Historically, philosophers have had relatively little to say about the family. This is somewhat surprising, given the pervasive presence and influence of the family upon both individuals and social life. Most philosophers who have addressed issues related to the parent-child relationship—Kant and Aristotle, for example—have done so in a fairly terse manner. At the end of the twentieth century, this changed. Contemporary philosophers have begun to explore, in a substantial way, a range of issues connected with the rights and obligations of parents. For example, if there are parental rights, what is their foundation? Most contemporary philosophers reject the notion that children are there parents’ property and thus reject the notions that parents have rights to their children and over their children. Some philosophers argue for a biological basis of parental rights, while others focus on the best interests of children or a social contract as the grounds of such rights. Still others reject outright the notion that parents have rights, as parents. Some do so because of skepticism about the structure of the putative rights of parents, while others reject the idea of parental rights in view of the nature and extent of the rights of children.
The claim that parents have obligations, as parents, is less controversial. Nevertheless, there is disagreement about the basis of such obligations. Apart from biological, best interests, and social contract views, there is also the causal view of parental obligations, which includes the claim that those who bring a child into existence are thereby obligated to care for that child. Philosophers are concerned not merely with these theoretical questions related to parental rights and obligations; they also focus their attention on practical questions in this realm of human life. There are many distinct positions to consider with respect to medical decision making, the autonomy of children, child discipline, the licensing of parents, and the propriety of different forms of moral, political, and religious upbringing of children. While both the theoretical and practical aspects of the rights and obligations of parents are receiving increased attention, there remains much room for substantial work to be done on this important topic.
What is a parent? The answer one gives to this question will likely include, either implicitly or explicitly, particular assumptions about the grounds of parental rights and obligations. Parenthood and biological parenthood are often seen as synonymous. But of course, adoptive parents are also parents by virtue of assuming the parental role. This commonsense fact opens the door for a consideration not only of the possible connections between biology and parenthood, but other issues as well, such as the role of consent in acquiring parental rights and obligations, which then leads to a host of other questions that are not only theoretically important, but existentially significant as well. What does it mean for a parent to possess rights, as a parent? Why think that such rights exist? What obligations do parents have to their children? What is the role of the state, if any, concerning the parent-child relationship? These questions are central for our understanding of the moral, social, personal, and political dimensions of the parent-child relationship.
When considering the rights of parents, both positive and negative rights are involved. A negative right is a right of non-interference, such as the right to make medical decisions on behalf of one’s child without intervention from the state. A positive right in this context is a right to have the relevant interests one has as a parent in some way promoted by the state. For example, some argue that parents have a right to maternity and paternity leave, funded in part or whole by the state. Regarding parental obligations, the focus in what follows will be on moral obligations, rather than legal ones, with a few exceptions. A parent might have a moral obligation to her child to provide her with experiences such as musical education or opportunities to participate in sports that enrich her life, without being legally bound to do so. In this section, the various accounts of the grounds of the moral rights and obligations of parents will be discussed.
An advocate of proprietarianism holds that children are the property of their parents, and that this serves to ground parental rights (and perhaps obligations). Proprietarianists argue, given that parents in some sense produce their children, that children are the property of their parents in some sense of the term.. Aristotle held this type of view, insofar as he takes children and slaves to be property of the father (Nicomachean Ethics, 1134b). At least one contemporary philosopher, Jan Narveson, has argued that children are the property of their parents, and that this grounds parental rights. This does not relieve parents of having obligations regarding their children even though children do not yet possess rights (Narveson 1988). For Narveson, how parents treat their children is limited by how that treatment impacts other rights-holders. Nevertheless, parents have the right to direct the lives of their children, because they exerted themselves as producers, bringing children into existence. A different sort of proprietarianism centers on the idea that parents own themselves, including their genetic material, and since children are a product of that material it follows that parents have rights over their genetic offspring. Critics of proprietarianism primarily reject it on the grounds that it is immoral to conceive of children as property. Children are human beings, and as such, cannot rightly be owned by other human beings. It follows from this that children are not the property of their parents. Most contemporary philosophers reject proprietarianism.
Historically, proprietarianism is often connected with absolutism, which is the idea that parental authority over children is in an important sense, limitless. Absolutists held that fathers have the right to decide whether or not their child lives or dies. This view is no longer advocated in the contemporary philosophical literature, of course, but in the past was thought by some that this extreme level of parental authority was morally justified. Some advocates of this view thought that because a child is the creation of the parent, that absolutism follows. Other reasons offered in support of this view include the notion that both divine and natural law grant such authority to parents; this level of authority fosters moral development in the young by preventing them from exemplifying vice; and the idea that the family is a model of the commonwealth, such that as children obey their father, they will also learn to obey the commonwealth (Bodin 1576/1967). According to Bodin The natural affection that fathers have towards their children will prevent them from abusing their authority,. Critics of absolutism reject it for reasons similar to those offered against proprietarianism. They claim that is clearly immoral to grant parents the power to end the lives of their children. While some absolutists seek to ground this power in the fact that the parent created the child in question, critics argue that the possession and exercise of this power over one’s children simply does not follow from the fact that one created those children.
Is a biological relationship between a parent and child necessary or sufficient for parenthood? That is, does biology in some sense ground the rights and obligations of parents? Two types of biological accounts of parenthood have emerged which are more detailed than those which emphasize the general value of biology in the parent-child relationship. Advocates of the first type emphasize the genetic connection between parent and child, while advocates of the second take gestation to be crucial. The advocates of the genetic account believe that the genetic connection between parent and child grounds parenthood. The fact that a particular child is derived from the genetic material of an individual or is “tied by blood” to that individual is what yields parental rights and obligations. A person has rights and obligations with respect to a particular child insofar as that person and the child share the requisite DNA. Historically speaking, perceived blood ties have been decisive in the transfer of wealth, property, and power from one generation to the next.
Critics of genetic accounts claim that several of the arguments advanced for these accounts are flawed in important ways. For instance, those who hold that the genetic connection is necessary for parental rights and obligations must deal with counterexamples to the claim, such as adoptive parenthood and step-parenthood. In addition, if two adults who are identical twins have the same level of genetic connection to a child it does not follow that both are that child’s mother or father, though at least some genetic accounts would seem committed to such a view.
Gestational accounts of parental rights and obligations, in their strongest from, include the claim that gestation is necessary for parental rights. On this view, men only acquire parental rights and obligations via marriage, the gestational mother consenting to co-parenthood with the male, or by the mother allowing him to adopt her child. Some gestational accounts—including those which only include the claim that gestation is sufficient for parental rights or gives the mother a prima facie claim to such rights—focus on the risk, effort, and discomfort that gestational mothers undergo as that which grounds their claims to parenthood. Others center on the intimacy that obtains and the attachment which occurs during gestation between the mother and child as the basis for a claim to parenthood. A final type of gestationalism is consequentialist, insofar as advocates of this view hold that when there is a conflict concerning custody between gestational and genetic mothers, a social and legal policy favoring gestational mother will have more favorable consequences for mothers and their children. It is argued that an emphasis on gestation, and preference for gestational mothers in such cases, would increase women’s social standing by emphasizing their freedom to make such choices concerning health on behalf of themselves and their children. This in turn will have the likely result of benefitting the health and welfare of such mothers and their children. Positive inducements are preferable to punitive sanctions, given the positive consequences of the former. This view also implies that the claims to parenthood of gestational mothers carry more weight than those of fathers, at least when disputes over custody arise.
Critics of gestationalism reply that it is objectionably counterintuitive, insofar as it is inconsistent with the belief that mothers and fathers have equal rights and obligations regarding their children. Many of the goods available to individuals via parenthood, including intimacy, meaning, and satisfaction that can be obtained or acquired in the parent-child relationship, are equally available to both mothers and fathers. This equality of parental interests, then, is thought to justify the conclusion that the presumptive claims to parenthood on the parts of mothers and fathers are equal in weight.
There is a more general issue concerning the relationship between biology and parenthood, which has to do with the value of biological connections in the parent-child relationship. A particularly strong view concerning the relationship between biology and parenthood is that biology is essential to the value of parenthood for human beings (Page 1984). On this view, there is a necessary connection between biology and parental rights. The entire process of creating, bearing, and rearing a child is thought to be a single process which is valuable to parents insofar as they seek to create a person who in some sense reflects a part of themselves. The aim is to create someone else in the image of the parent. This is why being a parent has value for us; it is why we desire it. In reply, it has been argued that while biology may have value for many people with respect to the parent-child relationship, a biological connection is neither necessary nor sufficient for parental rights and obligations. Rather, the more valuable aspects of the parent-child relationship are personal, social, and moral. It has been argued that biological ties between parents and children are morally significant in other ways (Velleman 2005). Some believe that children have families in the most important sense of the term if they will be raised by parents who want them, love them, and desire what is best for them, regardless of whether a biological connection exists. The lack of such a connection does little harm to children in such families. Against this, Velleman argues that knowledge of one’s biological relatives, especially one’s parents, is crucial because the self-knowledge one gains from knowing them is central for forging a meaningful human life. Lack of such knowledge, then, is harmful to children. In reply, it has been argued that knowledge of one’s biological progenitors is unnecessary for self-knowledge and for having and leading a good life (Haslanger 2009).
According to this account of parenthood, children ought to be raised by a parent or parents who will best serve their interests. On this account, parental rights are grounded in the ability of parents to provide the best possible context for childrearing. While the best interests criterion of parenthood is useful in cases of conflicting claims to custody in the context of divorce or in situations where child abuse and neglect are present, several criticisms have emerged with respect to its application as the fundamental grounding of parental rights and obligations. One criticism of this view is that it fails to sufficiently take into account the interests of parents, which leads to potential counterexamples. For instance, consider a case in which it is in the best interests of a child to be raised by an aunt or uncle, rather than the child’s biological or custodial parents, when the current parents are fit and fulfilling their obligations to the child in question. Removing the child from the custody of those parents solely on the basis of the comparative superiority of others seems problematic to many. Moreover, this account may entail that the state should remove newborns from the custody of their parents, if they are poor, and transfer parental rights to someone who has greater financial stability, all else being equal. For critics of the best interests account, this is deeply counterintuitive and is sufficient for rejecting this account of parenthood.
Perhaps the account can be modified to deal with such criticisms. The modified account need not entail that a child should be removed from the custody of its natural parents and given to better caretakers, who then possess parental rights with respect to that child, even if these caretakers possess the same nationality, ethnicity, and social origins. This is because it is in the best interests of the child to maintain her developing self-identity and provide her with a stable environment. Still, a primary objection to all best-interests accounts is that they fail to take into account, in an adequate manner, the relevant interests of a child’s current parents. The point is not that parental interests trump the interests of the child, but rather that best interests of the child accounts fail to weigh those interests in a proper manner.
Some philosophers argue that the rights and obligations of parenthood are not grounded in biology or a natural relationship between parents and their offspring. Rather, they hold that the rights and obligations of parents are social constructs. One form of this view includes the claim that parenthood is a type of social contract. Advocates of such a view argue that the rights and responsibilities of parenthood arise from a social agreement between the prospective parent and the moral community (such as the state) that appoints the prospective parent to be the actual parent. In some cases, social contract accounts emphasize causation (see section e. below) as a way in which individuals may implicitly consent to taking on the rights and responsibilities of parenthood. Contractual and causal accounts can come apart, however, and be treated separately. It has also been argued that social conventions have priority over biological ties when determining who will raise a child, and that in social contexts where biological parents generally have the duty to raise their offspring, individual responsibility for children is produced by the choice to undertake the duties of raising a child, which can occur by deciding to procreate or deciding not to avoid parental obligations via abortion or adoption.
Others who take parenthood to be a social construct emphasize the individual choice to undertake the rights and responsibilities of parenthood with respect to a particular child. This way of incurring special obligations is familiar. For instance, an employer takes on special obligations to another when that person becomes her employee. Spouses take on special obligations to one another and acquire certain rights with respect to each other via marriage. In these and many other instances, one acquires particular rights and obligations by choice, or voluntary consent. Similarly, then, when an individual voluntarily undertakes the parental role, that individual acquires parental rights and obligations. This can happen via intentional procreation, adoption, and step-parenthood.
Critics of constructionism argue that advocates of this view fail to appreciate certain facts of human nature related to the interests of children. Many constructionists, according to their critics, tend to weigh the interests of adults more heavily than those of the relevant children. They maintain that children have deep and abiding interests in being raised by their biological progenitors, or at least having significant relationships with them. Intentionally creating children who will lack such connections seems problematic, and some critics are especially concerned about intentionally creating children who will lack either a custodial mother or father. Other versions of constructionism are not vulnerable to this critique, insofar as they include the claim that children’s interests and in some cases rights are at least equally important relative to the rights and interests of adults.
Related to the use of reproductive technology, the creation of a child by gamete donors is thought by some to be immoral or at least morally problematic because such donors often fail to take their obligations to their genetic offspring seriously enough when they transfer them to the child’s custodial parents. Given that parental obligations include more than just minimal care, but also seeking to care for children in deeper ways which foster their flourishing, the claim is that in such cases donors do not take their obligations as seriously as is warranted. Constructionists reply that as long as the custodial parents nurture and provide sufficient care for children, the biological connections as well as the presence of both a mother and father are at least relatively, if not entirely, insignificant. In order to resolve these issues, both philosophical argumentation and empirical data are important.
Most, if not all, contemporary philosophers who defend a causal account of parenthood focus on parental obligations rather than rights. Simply stated, the claim is that individuals have special obligations to those offspring which they cause to come into existence. Defenders of the causal account argue that genetic and gestational parents incur moral obligations to their offspring in virtue of their causal role concerning the existence of the children in question. In many cases, of course, the causal parents of a child would incur obligations because they voluntarily consent to take on such when they choose to have a child. Defenders of the causal account often focus on cases in which procreation is not intentional, in order to isolate the causal role as being sufficient for the generation of parental obligations.
Advocates of the causal account set aside cases such as rape, where coercion is present. They maintain that in other important cases one can incur obligations to offspring, even if one does not intend to procreate or consent to take on such obligations. The general idea is that when a person voluntarily engages in a behavior which can produce reasonably foreseeable consequences, and the agent is a proximate and primary cause of those consequences, then it follows that the agent has obligations with respect to those consequences. In the case of procreation, the child needs care. To fail to provide it is to allow harmful consequences to obtain. Since the agent is causally responsible for the existence of a child in need of care, then the agent is morally responsible to provide it. This is similar to other situations in which an agent is causally responsible for harm or potential harm and is thereby thought to also bear moral responsibility relative to that harm. For instance, if a person damages his neighbor’s property via some action, then that person thereby incurs the moral responsibility to compensate his neighbor for that damage. By parity of reasoning, defenders of the causal account of parental obligations argue that causal responsibility for the existence of a child—when coercion is not present—entails moral responsibility with respect to preventing the child’s experiencing various kinds of suffering and harm.
The heart of the disagreement between proponents of the causal account and their critics is whether or not the voluntary acceptance of the special obligations of parenthood is necessary for incurring those obligations. Critics of the causal account argue that it is difficult to isolate parents as those who bear causal responsibility for a child’s existence, given the causal roles others play (such as medical practitioners). Given the variety of individuals that are causally connected to the existence of a particular child, the connections between causal responsibility and moral responsibility in this particular realm of life are unclear. A defense of the causal account against this objection includes the claim that the interests of children are in play here and deeply connected with the causal parents and not medical practitioners. This may be a hybrid account however, coupling causation with an interests-based account of parental obligation, which is the focus of the next section.
This view of parenthood focuses on fundamental interests—those which are crucial for human flourishing—as the grounds for the rights and obligations of parents. The general picture is a familiar one in which such interests generate correlative rights and obligations. In the parent-child relationship, there are several such interests in play, including psychological well-being, the forging and maintenance of intimate relationships, and the freedom to pursue that which brings satisfaction and meaning to life. The interests of children connected with their custodial parents are numerous and significant. If a child receives caring, intimate, and focused attention from a parent, this can help her to become an autonomous agent capable of pursuing and enjoying intimate relationships and psychological and emotional health. It can also contribute to her having the ability to create and pursue valuable ends in life. The lack of such attention and care often has very detrimental effects on the development and life prospects of a child. These interests are thought to generate the obligations of parenthood.
How is it that these interests are thought to generate parental rights? Parents can experience meaning and satisfaction in life via the various actions related to parenting, as they offer care, guidance, and knowledge to their children. By playing a role in satisfying the fundamental interests of their children, parents have many of their own interests satisfied, including the ones mentioned above: psychological well-being, the forging and maintenance of intimate relationships, and experiencing satisfaction with and meaning in life. It is important for interests-based accounts of parental rights to note that a condition for the satisfaction of the relevant interests often requires that the parent-child relationship be relatively free from intrusion. If the state exercises excessive control in this realm of human life, the parent becomes a mediator of the will of the state and many of the goods of parenthood then are lost. The parent is not making as significant of a personal contribution to the well-being of her child as she might otherwise be able to do, and so is not able to achieve some of the goods that more autonomous parenting makes possible, including intimacy in the parent-child relationship. There are certainly cases in which intrusion is warranted, such as instances of abuse and neglect, but in these types of cases there is no longer a genuine intimacy present to be threatened, given that abuse blocks relational intimacy. Finally, defenders of this view of parenthood conclude that if children need parental guidance and individualized attention based on an intimate knowledge of their preferences and dispositions, then the state has an interest in refraining from interfering in that relationship until overriding conditions obtain. Parents have rights, as parents, to this conditional freedom from intrusion.
Advocates of children’s liberation hold that parents should have no rights over children because such paternal control is an unjustified inequality; it is both unnecessary and immoral. Those who support children’s liberation argue that children should possess the same legal and moral status as adults. This entails that children should be granted the same rights and freedoms that adults possess, such as self-determination, voting, and sexual autonomy, as well as the freedom to select guardians other than their parents. While advocates of liberationism disagree on the particular rights that children should be granted, they agree that the status quo regarding paternalism with respect to children is unjust. Clearly such a view is a challenge to the legal and moral status of parents. One argument in favor of this view focuses on the consistency problem. If rights are grounded in the possession of certain capacities, then it follows that when an individual has the relevant capacities—such as autonomy—then that individual should possess the rights in question. Consistency may require either denying certain rights to particular adults who do not possess the relevant capacities in order to preserve paternalistic control of children, or granting full human rights to particular children who possess the relevant capacities. Alternatively, it has been suggested that children should be granted all of the rights possessed by adults, even if they do not yet possess the relevant capacities (Cohen 1980). Rather than being left to themselves to exercise those rights, children could borrow the capacities they lack from others who are obligated to help them secure their rights and who possess the relevant capacities. Once children actualize these capacities, they may then act as agents on their own behalf. The upshot is that a difference in capacities does not justify denying rights to children.
Critics of children’s liberation argue that paternalistic treatment of children enables them to develop their capacities and become autonomous adults with the attendant moral and legal status. They also worry that in a society in which children are liberated in this way, many will forego education and other goods which are conducive to and sometimes necessary for their long-term welfare. It has also been suggested that limiting children’s right of self-determination fosters their development and protects them from exploitative employment. Granting equal rights to children might also prevent parents from providing the moral training children need, and cause adolescents to be even less likely to consider seriously the guidance offered by their parents. In addition, critics point out that autonomy is not the only relevant issue with respect to granting equal rights to children. The capacity for moral behavior is also important, and should be taken into account given the facts of moral development related to childhood. Finally, if a child possesses the relevant actualized capacities, then perhaps theoretical consistency requires that she be granted the same moral and legal status accorded to adults. However, the critic of children’s liberation may hold that this is simply a case where theory and practice cannot coincide due to the practical barriers in attempting to bring the two together. Perhaps the best way in which to bring theory and practice together is to emphasize the moral obligations of parents to respect the developed and developing autonomy and moral capacities of their children.
It has been argued that parents do not possess even a qualified or conditional moral right to impact the lives of their children in significant ways (Montague 2000). The reason that Montague rejects the notion of parental rights is that such rights lack two essential components of moral rights. First, moral rights are oriented towards their possessors. Second, moral rights have a discretionary character. Since the putative rights of parents have neither of these features, such rights should be rejected. If there were parental rights, their function would be to protect either the interests that parents have or the choices they make regarding the parent-child relationship. The problem for the proponent of parental rights is that no other right shares a particular feature of such rights, namely, that the relevant set of interests or autonomy is only worth protecting because of the value of protecting the interests or autonomy of others. Moreover, Montague argues that parental rights to care for children are in tension with parental obligations to do so. The notion of parental rights is in tension with the fact that parents are obligated to protect their children’s interests and assist them in the process of developing into autonomous individuals. Practically speaking, an emphasis on parental rights focuses on what is good for parents, while a focus on parental obligations emphasizes the well-being of children. He concludes that we have strong reasons for rejecting the notion that parents have a right to impact, in a significant way, the lives of their children. So, the view is that parental rights are incompatible with parental obligations. Parents have discretion regarding how to fulfill their obligations, but they do not have such discretion regarding whether to do so. If there were parental rights, parents would have discretion regarding whether to protect and promote the interests of their children, and this is unacceptable. In reply, one critic of Montague’s argument) has pointed out that while it is true that parents do not have discretion regarding what counts as fulfilling their obligations towards their children, they nevertheless have discretion regarding how to do so, and perhaps this is sufficient for thinking that there are some parental rights (Austin 2007).
While the vast majority of philosophers agree that children have at least some rights—such as the right to life, for example—the extent of those rights and how they relate to the rights and obligations of parents is an issue that generates much controversy. The existence and extent of parental rights, the rights of children, and the relevant interests of the state all come together when one considers issues in applied parental ethics. The theoretical conception of rights one holds as well as one’s view of the comparative strength of those rights will often inform what one takes to be the personal, social, and public policy implications with respect to these issues.
Hugh LaFollette’s defense of the claim that the state should license parents is perhaps the most influential and widely discussed version of the philosophical argument in favor of parental licensing (LaFollette 1980). LaFollette argues that (i) if an activity is potentially harmful to others; (ii) requires a certain level of competence; and (iii) this competence can be demonstrated via a reliable test, then the activity in question should be regulated by the state. These criteria justify current licensing programs. For instance, we require that physicians obtain medical licenses from the state to ensure their competency due to the potential harm caused by medical malpractice. In order to drive an automobile, a level of skill must be demonstrated because of the potential harm to others that can be done by incompetent drivers. These criteria also apply to parenting. It is clear that parents can harm their children through abuse, neglect, and lack of love, which often results in physical and psychological trauma. Children who suffer such harms may become adults who are neither well-adjusted nor happy, which can lead to cyclical patterns of abuse and other negative social consequences. Parenting also requires a certain competency that many people lack due to temperament, ignorance, lack of energy, and psychological instability. LaFollette believes that we can create a moderately reliable psychological test that will identify those individuals who will likely abuse or neglect their children. At the time of his paper, such tests were just beginning to be formulated. Since then, however, accurate parenting tests have been developed which could serve as useful tools for identifying individuals who are likely to be extremely bad parents (McFall 2009). Given that parenting is potentially harmful and requires competence that can be demonstrated via a reliable test, by parity of reasoning the state should also require licenses for parents. Moreover, given that we screen adoptive parents and require that they demonstrate a level of competence before they are allowed to adopt a child in order to reduce the chances of abuse or neglect, there is no compelling reason not to require the same of biological parents. The aim of parental licensing is not to pick out parents who will be very good, but rather to screen those who will likely be very bad by abusing or neglecting their children. The intent is to prevent serious harm to children, as well as the harms others suffer because of the social impact of child abuse. LaFollette concludes that since a state program for licensing parents is desirable, justifiable, and feasible, it follows that we should implement such a program.
