, the Liar Sentence still is neither true nor false, and so falls into the truth gap, just as Kripke set out to show. In this way, the Liar Paradox is solved, the formal semantics is coherent, and many of our intuitions about semantics are preserved. Regarding our intuition that is expressed in Convention T, a virtue of Kripke's theory is that, if ‘p’ abbreviates the name of the sentence X, it follows that Tp is true (or false) just in case X is true (or false).

However, there are difficulties with Kripke's way out. The treatment of the Classical Liar stumbles on the Strengthened Liar and reveals why that paradox deserves its name.  For a discussion of why, see (Skyrms 1970) and (Kirkham 1992, pp. 293-4).

Some critics of Kripke's theory say that in the fixed-point the Liar Sentence does not actually contain a real, total truth predicate but rather only a clever restriction on the truth predicate, and so Kripke’s Liar Sentence is not really the Liar Sentence after all; therefore we do not have here a solution to the Liar Paradox. Other philosophers would say this is not a fair criticism of Kripke's theory since Tarski's Convention T, or some other intuitive feature of our concept of truth, must be restricted in some way if we are going to have a formal treatment of truth. What can more easily be agreed upon by the critics is that Kripke's candidate for the Liar sentence falls into the truth gap in Kripke's theory at all levels of his hierarchy, so it is not true in his theory. [We are making this judgment that it is not true from within the meta-language in which sentences are properly said to be true or else not true.] However, in the object language of the theory, one cannot truthfully say this; one cannot say the Liar Sentence is not true since the candidate expression for that, namely ~Ts, is not true, but rather falls into the truth gap.

Robert Martin and Peter Woodruff created the same way out as Kripke, though a few months earlier and in less depth.

d. Barwise and Etchemendy

Another way out says the Liar Sentence is meaningful and is true or else false, but one step of the argument in the Liar Paradox is incorrect (such as the inference from the Liar Sentence’s being false to its being true). Arthur Prior, following the informal suggestions of Jean Buridan and C. S. Peirce, takes this way out and concludes that the Liar Sentence is simply false.  So do Jon Barwise and John Etchemendy, but they go on to present a detailed, formal treatment of the Paradox that depends crucially upon using propositions rather than sentences, although the details of their treatment will not be sketched here. Their treatment says the Liar Sentence is simply false on one interpretation but simply true on another interpretation, and that the argument of the Paradox improperly exploits this ambiguity. The key ambiguity is to conflate the Liar Proposition's negating itself with its denying itself. Similarly, in ordinary language we are not careful to distinguish asserting that a sentence is false and denying that it is true.

Three positive features of their solution are that (i) it is able to solve the Strengthened Liar, (ii) its propositions are always true or false, but never both, and (iii) it shows the way out of paradox both for natural language and interpreted formal language. Yet there is a price to pay. No proposition in their system can be about the whole world, and this restriction is there for no independent reason but only because otherwise we would get a paradox.

e. Paraconsistency

A more radical way out of the Paradox is to argue that the Liar Sentence is both true and false. This solution, a version of dialethism, embraces the contradiction, then tries to limit the damage that is ordinarily a consequence of that embrace. This way out changes the classical rules of semantics and allows, among other things,  the Liar Sentence to be both true and false, and it changes the syntactic rules of classical logic and revises modus ponens to prevent there being a theorem that everything follows from a contradiction: (p&¬p) ⊢ q.

This way out uses a paraconsistent logic. That solution, which was initially promoted mostly by Graham Priest, will not be developed in this article, but it succeeds in avoiding semantic incoherence while offering a formal, detailed treatment of the Paradox. A principal virtue of this treatment is that, unlike with Barwise and Etchemendy's treatment, a sentence can be about the whole world. Critics of this approach to the Liar have complained that it does not  seem to solve the Strengthened Liar Paradox, nor Curry's Paradox; and it does violence to our intuition that sentences can’t be both true and false in the same sense in the same situation. See the last paragraph of "Paradoxes of Self-Reference," for more discussion of using paraconsistency as a way out of the Liar Paradox.

4. Conclusion

Russell, Tarski, Kripke, Priest, Barwise and Etchemendy (among others) deserve credit for providing a philosophical justification for their proposed solutions while also providing a formal treatment in symbolic logic that shows in detail both the character and implications of their proposed solutions. The theories of Russell and of Quine-Tarski do solve the Strengthened Liar, but at the cost of assigning complex “levels” to the relevant sentences, although the Quine-Tarski solution does not take Russell’s radical step of ruling out all self-reference. Kripke’s elegant and careful treatment of the Classical Liar stumbles on the Strengthened Liar and reveals why that paradox deserves its name.  Barwise and Etchemendy’s way out avoids these problems, but it requires accepting the idea that no sentence can be used to say anything about the whole world including the semantics of our language. Priest’s way out requires giving up our intuition that no context-free, unambiguous sentence is both true and false.

