Parmenides was a Greek philosopher and poet, born of an illustrious family about B.C.E. 510, at Elea in Lower Italy, and is is the chief representative of the Eleatic philosophy. He was held in high esteem by his fellow-citizens for his excellent legislation, to which they ascribed the prosperity and wealth of the town. He was also admired for his exemplary life. A “Parmenidean life” was proverbial among the Greeks. He is commonly represented as a disciple of Xenophanes. Parmenides wrote after Heraclitus, and in conscious opposition to him, given the evident allusion to Hericlitus: “for whom it is and is not, the same and not the same, and all things travel in opposite directions” (fr. 6, 8). Little more is known of his biography than that he stopped at Athens on a journey in his sixty-fifth year, and there became acquainted with the youthful Socrates. That must have been in the middle of the fifth century BCE., or shortly after it.
Parmenides broke with the older Ionic prose tradition by writing in hexameter verse. His didactic poem, called On Nature, survives in fragments, although the Proem (or introductory discourse) of the work has been preserved. Parmenides was a young man when he wrote it, for the goddess who reveals the truth to him addresses him as “youth.” The work is considered inartistic. Its Hesiodic style was appropriate for the cosmogony he describes in the second part, but is unsuited to the arid dialectic of the first. Parmenides was no born poet, and we must ask what led him to take this new departure. The example of Xenophanes’ poetic writings is not a complete explanation; for the poetry of Parmenides is as unlike that of Xenophanes as it well can be, and his style is more like Hesiod and the Orphics. In the Proem Parmenides describes his ascent to the home of the goddess who is supposed to speak the remainder of the verses; this is a reflexion of the conventional ascents into heaven which were almost as common as descents into hell in the apocalyptic literature of those days.
The Proem opens with Parmenides representing himself as borne on a chariot and attended by the Sunmaidens who have quitted the Halls of Night to guide him on his journey. They pass along the highway till they come to the Gate of Night and Day, which is locked and barred. The key is in the keeping of Dike (Right), the Avenger, who is persuaded to unlock it by the Sunmaidens. They pass in through the gate and are now, of course, in the realms of Day. The goal of the journey is the palace of a goddess who welcomes Parmenides and instructs him in the two ways, that of Truth and the deceptive way of Belief, in which is no truth at all. All this is described without inspiration and in a purely conventional manner, so it must be interpreted by the canons of the apocalyptic style. It is clearly meant to indicate that Parmenides had been converted, that he had passed from error (night) to truth (day), and the Two Ways must represent his former error and the truth which is now revealed to him.
There is reason to believe that the Way of Belief is an account of Pythagorean cosmology. In any case, it is surely impossible to regard it as anything else than a description of some error. The goddess says so in words that cannot be explained away. Further, this erroneous belief is not the ordinary man’s view of the world, but an elaborate system, which seems to be a natural development the Ionian cosmology on certain lines, and there is no other system but the Pythagorean that fulfils this requirement. To this it has been objected that Parmenides would not have taken the trouble to expound in detail a system he had altogether rejected, but that is to mistake the character of the apocalyptic convention. It is not Parmenides, but the goddess, that expounds the system, and it is for this reason that the beliefs described are said to be those of ‘mortals’. Now a description of the ascent of the soul would be quite incomplete without a picture of the region from which it had escaped. The goddess must reveal the two ways at the parting of which Parmenides stands, and bid him choose the better. The rise of mathematics in the Pythagorean school had revealed for the first time the power of thought. To the mathematician of all men it is the same thing that can be thought and that can be, and this is the principle from which Parmenides starts. It is impossible to think what is not, and it is impossible for what cannot be thought to be. The great question, Is it or is it not? is therefore equivalent to the question, Can it be thought or not?
In any case, the work thus has two divisions. The first discusses the truth, and the second the world of illusion — that is, the world of the senses and the erroneous opinions of mankind founded upon them. In his opinion truth lies in the perception that existence is, and error in the idea that non-existence also can be. Nothing can have real existence but what is conceivable; therefore to be imagined and to be able to exist are the same thing, and there is no development. The essence of what is conceivable is incapable of development, imperishable, immutable, unbounded, and indivisible. What is various and mutable, all development, is a delusive phantom. Perception is thought directed to the pure essence of being; the phenomenal world is a delusion, and the opinions formed concerning it can only be improbable.
Parmenides goes on to consider in the light of this principle the consequences of saying that anything is. In the first place, it cannot have come into being. If it had, it must have arisen from nothing or from something. It cannot have arisen from nothing; for there is no nothing. It cannot have arisen from something; for here is nothing else than what is. Nor can anything else besides itself come into being; for there can be no empty space in which it could do so. Is it or is it not? If it is, then it is now, all at once. In this way Parmenides refutes all accounts of the origin of the world. Ex nihilo nihil fit.
Further, if it is, it simply is, and it cannot be more or less. There is, therefore, as much of it in one place as in another. (That makes rarefaction and condensation impossible.) it is continuous and indivisible; for there is nothing but itself which could prevent its parts being in contact with on another. It is therefore full, a continuous indivisible plenum. (That is directed against the Pythagorean theory of a discontinuous reality.) Further, it is immovable. If it moved, it must move into empty space, and empty space is nothing, and there is no nothing. Also it is finite and spherical; for it cannot be in one direction any more than in another, and the sphere is the only figure of which this can be said. What is is, therefore a finite, spherical, motionless, continuous plenum, and there is nothing beyond it. Coming into being and ceasing to be are mere ‘names’, and so is motion, and still more color and the like. They are not even thoughts; for a thought must be a thought of something that is, and none of these can be.
Such is the conclusion to which the view of the real as a single body inevitably leads, and there is no escape from it. The ‘matter’ of our physical text-books is just the real of Parmenides; and, unless we can find room for something else than matter, we are shut up into his account of reality. No subsequent system could afford to ignore this, but of course it was impossible to acquiesce permanently in a doctrine like that of Parmenides. It deprives the world we know of all claim to existence, and reduces it to something which is hardly even an illusion. If we are to give an intelligible account of the world, we must certainly introduce motion again somehow. That can never be taken for granted any more, as it was by the early cosmologists; we must attempt to explain it if we are to escape from the conclusions of Parmenides.
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Last updated: April 21, 2001 | Originally published: