The Liar Paradox is an argument that arrives at a contradiction by reasoning about a Liar Sentence. The classical Liar Sentence is the self-referential sentence “This sentence is false.”
Experts in the field of philosophical logic have never agreed on the way out of the trouble despite 2,300 years of attention. Here is the trouble–a sketch of the Liar Argument that reveals the contradiction:
Let L be the classical Liar Sentence. If L is true, then L is false. But we can also establish the converse, as follows. Assume L is false. Because the Liar Sentence is saying precisely that (namely that it is false), the Liar Sentence is true, so L is true. We’ve now shown that L is true if and only if it is false. Since L is one or the other, it is both.
The contradictory result apparently throws us into the lion’s den of semantic incoherence. This article explores the details of the principal ways out of the paradox. Many people, when first encountering the Liar Paradox, react by saying that the Liar Sentence must be meaningless. This popular solution does stop the argument of the paradox, but it is not an adequate solution if it can only answer the question, “Why is the Liar Sentence meaningless?” with the ad hoc remark, “Otherwise we get a paradox.” An adequate solution should offer a more systematic treatment. For example, the sentence, “This sentence is in English,” is very similar to the Liar Sentence. Is it meaningless, too? Apparently not. So, what ingredients of the Liar Sentence make it meaningless while similar sentences such as “This sentence is in English,” are not meaningless? Are disjunctions with the Liar Sentence meaningless? The questions continue, and an adequate solution should address them systematically.
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The Liar Paradox has been discussed continually in philosophy since the middle of the 4th century BCE. The most ancient attribution is to Eubulides of Miletus who included it among a list of seven puzzles. He said, “A man says that he is lying. Is what he says true or false?” Eubulides’ commentary on his puzzle has not been found. An ancient gravestone on the Greek Island of Cos was reported by Athenaeus to contain this poem about the difficulty of solving the paradox:
O Stranger: Philetas of Cos am I,
‘Twas the Liar who made me die,
And the bad nights caused thereby.
Theophrastus, Aristotle’s successor, wrote three papyrus rolls about the Liar Paradox, and the Stoic philosopher Chrysippus wrote six, but their contents are lost in the sands of time. In the New Testament of the Bible, Saint Paul warned, “One of themselves, even a prophet of their own, said that the Cretans are always liars.” Paul, however, gave no indication he recognized anything paradoxical about the Cretan’s remark, but it would be paradoxical if no other Cretan utters a truth and if “liar” means utterer only of falsehoods. Despite various comments on how to solve the paradox, no one suggested that Greek itself was inconsistent; it was the reasoning within Greek that was considered to be inconsistent.
In the late medieval period in Europe, Buridan put the Liar Paradox to devious use with the following proof of the existence of God. It uses the pair of sentences:
None of the sentences in this pair is true.
The only consistent way to assign truth values, that is, to have these two sentence be either true or false, requires making “God exists” be true. So, Buridan has “proved” that God does exist.
There are many other versions of the Paradox. Some liar paradoxes begin with a chain of sentences, no one of which is self-referential:
The following sentence is true.
The following sentence is true.
The following sentence is true.
The first sentence in this list is false.
The Strengthened Liar Paradox begins with the Strengthened Liar Sentence
This sentence is not true, that is, it is false or meaningless.
This version is called “Strengthened” because some promising solutions to the Classical Liar Paradox beginning with (L) fail completely when faced with the Strengthened Liar. So, finding one’s way out of the Strengthened Liar is the acid test of a successful solution.
There are also Contingent Liars which depend upon what occurs in the empirical world. Suppose that the last sentence in today’s edition of The New York Times newspaper is:
The last sentence in tomorrow’s edition of The New York Times newspaper is true.
Was that sentence grammatical? Was it meaningful? Was it true or false, even if we don’t know which at the moment? The common sense answers are “yes” to all these questions. Perhaps we should not retain those intuitive answers tomorrow when the Times‘s presses print a newspaper whose last sentence is
The last sentence in yesterday’s edition of The New York Times newspaper is not true.
If we adopt the metaphor of a paradox as being an argument which starts from the home of seemingly true assumptions and which travels down the garden path of seemingly valid steps into the den of a contradiction, then a solution to the paradox has to find something wrong with the home, find something wrong with the garden path, or find a way to live within the den. Less metaphorically, the main kinds of ways out of the Paradox are the following: (a) The Liar Sentence isn’t grammatical. (b) The Liar Sentence isn’t meaningful. (c) The Liar Sentence is grammatical and meaningful but isn’t true or false. (d) There is some other error in one of the steps of the argument that leads to the contradiction. (e) The Liar Sentence is both true and false. Two philosophers might take one of these ways out but for very different reasons, and they might offer different changes in our naive system of beliefs and concepts in order to take this way out.
To put the Liar Paradox in perspective, it is essential to appreciate why such an apparently trivial problem in fact is a deep problem. Suppose we ask the larger question: What is truth? As a question about what are the significant paths of life to be followed or the significant things to know in order to have the best grasp on reality, the question is just too difficult, and also too vague, to be a center of attention for the <a href=”../analytic/”>analytic philosophers</a> of the present age. However, as a question asking simply for general characteristics of all true sentences, the question is more amenable to solution. Nevertheless, it is still a very difficult one. By concentrating on truth’s logical liaisons, Aristotle offered what many philosophers consider to be a partially correct answer to our question about truth. Stripped of its overtones suggesting a correspondence theory of truth, Aristotle proposed what is essentially sentence (T):
(T) A declarative sentence is true if and only if what it says is so.
If pairs of quotation marks serve to name a sentence, then (T) requires that “It is snowing” be true just in case it is snowing. Similarly, if the sentence about snow were named with the numeral 88 inside a pair of parentheses, then (88) would be true just in case it is snowing. What could be less controversial? Unfortunately, this seemingly correct, but trivial partial response to our question “What is truth?” is neither obviously correct nor trivial; and the resolution of the difficulty is still an open problem in philosophical logic. Why is that? The brief answer is that (T) can be used to produce the Liar Paradox. The longer answer refers to Tarski’s Undefinability Theorem of 1936, as we shall see.
This article began with a mere sketch of the Liar Argument using sentence (L). To appreciate the various proposed solutions to the paradox, and the central role of (T), we need to examine more than just a sketch of the argument. The argument actually requires the following assumptions in addition to (T):
(2) Any declarative sentence “S” says that S.
(3) The Liar Sentence L is a grammatical and meaningful declarative sentence.
(4) The Liar Sentence L is true or false.
(5) The usual naming convention holds so that
the phrase “This sentence” in L refers to L, and
(L) = “This sentence is false”.
Tarski added precision to convention (T) and to these other assumptions by focusing not on English directly but on a classical formal language capable of expressing arithmetic. Here the difficulties produced by the Liar Argument became much clearer; and, very surprisingly, he was able to prove that the assumptions lead to semantic incoherence. Tarski pointed out that the crucial, unacceptable assumption is (3). Tarski reasoned this way: For there to be a Liar Sentence in the language, there must be a definable notion of “is true” which holds for the true sentences and fails to hold for the other sentences. If there were such a global truth predicate, then the predicate “is a false sentence” would also be definable and [here is where we need the power of arithmetic] a Liar Sentence would exist, namely ∃x(Qx & ~Tx), where T is the monadic, global truth predicate and Q is a monadic predicate satisfied only by the name [Gödel number] of the Liar Sentence. But if so, then from (T), (2), (3), (4) and (5), one can deduce a contradiction.
This deduction of Tarski’s is a formal analog of the informal Liar Argument. The contradictory result tells us that the argument began with a false assumption. Because (T), (2), (4), and (5) are essential to what we call a “classical formal language,” the mistaken assumption is (3), and the only problem here is the assumption that the global truth predicate can be well-defined. So, Tarski has proved that truth is not definable in a classical language–thus the name “Undefinability Theorem.” Tarski’s theorem establishes that classically interpreted languages capable of expressing arithmetic cannot contain a global truth predicate. A language containing its own global truth predicate is said to be semantically closed, so his theorem implies that classical formal languages with the power to express arithmetic cannot be semantically closed, and consequently cannot have a Liar sentence. This suggests that English itself may not be semantically closed, or, if English is closed, then it is self-contradictory. Tarski himself drew the latter conclusion, so he quit trying to find the paradox-free structure underlying natural languages and concentrated on developing formal languages that did not allow the deduction of the contradiction. Many other philosophers of logic have not drawn Tarski’s pessimistic conclusion from his theorem.
For these optimists, there are four, main, detailed and coherent ways out of the Liar Paradox. Any paradox can be treated by abandoning enough of its crucial assumptions. For the Liar it is very interesting to consider which assumptions to abandon, and why those. Here are the four ways out:
- The Liar Sentence L is meaningless, so the Liar Argument can’t even get started because its main assumption (that the Liar Sentence exists or is meaningful) is faulty. Natural language is incoherent, and its underlying sensible structure is that of an infinite hierarchy of levels. Because the Liar Sentence would have to reside on more than one level simultaneously if it were a legitimate sentence, it’s not really a legitimate sentence. This way out of the paradox is taken by Russell in his ramified theory of types and, following Tarski, by Quine in his hierarchy of meta-languages. For Russell, the referential phrase “This sentence” in L is the culprit because the phrase is not allowed to refer to the sentence in which the phrase itself occurs. For Quine, instead, the culprit is the phrase “is false” in L because the phrase must be satisfied by sentences in a language lower in the hierarchy and not by the very sentence in which the phrase occurs.
- Kripke, on the other hand, retains the intuition that there is a meaningful Liar Sentence, but argues that it is neither true nor false and so falls into a “truth value gap.” The Liar Sentence lacks a classical truth value as does the odd sentence “The present king of France is bald.” Kripke trades infinite syntactic complexity for infinite semantic complexity. Kripke rejects the infinite hierarchy of meta-languages underlying English in favor of one formal object language having an infinite hierarchy of partial interpretations. The truth predicate is the formal language’s only basic partially-interpreted predicate. Each step in Kripke’s semantic hierarchy is an interpretation of the language, and in these interpretations all the basic predicates except one must have their interpretations already fixed in the base level from which the first step is taken. This one exceptional predicate is intended to be the truth predicate for the previous level. It becomes a truth predicate for its own level when the inductive interpretation-building reaches the so-called fixed point. Each step uses all the sentences which had their truth values fixed at the lower steps in order to help fix the truth values of semantically more complex sentences, for example, to fix the truth value of sentences with even longer chains of nested truth predicates. The Liar Sentence, even up at the infinite semantic height of the lowest fixed point, still isn’t true or false. But at the fixed point, the language satisfies Tarski’s Convention (T).
- The third way out says the Liar Sentence is meaningful and is true or else false, but one step of the argument in the Liar Paradox is incorrect (such as the move from the falsehood of the Liar Sentence to its truth). Prior, following the informal suggestions of Buridan and Peirce, takes this way out and concludes that the Liar Sentence is simply false. So do Barwise and Etchemendy.
- A fourth and more radical way out of the paradox is to argue that semantic incoherence is not necessarily caused by letting the Liar Sentence be both true and false. This solution embraces the contradiction, then tries to limit the damage that is ordinarily a consequence of that embrace. This way out uses a paraconsistent logic.
There are many suggestions for how to deal with the Liar Paradox, but most are never developed to the point of giving a formal, symbolic theory. Some give philosophical arguments for why this or that conceptual reform is plausible as a way out of paradox, but then don’t show that their ideas can be carried through in a rigorous way. Usually it appears that a formal treatment won’t be successful. Other attempts at solutions will take the formal route and then require changes in standard formalisms so that a formal analog of the Liar Paradox’s argument fails, but then the attempted solution offers no philosophical argument to back up these formal changes. A decent theory of truth showing the way out of the Liar Paradox requires both a coherent formalism (or at least a systematic theory of some sort) and a philosophical justification backing it up. The point of the philosophical justification is an unveiling of some hitherto unnoticed or unaccepted rule of language for all sentences of some category which has been violated by the argument of the paradox.