Critics argue that there are both theoretical and practical problems with such proposals. Some worry about cases where a woman is pregnant before acquiring a license and fails to obtain one before giving birth. The picture of the state removing a newborn infant in such cases and transferring custody to suitable adoptive parents is problematic because no abuse or neglect has yet occurred. A variety of alternatives, including less invasive licensing as well as non-licensing alternatives, have been proposed. LaFollette himself puts forth the possibility that instead of prohibiting unlicensed parents from raising children, the state could offer tax incentives for licensed parents and other types of interventions, such as scrutiny by protective services of unlicensed parents, on the condition that such measures would provide adequate protection for children. Others have proposed different requirements for a parental license, with both fewer and greater restrictions than those proposed by LaFollette. These include minimum and maximum age requirements, mandatory parenting education, signing a contract in which a parent agrees to care for and not maltreat his or her child (so that if a child is maltreated, removal of the child would be based on a breach of contract rather than criminal liability), financial requirements, and cognitive requirements. Others argue for alternatives to licensing, such as mandatory birth control, extended (and perhaps paid) maternity and paternity leave, and universal daycare provided by the government.
Finally, some argue that legally mandated family monitoring and counseling is preferable to a program of licensing parents because it better accounts for the interests people have in becoming and being parents and the welfare of children. It is also claimed to be preferable to licensing because it avoids the possible injustices that may occur given the fallibility of any test aimed at predicting human behavior. If people who are or will soon be parents can develop as parents, it is better to give them the opportunity to do so under close supervision, monitoring, and counseling, allowing them to be with their children when they are young and a significant amount of bonding occurs. This practice would protect the interests of children, society, and parents. For those parents whose incompetence is severe or who fail to deal with their incompetence in a satisfactory manner, the monitoring/counseling proposal rightly prevents them from raising children, according to advocates of this approach.
A significant concept shaping much of the debate concerning the ethics of childrearing is that of the child’s right to an open future (Feinberg 1980). According to this argument, children have a right to have their options kept open until they become autonomous and are able to decide among those options for themselves, according to their own preferences. Parents violate the child’s right to an open future when they ensure that certain options will be closed to the child when she becomes an autonomous adult. For example, a parent who is overly directive concerning the religious views of her child, or who somehow limits the career choices of her child is violating this right. When parents violate this right, they are violating the autonomy rights of the adult that the child will become. According to Feinberg, parents are obligated to offer their children as much education as is feasible, as this will enable them to choose from a maximally broad range of potential life options upon reaching adulthood. When parents do engage in more directive parenting, they should do so in the preferred directions of the child, or at least not counter to those preferences. In this way, parents respect the preferences and autonomy of their children, allowing them to exercise their rights in making significant choices in life that are in line with their own natural preferences.
One direct criticism of Feinberg’s view includes the observation that steering one’s child toward particular options in the context of parenthood is unavoidable (Mills 2003). According to Mills, there are three options relative to the future which parents may choose from as they determine how directive they ought to be. First, as Feinberg claims, parents may provide their children with a maximally open future. Second, parents may direct their children toward a future which the parents value and endorse. Third, parents may opt for a compromise between these two options. Whether or not one considers some particular set of options to be open is connected to one’s perspective. Given this, one’s judgment concerning whether or not a particular child has an open future is also connected to that perspective. For instance, someone outside of the Amish community would likely contend that children in that community do not have an open future; by virtue of being Amish, careers in medicine, science, and technology are closed to such children. Yet from an Amish perspective, children have a variety of options including farming, blacksmithing, woodworking, etc. Rather than speaking of an option as open or closed, Mills argues that we should think of options as encouraged, discouraged, fostered, or inhibited. Practically speaking, in order to encourage a child toward or away from some option in life, other options must be closed down. Finally, Mills criticizes Feinberg’s view on the grounds that it places more value on the future life of the child, rather than the present.
Many are concerned about state intervention in medical decision making as it is performed by parents on behalf of their children. Most would agree that the interests of all relevant parties, including children, parents, and the state, must be taken into account when making medical decisions on behalf of children. The worry is that state intrusion into this arena is an improper invasion of family privacy. And yet among those who generally agree that such decisions should be left to parents, the claim is not that parents have absolute authority to make such decisions on behalf of their children. Given the weight of the interests and rights at issue, exceptions to parental autonomy are usually made at least in cases where the life of the child is at stake, on the grounds that the right to life trumps the right to privacy, when those rights come into conflict. While some parents may have religious reasons for foregoing certain kinds of medical treatment with respect to their children, it is controversial to say the least that parental rights to the exercise of religion are strong enough to trump a child’s right to life. According to some, the state, in its role of parens patriae, can legitimately intervene on behalf of children in many such cases. The courts have done so in cases where the illness or injury in question is life-threatening and yet a child’s parents refuse treatment. In less serious cases, the state has been more reluctant to intervene. However, the state’s interest in healthy children is apparently leading to a greater willingness to intervene in less drastic cases as well (Foreman and Ladd 1996).
A different set of issues arises with respect to medical decision making as it applies to procreative decisions, both those that are now available and those that for now are mere future possibilities. With respect to the former, it is now possible for parents to engage in attempted gender selection. An increasing number of couples are using reproductive technologies to select the sex of their children. One technique for making such a selection involves using the process of in vitro fertilization and then testing the embryos at three days of age for the desired sex. Those that are the preferred sex are then implanted in the womb and carried to term. Another technology which can be employed by couples who are seeking to select the sex of their children is sperm sorting. Female-producing sperm and male-producing sperm are separated, and then the woman is artificially inseminated with the sperm of the desired sex. This is easier and less expensive, though not as reliable, as the in vitro procedure.
Parents might have a variety of reasons for seeking to determine the gender of their offspring, related to the gender of their current children, family structure, or other preferences which relate to this. One criticism of this practice is that it transforms children into manufactured products, which we design rather than receive. That is, children become the result, at least in part, of a consumer choice which is thought by some to be problematic in this context. In addition, this practice is thought by some to place too much weight on the desires of parents related to the traits of their (future) children. Ideally, at least, parental love for children is to be unconditional, but in cases where parents choose the gender of their offspring it may be that their love is already contingent upon the child having a certain trait or traits. Finally, given the scarcity of resources in health care, some argue that we should employ those resources in other less frivolous areas of medical care. Similar worries are raised with respect to the future use of human cloning technology. The technology would likely be costly to develop and deploy. And if such a technology comes into existence, parents may be able to select beforehand a wide variety of traits, which could also undermine morally and psychologically significant aspects of the parent-child relationship, in the view of some critics.
There are a variety of ways in which parents discipline or punish their children. These include corporal forms of punishment, and other forms such as time-outs, loss of privileges, fines, and verbal corrections. Of these, corporal forms of punishment are the most controversial.
Critics of corporal punishment offer many reasons for thinking that it is both immoral and a misguided practice. The use of violence and aggression is taken by many to be wrong in the context of the parent-child relationship, which they believe should be characterized by intimacy and love with no place for the infliction of physical pain. It is thought that children may learn that violence, or inflicting pain, is a permissible way to attempt to control others. Some argue that reasoning with the child and other forms of verbal and moral persuasion are more effective, as are alternative forms of discipline and punishment such as verbal reprimands or time outs. Others believe that the negative effects on children of corporal punishment are often compounded or confused by other forms of maltreatment that are also present, such as parental expressions of disgust towards the child. This makes determining the effects of the punishment itself difficult. Still others think there is a place for corporal punishment, but only as a last resort.
One philosophical assessment of corporal punishment includes a limited defense of it, which is open to revision or abandonment if future findings in psychology and child development warrant this (Benatar 1998). When such punishment is harsh or frequent, it is argued that this amounts to child abuse. However, when corporal punishment is understood as the infliction of physical pain without injury, then it may be permissible.
Several arguments in favor of banning such forms of punishment have been offered, but potential problems have been raised for them by Benatar. Some critics of corporal punishment argue that it leads to abuse. But it is argued by Benatar that the relevant evidence in support of this claim is not conclusive. And while some parents who engage in corporal punishment do abuse their children, it does not follow that corporal punishment is never permissible. If this were the case, then by parity of reasoning the abuse of alcohol or automobiles by some would justify banning their use in moderate and appropriate ways by all. The abusive use of corporal punishment is wrong, but this does not mean that non-abusive forms of such punishment are wrong. Others argue that corporal punishment degrades children, but there is no proof that it actually lowers their self-regard, or at least that it does so in an unacceptable manner. Others are concerned that corporal punishment produces psychological damage, such as anxiety, depression, or lowered self-esteem. There is evidence that excessive forms of such punishment have such effects, but not when it is mild and infrequent. Other critics argue that corporal punishment teaches the wrong lesson, namely, that our problems can be solved with the use of physical violence and that it fosters violent behavior in children who receive it. Yet the evidence does not show that the use of corporal punishment has this effect when it is mild and infrequent. Finally, critics argue that corporal punishment should not be used because it is ineffective in changing the behavior of children, though defenders of the practice dispute this claim as well (Cope 2010).