The interesting dispute  continues over which is the best way out of the Liar Paradox—the best way to preserve the most important intuitions we have about semantics while avoiding semantic incoherence. In this vein, Hilary Putnam draws the following conclusion:

If you want to say something about the liar sentence, in the sense of being able to give final answers to the questions “Is it meaningful or not? And if it is meaningful, is it true or false? Does it express a proposition or not? Does it have a truth-value or not? And which one?” then you will always fail. In closing, let me say that even if Tarski was wrong (as I believe he was) in supposing that ordinary language is a theory and hence can be described as “consistent” or “inconsistent,” and even if Kripke and others have shown that it is possible to construct languages that contain their own truth-predicates, still, the fact remains that the totality of our desires with respect to how a truth-predicate should behave in a semantically closed language, in particular, our desire to be able to say without paradox of an arbitrary sentence in such a language that it is true, or that it is false, or that it is neither true nor false, cannot be adequately satisfied. The very act of interpreting a language that contains a liar sentence creates a hierarchy of interpretations, and the reflection that this generates does not terminate in an answer to the questions “Is the liar sentence meaningful or meaningless, or if it is meaningful, is it true or false?” (Putnam 2000)

See also Logical Paradoxes.

5. References and Further Reading

For further reading on the Liar Paradox that provides more of an introduction to it while not presupposing a strong background in symbolic logic, the author recommends the article below by Mates, plus the first chapter of the Barwise-Etchemendy book, and then chapter 9 of the Kirkham book. The rest of this bibliography is a list of contributions to research on the Liar Paradox, and all members of the list require the reader to have significant familiarity with the techniques of symbolic logic. In the formal, symbolic tradition, other important researchers in the last quarter of the 20th century were Burge, Gupta, Herzberger, McGee, Parsons, Routley, Skyrms, van Fraassen, and Yablo.

  • Barwise, Jon and John Etchemendy. The Liar: An Essay in Truth and Circularity, Oxford University Press, 1987.
  • Beall, J.C. (2001). “Is Yablo’s Paradox Non-Circular?” Analysis 61, no. 3, pp. 176-87.
  • Burge, Tyler. “Semantical Paradox,” Journal of Philosophy, 76 (1979), 169-198.
  • Dowden, Bradley. “Accepting Inconsistencies from the Paradoxes,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 13 (1984), 125-130.
  • Gupta, Anil. “Truth and Paradox,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 11 (1982), 1-60. Reprinted in Martin (1984), 175-236.
  • Herzberger, Hans. “Paradoxes of Grounding in Semantics,” Journal of Philosophy, 68 (1970), 145-167.
  • Kirkham, Richard. Theories of Truth: A Critical Introduction, MIT Press, 1992.
  • Kripke, Saul. “Outline of a Theory of Truth,” Journal of Philosophy, 72 (1975), 690-716. Reprinted in (Martin 1984).
  • Martin, Robert. The Paradox of the Liar, Yale University Press, Ridgeview Press, 1970. 2nd ed. 1978.
  • Martin, Robert. Recent Essays on Truth and the Liar Paradox, Oxford University Press, 1984.
  • Martin, Robert and Peter Woodruff. “On Representing ‘True-in-L’ in L,” Philosophia, 5 (1975), 217-221.
  • Mates, Benson. “Two Antinomies,” in Skeptical Essays, The University of Chicago Press, 1981, 15-57.
  • McGee, Vann. Truth, Vagueness, and Paradox: An Essay on the Logic of Truth, Hackett Publishing, 1991.
  • Priest, Graham. “The Logic of Paradox,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 8 (1979), 219-241; and “Logic of Paradox Revisited,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 13 (1984), 153-179.
  • Priest, Graham, Richard Routley, and J. Norman (eds.). Paraconsistent Logic: Essays on the Inconsistent, Philosophia-Verlag, 1989.
  • Prior, Arthur. “Epimenides the Cretan,” Journal of Symbolic Logic, 23 (1958), 261-266; and “On a Family of Paradoxes,” Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 2 (1961), 16-32.
  • Putnam, Hilary. Realism with a Human Face, Harvard University Press, 1990.
  • Putnam, Hilary. “Paradox Revisited I: Truth.” In Gila Sher and Richard Tieszen, eds., Between Logic and Intuition: Essays in Honor of Charles Parsons, Cambridge University Press,  (2000), 3-15.
  • Quine, W. V. O. “The Ways of Paradox,” in his The Ways of Paradox and Other Essays, rev. ed., Harvard University Press, 1976.
  • Russell, Bertrand. “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types,” American Journal of Mathematics, 30 (1908), 222-262.
  • Russell, Bertrand. Logic and Knowledge: Essays 1901-1950, ed. by Robert C. Marsh, George Allen & Unwin Ltd. (1956).
  • Skyrms, Brian. “Return of the Liar: Three-valued Logic and the Concept of Truth,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 7 (1970), 153-161.
  • Strawson, P. F. “Truth,” in Analysis, 9, (1949).
  • Tarski, Alfred. “The Concept of Truth in Formalized Languages,” in Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics, pp. 152-278, Clarendon Press, 1956.
  • Tarski, Alfred. “The Semantic Conception of Truth and the Foundations of Semantics,” in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, Vol. 4, No. 3 (1944), 341-376.
  • Van Fraassen, Bas. “Truth and Paradoxical Consequences,” in (Martin 1970).
  • Woodruff, Peter. “Paradox, Truth and Logic Part 1: Paradox and Truth,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 13 (1984), 213-231.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics, Basil Blackwell, 3rd edition, 1978.
  • Yablo, Stephen. (1993). “Paradox without Self-Reference.” Analysis 53: 251-52.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.