It is to the credit of Russell, Quine, Kripke, Barwise and Etchemendy (among others) that they provide a philosophical justification for their solutions while also providing a formal treatment in symbolic logic that shows in detail both the character and implications of their proposed solution. Kripke’s elegant and careful treatment of L stumbles on the Strengthened Liar and reveals why that argument deserves its name. The theories of Russell and of Quine do solve the Strengthened Liar, but at the cost of assigning complex “levels” to the relevant sentences, although the Quine solution does not take Russell’s radical step of ruling out all self-reference. Barwise and Etchemendy’s solution avoids these problems, but it requires accepting the idea that no sentence can be used to say anything about the whole world. In the formal, symbolic tradition, other important researchers in the last quarter of the 20th century were Burge, Gupta, Herzberger, McGee, Routley, Skyrms, van Fraassen, and Yablo. Martin and Woodruff created the same solution as Kripke, though a few months earlier. Dowden and Priest first showed how to embrace contradiction, although Priest provided the most systematic development of this way out.
Leading solutions to the Liar Paradox all have a common approach, the “systematic approach.” The solutions agree that the Liar Paradox represents a serious challenge to our understanding the logic of natural language, and they agree that we must go back and systematically reform or clarify some of our original beliefs in order to solve the paradox. This need to have systematic approach has been seriously challenged by Wittgenstein. He says one should try to overcome ”the superstitious fear and dread of mathematicians in the face of a contradiction.” The proper way to respond to any paradox is by an ad hoc reaction and not by any systematic treatment designed to cure both it and any future ills. Symptomatic relief is sufficient. It may appear legitimate, at first, to admit that the Liar Sentence is meaningful and also that it is true or false, but the Liar Paradox shows that one should retract this admission and either just not use the Liar Sentence in any arguments, or say it is not really a sentence, or at least say it is not one that is either true or false. Wittgenstein is not particularly concerned with which choice is made. And, whichever choice is made, it needn’t be backed up by any theory that shows how to systematically incorporate the choice. He treats the whole situation cavalierly and unsystematically. After all, he says, the language can’t really be incoherent because we’ve been successfully using it all along, so why all this “fear and dread”? Most logicians want systematic removal of the paradox, but Wittgenstein is content to say that we may need to live with this paradox and to agree never to utter the Liar Sentence, especially if it seems that removal of the contradiction could have worse consequences.
Influenced by Wittgenstein, P. F. Strawson has promoted the performative theory of truth. Strawson has argued that the proper way out of the Liar Paradox is to re-examine how the term “truth” is really used by speakers. When we say some proposition is true, we aren’t making a statement about the proposition. For example, we are not ascribing a property to the proposition such as the property of correspondence, or coherence, or usefulness. When we call a proposition “true” we are approving it, or praising it, or admitting it, or condoning it. We are performing an action. Similarly, when we say to our sister, “I promise to pay you fifty dollars,” we aren’t ascribing some property to the proposition, “I pay you fifty dollars.” Rather, we are performing the act of promising. For Strawson, when speakers utter the Liar Sentence, they aren’t saying something true or false; they are attempting to praise something that isn’t there, as if they were saying “Ditto” when no one has spoken. The person who utters the Liar Sentence is making a pointless utterance. The Liar Sentence is grammatical, but it isn’t being used to express a proposition and so is not something from which a contradiction can be derived.
Some of the solutions to the Liar Paradox require a revision in classical logic, the formal logic in which sentences of a formal language have exactly two possible truth values (TRUE, FALSE), and in which the usual rules of inference allow one to deduce anything from an inconsistent set of assumptions. Kripke’s revision uses a 3-valued logic with the truth values TRUE, FALSE and NEITHER. Some logicians argue that classical logic is not the incumbent which must remain in office unless an opponent can dislodge it, although this is gospel for other philosophers of logic (probably because of the remarkable success of two-valued logic in expressing most of modern mathematical inference). Instead, the office has always been vacant for natural language.
Other philosophers object to revising classical logic merely to find a way out of the Paradox. They say that philosophers shouldn’t build their theories by attending to the queer cases. There are more pressing problems in the philosophy of logic and language than finding a solution to the Paradox, so any treatment of it should wait until these problems have a solution. From the future resulting theory which solves those problems, one could hope to deduce a solution to the Liar Paradox. However, for those who believe the Paradox is not a minor problem but one deserving of immediate attention, there can be no waiting around until the other problems of language are solved. Perhaps the investigation of the Liar Paradox will even affect the solutions to those other problems.
For more discussion of the Liar Paradox see the article Logical Paradoxes.
For further reading on the Liar Paradox that provides more of an introduction to it and its solutions while not presupposing a strong background in symbolic logic, the author recommends the article below by Mates, plus the first chapter of the Barwise-Etchemendy book, and then chapter 9 of the Kirkham book. The rest of this bibliography is a list of contributions to research on the Liar Paradox, and nearly all require the reader to have significant familiarity with the techniques of symbolic logic.
- Barwise, Jon and John Etchemendy. The Liar: An Essay in Truth and Circularity, Oxford University Press, 1987. For a brief overview of their original solution to the Liar, see Kirkham, 1992, pp. 298-306.
- Burge, Tyler. “Semantical Paradox,” Journal of Philosophy, 76 (1979), 169-198.
- Dowden, Bradley. “Accepting Inconsistencies from the Paradoxes,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 13 (1984), 125-130.
- Gupta, Anil. “Truth and Paradox,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 11 (1982), 1-60. Reprinted in Martin (1984), 175-236.
- Herzberger, Hans. “Paradoxes of Grounding in Semantics,” Journal of Philosophy, 68 (1970), 145-167.
- Kirkham, Richard. Theories of Truth: A Critical Introduction, MIT Press, 1992.
- Kripke, Saul. “Outline of a Theory of Truth,” Journal of Philosophy, 72 (1975), 690-716. Reprinted in Martin (1984).
- Martin, Robert. The Paradox of the Liar, Yale University Press, Ridgeview Press, 1970. 2nd ed. 1978.
- Martin, Robert. Recent Essays on Truth and the Liar Paradox, Oxford University Press, 1984.
- Martin, Robert and Peter Woodruff. “On Representing ‘True-in-L’ in L,” Philosophia, 5 (1975), 217-221.
- Mates, Benson. “Two Antinomies,” in Skeptical Essays, The University of Chicago Press, 1981, 15-57.
- McGee, Vann. Truth, Vagueness, and Paradox: An Essay on the Logic of Truth, Hackett Publishing, 1991.
- Priest, Graham. “The Logic of Paradox,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 8 (1979), 219-241; and “Logic of Paradox Revisited,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 13 (1984), 153-179.
- Priest, Graham, Richard Routley, and J. Norman (eds.). Paraconsistent Logic: Essays on the Inconsistent, Philosophia-Verlag, 1989.
- Prior, Arthur. “Epimenides the Cretan,” Journal of Symbolic Logic, 23 (1958), 261-266; and “On a Family of Paradoxes,” Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 2 (1961), 16-32.
- Quine, W. V. “The Ways of Paradox,” in his The Ways of Paradox and Other Essays, rev. ed., Harvard University Press, 1976.
- Russell, Bertrand. “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types,” American Journal of Mathematics, 30 (1908), 222.
- Skyrms, Brian. “Return of the Liar: Three-valued Logic and the Concept of Truth,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 7 (1970), 153-161.
- Strawson, P. F. “Truth,” in Analysis, 9, (1949).
- Tarski, Alfred. “The Concept of Truth in Formalized Languages,” in Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics, pp. 152-278, Clarendon Press, 1956.
- Van Fraassen, Bas. “Truth and Paradoxical Consequences,” in Martin (1970).
- Woodruff, Peter. “Paradox, Truth and Logic Part 1: Paradox and Truth,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 13 (1984), 213-231.
- Wittgenstein, Ludwig. Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics, Basil Blackwell, 3rd edition, 1978.
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