Whatever one concludes about the proper forms of punishment, corporal and non-corporal, one proposed function of whatever forms of punishment end up being morally permissible in the family is the promotion of trust in filial relationships (Hoekema 1999). Trust is important in the family, because it is essential for the flourishing of the parent-child relationship. Children must trust their parents, given facts about childhood development. And ideally, as their development warrants it, parents should trust their children. The justification of punishment, in this way of thinking, has to do with children failing to live up to the trust placed in them by their parents. As such, proper forms of punishment both reflect and reinforce that trust. If children destroy or damage property, fining them for doing so can restore trust, release them from the guilt resulting from their betrayal of trust, and then reestablish that trust which is conducive to their continued development and the quality of the parent-child relationship. A form of punishment that fails to foster trust, or that fosters fear, would be morally problematic.
While it is commonplace for parents to seek to impart their own religious, moral, and political beliefs and practices to their children, some philosophers are critical of this and raise objections to this form of parental influence.
Some hold that parents should remain neutral with respect to the religion of their children, and not seek to influence the religious beliefs and practices of their offspring (Irvine 2001). One reason offered in support of this claim is that when parents rear their children within their preferred religious framework, insisting that they adopt their faith, such parents are being hypocritical. This is because, at some point in the past, the ancestors of those parents rejected the religion of their own parents. For example, if parents today insist their child adopt some Protestant form of Christianity, they are being hypocritical because at some point in the past their ancestors rejected Roman Catholicism, perhaps to the dismay of their parents, and this is said to constitute a form of hypocrisy. One reply to this has been that hypocrisy is not present, if the parents (and their ancestors) convert because they genuinely believe that the religion in question is true. If this is the justification, then no hypocrisy obtains (Austin 2009).
There are other problems with parents insisting that their children adopt their religious faith, however, having to do with autonomy. Parents may limit their children’s access to certain kinds of knowledge, such as knowledge concerning sexuality, because of their religious faith. In the name of religion, some parents also restrict access to certain forms of education which limits the autonomy of children by preventing them from coming to know about various conceptions of the good life. This may also limit their options and opportunities as adults, which limits the future autonomy of such children.
One important view concerning parenting and religious faith includes the claim that justice restricts the freedom of parents with respect to inculcating belief in a comprehensive doctrine, that is, in a broad view of the good life for human beings (Clayton 2006). This not only includes religious frameworks, but secular ones as well. The primary reason for this is that the autonomy of children must be safeguarded, as they have an interest in being raised in an environment which allows them to choose from a variety of options with respect to the good life, both religious and non-religious. The view here is that children may only be reared within a comprehensive doctrine, such as Christianity, Islam, or humanism, if they are able to and in fact do give autonomous consent, or have the intellectual capacities required to conceive of the good and of the good life. If neither of these requirements obtain, then it is wrong for parents to seek to impart their beliefs to their children. Once their children can conceive of the good and the good life, or are able to give consent to believe and practice the religion or other comprehensive doctrine, then parents may seek to do so. On this view, parents may still seek to encourage the development of particular virtues, such as generosity, in their children, as this does not threaten autonomy and helps children to develop a sense of justice. Parents are obligated to help them develop such a sense, and so this type of moral instruction and encouragement is not only permissible, but in fact obligatory for them. In reply, it has been argued that there are ways for parents to bring their children up within a particular religion or other comprehensive doctrine that protect their autonomy and help children gain a deep understanding of the nature and value of such a doctrine. Perhaps a middle ground between indoctrination and the foregoing restrictive approach is possible.
It is fitting to close with what is arguably the most important parental obligation, the obligation to love one’s children. Some philosophers—Kant, for example—believe that there is not and indeed cannot be an obligation to love another person, because love is an emotion and emotions are not under our control. Since we cannot be obligated to do something which we cannot will ourselves to do, there is no duty to love. However, some contemporary philosophers have challenged this conclusion and argued that parents do have a moral obligation to love their children (Austin 2007, Boylan 2011, Liao 2006). One reason for this is that parents have the obligation to attempt to develop the capacities in their children that are needed for a flourishing life. There is ample empirical evidence that a lack of love can harm a child’s psychological, cognitive, social, and physical development. Given this, parents are obligated to seek to foster the development of the capacities for engaging in close and loving personal relationships in their children. A primary way that parents can do this is by loving their children and seeking to form such a relationship with them. There are ways in which parents can successfully bring about the emotions associated with loving children. For example, a parent can give himself reasons for having loving emotions for his children. A parent can bring about circumstances and situations in which it is likely that she will feel such emotions. In these and many other ways, the dispositions to feel parental love can be strengthened. To say that all emotions, including the emotions associated with parental love, cannot be commanded by morality because they cannot be controlled by us is too strong a claim. Finally, there are also reasons for thinking that it is not merely the responsibility of parents to love their children, but that all owe a certain kind of love to children (Boylan 2011). If this is true, then much more needs to be done to not only encourage parents to love their children in ways that will help them to flourish, but to change social structures so that they are more effective at satisfying this central interest of children.
Michael W. Austin
Eastern Kentucky University
U. S. A.
Last updated: December 15, 2013 | Originally published: