Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Jacqueline Pascal (1625—1661)

pascal_jA Cistercian nun, Jacqueline Pascal made a major contribution to philosophy of education through her treatise on the methods and principles of the pedagogy used at the convent school at Port-Royal. In her educational theory, the teacher emerges as a spiritual director who encourages the moral progress of her pupils through ascetical exercises and personal interviews. The right of women to acquire a theological culture and the right of the teaching nun to engage in theological commentary are defended in this model of education. Jacqueline Pascal’s writings also developed a substantial defense of the freedom of conscience, especially when exercised by women. She defended the right of women to pursue their personal vocation, regardless of economic resources and of parental attitude. During the crisis over Jansenism, she defended the right of women to dissent from certain ecclesiastical judgments despite civil and ecclesiastical pressures to assent to them. In her meditations on the divine attributes, Pascal employed a via negativa theology that stresses the unknowability of the hidden godhead. The divine essence transcends the gendered contours of the images of God. Long eclipsed by the philosophical genius of her brother Blaise, Jacqueline Pascal has recently emerged as the artisan of an educational, political, and religious philosophy with its own distinctive concerns.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Philosophy of Education
    2. Vocational Freedom
    3. Freedom of Conscience
    4. Apophatic Theology
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Jacqueline Pascal was born on October 5, 1625 in Clermont in the French province of Auvergne. A member of the noblesse de robe, the Pascal family had long distinguished itself by its judicial and political service. A lawyer by training, her father Étienne Pascal served as president of the Cour des Aides, a provincial tax court. Her mother Antoinette Begon Pascal descended from a family of French diplomats and judges. The last of the family’s children, Jacqueline had Gilberte Pascal Périer (1620-1687) and Blaise Pascal (1623-1662) for siblings. With the death of his wife shortly after Jacqueline’s birth, Étienne Pascal began to educate his children at home. An erudite scholar with a pronounced interest in mathematics, the father provided his children with an education stressing mathematics and philosophy as well as instruction in literature and history.

Étienne Pascal moved his family to Paris in 1631. He immediately joined the intellectual circles of the capital, including the circle of Father Mersenne, the patron of Descartes. Delegated to teach her sister Jacqueline to read, Gilberte Pascal discovered her sister’s precocious interest in poetry. By the age of eight, Jacqueline was composing her own verse. At the age of eleven, she wrote and directed an entire five-act play with two other girls of her own age. At the age of twelve, she published a book of poetry. With her growing literary reputation, Jacqueline was invited to the court at Saint-Germain-en-Laye in 1638, where Queen Anne of Austria personally thanked her for a poem she had composed on the queen’s recent pregnancy. Astonishing onlookers with her ability to write spontaneous poems on themes assigned by courtiers, Jacqueline Pascal acquired national fame as an artistic prodigy.

In 1638 the fortunes of the Pascal family grew more somber. Jacqueline fell ill with smallpox. Although she would recover, the scars from the illness remained for life. Étienne fell into political disgrace. During a dispute over the payments owed shareholders in the City Hall of Paris by the crown, a riot of discontented shareholders broke out. A member of the protesting shareholders, but not physically present at the disturbance, Étienne Pascal was placed under arrest by Cardinal Richelieu. Evading arrest, he fled into exile. In 1639 Jacqueline personally intervened with Cardinal Richelieu to obtain the pardon of her father. Charmed by the adolescent who had just performed a play in his presence and had shown such courage in directly addressing the prime minister, Richelieu pardoned Étienne and appointed him the royal superintendant of tax collection in the province of Normandy.

The assignment to Rouen would prove a politically hazardous one. Jealous of its ancient independence from Paris and resentful of the crushing taxes imposed by the crown for the prosecution of Louis XIII’s wars, Normandy was the scene of recurrent riots and assaults on representatives of the crown. To help his father, overwhelmed by the confused tax records of the province, Blaise Pascal invented his celebrated calculating machine, which permitted the user to perform the basic computational exercises of addition, subtraction, multiplication, and division mechanically. Jacqueline the poet flourished during the Rouen years. Encouraged by the dramatist Pierre Corneille, a Rouen native and close family friend, Jacqueline Pascal won the Prix de la Tour, a prestigious Norman literary award for her poem “On the Conception of the Virgin.”

The Normandy years also witnessed a capital religious change in the Pascal family: their conversion to Jansenism. In 1646 Étienne Pascal broke his hip in an accident. Two lay medical doctors, the Deschamps brothers, restored him to health through careful treatment of the broken bones. As they supervised his recovery, they shared the austere version of the Catholic faith which they had learned from the Abbé Saint-Cyran, the chaplain of the Port-Royal convent in Paris. Saint-Cyran promoted the neo-Augustinian theory of grace, predestination, and the elect defended by his friend Jansenius, the deceased Louvain theologian and bishop of Ypres. To this theology of grace Saint-Cyran added his own distinctive moral rigorism and opposition to Jesuit casuistry. Étienne, Blaise, and Jacqueline Pascal were quickly converted to the Jansenist cause. During a home visit in Rouen, the newly married Gilberte Pascal Périer and her husband Florin Périer also joined the controversial movement.

The religious conversion marked an intellectual change in the family. Theology replaced the older focus on science and literature. Through the programmatic spiritual reading pursued by the family members, Jacqueline Pascal acquired a new Augustinian philosophical culture. She studied the works of Saint Augustine himself as well as the writings of later medieval Augustinian writers, notably Saint Bernard of Clairvaux. She read the central works of the burgeoning Jansenist movement: Jansenius’s Reform of the Interior Man, Antoine Arnauld’s Of Frequent Communion, and Saint-Cyran’s Familiar Catechism and Christian and Spiritual Letters. The works of François de Sales and Pierre de Bérulle were also carefully studied.

When they returned to Paris in 1647, Blaise and Jacqueline Pascal regularly attended services at the Port-Royal convent, the center of the Jansenist movement. Jacqueline nursed her sickly brother and served as his amanuensis as he pursued his groundbreaking research on the problem of the vacuum and contested the physics of Descartes. Under the spiritual direction of Port-Royal’s chaplain Antoine Singlin and abbess Angélique Arnauld, Jacqueline decided that she had a vocation to the convent but her father strongly opposed it. As a compromise, Jacqueline agreed to remain with her ailing father in his Paris and Clermont households until his death; in return, her father agreed to permit Jacqueline to live a quasi-monastic life of prayer and asceticism within his home. Following the death of Étienne Pascal on September 24, 1651, Jacqueline prepared to enter the convent, but her vocation was now opposed by her brother Blaise, who had grown dependent on his sister’s nursing and secretarial skills and whose religious fervor had waned. Defying her brother, Jacqueline entered the Port-Royal convent on January 4, 1652. On May 26, 1652, Jacqueline was clothed in the habit of a nun and assumed her new religious name: Soeur Jacqueline de Saint-Euphémie.

During her novitiate years, the lingering animosity between Soeur Jacqueline and Blaise Pascal burst into open conflict during the crisis of the dowry. Breaking with the custom of leaving the bulk of a family’s estate to the eldest son, Étienne Pascal’s will and testament had divided his substantial estate equally among his three children. As a novice and a legal major, Soeur Jacqueline could still dispose of her share of her inheritance as she saw fit, but once she pronounced her final vows as a nun, she was forbidden by canon and civil law from receiving or disposing of wealth. In the French civil law of the period, a professed cloistered nun was dead to the world and had lost civic personhood. When Soeur Jacqueline announced to her siblings that she had decided to give her share of the inheritance to the convent of Port-Royal, Blaise and Gilberte violently objected. They claimed that such a gift went far beyond the familial provision of a dowry that was customary for a nun during this period. The siblings objected that the use of Jacqueline’s portion of the inheritance for the convent would deprive Blaise and the Périer children of income necessary for their research and education. They pointed out that the estate of Étienne Pascal was still under the purview of the courts since questions concerning their father’s debtors and creditors were still unresolved. If Soeur Jacqueline went ahead with her proposed donation to Port-Royal, the siblings threatened legal action against her.

When a stunned Jacqueline Pascal sought the counsel of Mère Angélique, the convent abbess advised her to abandon her claims to the disputed inheritance and pronounce her vows as an undowered nun. One of the reforms introduced by Mère Angélique at Port-Royal had been the abandonment of the traditional dowry requirement and the insistence that admission to the convent should not depend on the economic resources of the candidate. As the subsequent stormy interviews with her brother Blaise in the convent parlor indicated, such wise and liberating counsel was not easily accepted by Soeur Jacqueline since it wounded her family and class pride. Shortly before her profession as a nun, Blaise agreed to provide a donation to the convent that was equivalent to a generous dowry for a cloistered nun at the time, although Jacqueline had renounced her legal rights to the inheritance and the convent had clearly indicated that there was no requirement for such a payment. Soeur Jacqueline de Sainte-Euphémie pronounced her vows on June 5, 1653. During her decade at Port-Royal, Soeur Jacqueline would be entrusted with major offices: headmistress of the convent school, novice mistress, and subprioress.

The convent entered by Jacqueline Pascal was the object of increasing persecution. Since the appointment of Saint-Cyran as its chaplain in 1638, Port-Royal had become the center of the Jansenist movement. With a rural branch (Port-Royal des Champs) and an urban branch (Port-Royal de Paris), the convent disseminated Jansenist ideas to a large lay public. It conducted a school for girls and provided a hostel for women desiring to make retreats. Its large Parisian church featured sermons and conferences directed at educated laity. The messieurs, a group of erudite laymen who occupied buildings adjacent to the convent at Port-Royal des Champs, conducted a school for boys and published influential textbooks, translations, and theological treatises.

Published posthumously in 1640, the Augustinus of Jansenius contained the creed of the movement. The book argued that the salvation of the elect was completely dependant upon God’s grace and that the Jesuits, among others, had dangerously exaggerated the contribution of free will and meritorious works to the act of salvation. At the urging of the French crown, the Vatican had censured the Augustinus in 1642. In 1653 Pope Innocent X condemned five propositions on free will and grace as heretical and linked these propositions to Jansenius and his disciples. In 1656 Pope Alexander VII declared that the church was condemning these propositions precisely in the sense in which Jansenius had defended them. The Sorbonne theological faculty and the French Assembly of the Clergy delivered similar condemnations throughout the 1650s.

The Jansenists had their own powerful defenses. The publication of Blaise Pascal’s Provincial Letters (1655-1656) reduced the opponents of Jansenism to ridicule. The miraculous healing of Soeur Jacqueline’s niece Marguerite Périer, a pupil at Port-Royal, in 1656 was grudgingly declared worthy of belief by the Archdiocese of Paris and trumpeted by the Jansenists as divine vindication of their cause. To defend the Jansenist party from threatened excommunication, Antoine Arnauld, the movement’s leading theologian, devised the ingenious distinction between droit and fait. According to this distinction, Catholics were required to submit to church judgments on matters of droit (the law concerning faith and morals) since right belief and right conduct were essential to salvation. But they could not be compelled to assent to church judgments on matters of fait (empirical facts, such as whether a particular book or author had made a heretical statement), since the church did not enjoy the charism of infallibility on such an empirical matter. A minority of French bishops defended such distinctions as legitimate and traditional in the church.

Despite these defenses, the persecution of Port-Royal and the attendant Jansenist movement intensified once Louis XIV assumed the personal governance of France in 1661. The throne drew up a formulary that affirmed the church’s earlier condemnation of the five heretical propositions, and of Jansenius for having held them. All clergy, members of religious orders, and teachers on French soil were to sign the formulary under oath. The nuns at Port-Royal were singled out for the mandated signature. The crisis of the signature divided the Jansenist community. The convent chaplain Antoine Singlin counseled an unreserved signature as an act of submission to church authority. Antoine Arnauld recommended that the nuns sign but make clear that they were assenting only to the document’s judgments of droit (the condemnation of heretical propositions concerning free will and grace) and that they were maintaining silence on the judgments of fait (that Jansenius had actually endorsed these heretical theories.) The majority of nuns, led by Soeur Jacqueline, were inclined to refuse even a reserved signature to the formulary since they could not in conscience even appear to assent to a condemnation of an author they believed innocent of the accusation of heresy.

As the community debated the question of the signature, the crown moved against the suspect convent. In the spring of 1661, royal emissaries banished the convent’s confessors and spiritual directors, closed the convent school, and expelled the convent’s postulants and novices. In the summer of 1661, the new royal superintendent of the convent, Abbé Louis Bail, conducted an interrogation of the nuns regarding their theological views and devotional practices. Soeur Jacqueline was interrogated in July, with particular emphasis on her views on predestination and free will. In June of 1661, Soeur Jacqueline wrote a letter stating her opposition to any signature of the controversial formulary, but, like the other Port-Royal nuns under duress, she ultimately signed the formulary. In concert with the other nuns, she added a written codicil to her signature that explained the strictly reserved nature of her assent.

On October 4, 1661, Soeur Jacqueline de Sainte-Euphémie died after a brief illness. The physical cause of her death remains unclear, but Jansenist authors quickly acclaimed her as the protomartyr of the persecuted movement. In their eulogies of Soeur Jacqueline, they claimed that the ecclesiastical and political coercion during the crisis of the signature had brought about the untimely death of a conscientious nun.

2. Works

By the time of her death, Jacqueline Pascal had written works in a wide range of genres: poetry, letters, autobiography, biography, spiritual treatise, educational treatise, and judicial memoir.

Her poetry was largely written in the years before her entry into Port-Royal: 1638-1643. It employs a variety of genres: sonnet, epigram, rondeau, idyll, lyric. The early romantic and political poetry of her youth gave way to a more theocentric and meditational poetry later in adolescence.

Written shortly before her entry into the convent, On the Mystery of the Death of Our Lord Jesus Christ (1651) is a spiritual treatise on the Passion of Christ. Using a one-to-one correspondence between an attribute of Christ in the Passion and the moral virtues necessary for the disciple of Christ, Pascal sketches the ideal moral character of the Christian rooted in abandonment of the self to the divine will.

An autobiographical narrative, Report of Soeur Jacqueline de Sainte-Éuphemie to the Mother Prioress of Port-Royal des Champs (1653) recounts the crisis of the dowry. It also constitutes an apology for the right of women to pursue a vocation regardless of economic resources or of parental opposition.

Based on her experience as headmistress of the convent school of Port-Royal, A Rule for Children (1657) is a treatise on education that explains the goals, methods, and principles Soeur Jacqueline used in the school. This pointedly monastic model of education privileges formation in the moral and theological virtues as the principal goal of education.

A memorial of her interrogation by church inquisitors during the crisis of the signature, Interrogation of Soeur Jacqueline de Sainte Euphémie (Pascal) (1661) presents Soeur Jacqueline artfully responding to questions concerning neuralgic issues in the Jansenist controversy: the relationship between grace and free will in the act of salvation, the role of divine predestination in salvation, the nature of the elect.

A biographical sketch, A Memoir of Mère Marie Angélique by Soeur Jacqueline de Sainte Euphémie Pascal (1661) is a moral portrait of the salient virtues of the famed abbess and reformer of Port-Royal. The moral rigorism of the convent is apparent in the sketch’s condemnation of the least trace of worldliness in the Christian.

The correspondence of Jacqueline Pascal, especially her letters to her brother Blaise, contains much material of philosophical interest. Her letters remain our best source of information concerning the religious transformation her brother underwent during the mysterious “night of fire” in November 1654. A letter of 1647 provides a satirical sketch of Descartes, whom she met during a stormy visit to her brother when the two philosophers were locked in a dispute over physics, specifically over the problem of the vacuum. Several letters justify the right of women to pursue a religious vocation against family opposition, in her case by her father and then by her brother. Her most famous letter, written in June 1661 during the crisis of the signature, defends the rights of conscience against political and ecclesiastical commands to submission.

For nearly two centuries after her death, the works of Jacqueline Pascal survived in piecemeal form. Copied by her sister Gilberte Pascal Périer shortly after her death, a manuscript copy of the works of Soeur Jacqueline was conserved in the Périer family archives in Clermont-Ferrand until it was deposited in the local Oratorian library in the early eighteenth-century. A scholarly Oratorian, Pierre Guerrier, then recopied the manuscript; the Guerrier transcription remains the most comprehensive of the surviving manuscript versions of Jacqueline Pascal’s works. Starting with a 1666 edition of the Constitutions of Port-Royal, Jansenist print editions began to publish various works of Jacqueline Pascal circulating among the Jansenists in exile.

In 1845 two scholars, Victor Cousin and Armand Prosper Faugère, produced separate comprehensive editions of the works of Jacqueline Pascal. Based on manuscript as well as print sources, the Faugère edition is the more accurate of the two. Both editions helped to create the late nineteenth-century interest in Jacqueline Pascal as a philosopher of education. Jean Mesnard’s magisterial critical edition of the works of the entire Pascal family (begun in 1964) provides an authoritative version of the works of Jacqueline Pascal, but only four volumes of the projected seven volumes of the project have been published as yet.

3. Philosophical Themes

As philosophical commentaries have long indicated, the most substantial philosophical contribution made by Jacqueline Pascal lies in her theory of education. The acquisition of moral and theological virtue by the pupil, through a monastic pedagogical structure and spiritual direction by the teacher, is the primary purpose of Pascalian education. Pascal’s writings also defend personal freedom. In particular, they defend the right of the person to pursue a vocation despite civic or parental pressure, and the right to refuse to assent to what appears to be false according to the judgment of one’s conscience. In her portrait of the divine attributes, Jacqueline Pascal develops an apophatic theology (a theology that attempts to describe God by negation) that emphasizes the incomprehensibility of God.

Questions of gender are never far from her philosophical reflections. The educational theory she sketches is focused on issues specific to the education for women and differs from the pedagogical theories and practices championed by her male Jansenist colleagues in their petites écoles for boys. The personal freedom she defends is specifically the freedom of women to choose a vocation and to maintain a theological judgment against the coercion of family, state, and church. The hidden God she depicts in her spiritual writings is a demythologized god that transcends the gendered images of God fabricated by the imagination.

a. Philosophy of Education

Written in 1657 at the request of her spiritual director Antoine Singlin, A Rule for Children [RC] reflects Jacqueline Pascal’s experience as headmistress of the Port-Royal convent school. From its foundation in the thirteenth century, Port-Royal had enjoyed the privilege of conducting a school on its premises. Revived by the reforming abbess Mère Angélique Arnauld in the early seventeenth-century, the convent school was a boarding school for girls from the ages of six to eighteen. Many of the pupils were drawn from the aristocratic and bourgeois families sympathetic to the Jansenist movement. In A Rule for Children, Soeur Jacqueline offers a detailed apology for the type of education she had sponsored at the Port-Royal school. Divided into two parts, the first section of the treatise presents the methods of Port-Royal education, while the second part examines the spirit of the school with particular attention to the virtues to be cultivated by the pupil during her tenure at the convent.

The structure of the school day is strictly monastic. In the course of a single day, the pupils recite the following hours of the monastic office: Prime (dawn), Terce (early morning), Sext (noon), Vespers (early evening), Compline (early night). In addition, they attend Mass daily and have times reserved for personal meditation, a daily examination of conscience, and numerous devotional prayers in Latin and French. Following monastic practice, meals are taken in silence as the pupils listen to biblical, patristic, and hagiographical texts recited aloud at table. Adhering to the monastic practice of the “grand silence,” the pupils abstain from speaking from the end of prayers concluding evening recreation until the first class, which begins at 8:00 A.M.

A monastic emphasis also flavors the curriculum at Port-Royal. The Rule devotes scarcely a paragraph to the secular subjects in the curriculum: reading, writing, and arithmetic. On the other hand, Soeur Jacqueline describes in detail the catechetical instruction provided by the school. Religious education follows a graded curriculum: the first year focuses on the creed, the sacraments, and the commandments; the second year on the Mass and prayer; the third year on the virtues; the fourth year on Christian duties and morality. The texts employed in classroom instruction and refectory public reading reinforce the monastic cast of the education. The works of the desert fathers, Saint Jerome, Saint Jean Climacus, and Saint Teresa of Avila are recommended by Soeur Jacqueline.

Not only does the Rule propose a monastic model of education for women; it proposes a distinctively Jansenist one. The basic catechetical text used in religious instruction is Saint-Cyran’s Familial Theology, a controversial work censured by the Archdiocese of Paris. The work defends several of Jansenius’s contested theses on the predestination of the elect, the irresistibility of grace, and the incapacity to know God’s nature independently of God’s self-revelation and the light of faith. Other works by Saint-Cyran are used by the school to explain the theological meaning of the Mass and the sacraments.

Soeur Jacqueline’s counsels on reception of the sacraments reflect the moral rigorism of the Jansenists. When pupils confess their sins, they should discuss their general spiritual state with the confessor and not limit themselves to enumerating their sins committed since their last confession. “We tell them [the pupils] that it is not enough to say five or six faults; they must explain their spiritual state and dispositions from their last confession. Just naming their faults separately from their general state gives practically no knowledge of them” [RC 2.5.10]. Similarly, reception of Holy Communion should be rare and undertaken with the greatest scruple. “One single communion should bring about some change in their heart, which should appear even in their external conduct” [RC 2.6.1]. This is a rigorist standard of moral conversion for a committed adult Catholic, let alone for a young adolescent.

At the center of Pascalian pedagogy stands the teacher. According to the Rule, the teaching nun serves as a theologian and a spiritual director for the pupil. The personalism of the educational philosophy of Port-Royal is rooted in the teacher’s intimate knowledge of and solicitude for each pupil in her care. Religious instruction is not to be based primarily on memorization. Each school day begins with the teacher’s personal commentary on spiritual topics. “After the reading of the gospel we [the teachers] explain it to them [the pupils] as simply as we can. On other days when there is no proper gospel we instruct them in the meaning of the catechism on the Christian virtues” [RC 1.12.8]. After the reading of the spiritual text in the evening, the teacher is to field questions posed by the pupils. “At the reading after Vespers, they [the pupils] are encouraged to pose questions on everything they do not understand….In responding to them we will teach them how to apply their reading to the correction of their moral conduct” [RC 2.9.6].

The role of the teacher as spiritual director is even more pronounced. To assist the pupil in acquiring virtue and deepening the life of grace, the teacher must know the spiritual state of each pupil confided to her supervision. The bi-weekly personal interview between the teacher and pupil is the cornerstone of this personalized pedagogy. “The custom we have of speaking to pupils in private is what contributes most to aiding the pupils to improve their behavior. It is in these interviews that we help them with their problems, that we enter into their spirit to help them undertake a war against their faults, and that we make them see their vices and passions right down to their roots” [RC 3.3.1]. This spiritual tutorial permits the teaching nun to acquire a detailed knowledge of the moral character and internal spiritual struggles of each pupil.

In Port-Royal’s pedagogy, this knowledge has sacramental ramifications. When the priest arrives to hear the confessions of the pupils, the teaching nun is to provide the priest with a general portrait of the class’s distinctive virtues and vices. For Jacqueline Pascal, the confessor cannot effectively give spiritual counsel if he only relies on what immature pupils tell him. Similarly, when the class practices the chapter of faults, a monastic practice in which pupils accuse themselves of small imperfections in front of the rest of the class, the teacher is to provide spiritual counsel on correcting the faults and to impose an appropriate punishment for the fault. Just as the Port-Royal nun’s instructional duties include a classroom role as preacher and theologian, her role in sacramental preparation assumes certain tasks of the confessor and spiritual director.

The purpose of this pedagogy is to permit the pupil to deepen the moral and theological virtues essential to the life of grace. The key moral virtue to be acquired by the pupil is humility. Transcending the limits of personal modesty, this humility is a theological recognition of one’s utter dependence on God’s initiative in one’s creation, redemption, and sanctification. It is reliance on God’s grace, habituated through the prayer of hope, that permits the pupil to overcome the pull of moral vice. “If we told them to leave their miseries and weaknesses by their own force, they would rightly be discouraged, but if we told them that God himself will remove their problems, they would only have to pray, hope and rejoice in God, from whom they should expect every kind of assistance” [RC 2.2.7]. It is the work of God’s sovereign grace, and not the ascetical struggle for self-perfection, that secures the pupil’s salvation and exercise of the moral virtues appropriate to a Christian.

b. Vocational Freedom

Jacqueline Pascal’s philosophy of freedom focuses on the practical exercise of personal freedom. During the crisis of the dowry, she composed several writings that defend the right of the individual to pursue the vocation given to the individual by God. In letters to her brother Blaise (1652-1653) and in her Report to Mother Prioress (1653), Soeur Jacqueline defends her own right to follow her calling as a nun against familial opposition, and more broadly the right of women to pursue a personal vocation against familial commands to submission.

Her letter of May 7, 1652 to her brother Blaise defends the right to pursue this vocation on two philosophical and theological grounds. First, one’s personal vocation is a gift of God; it is neither created nor annullable by human authority, even the authority of one’s father or elder brother. “Do not oppose this divine light. Do not hinder those who do good; do good yourself. If you do not have the strength to follow, at least do not hinder me. Do not be ungrateful to God for the grace he has given to someone you love” [Letter of 7 May 1652 to Blaise Pascal]. Fidelity to God’s grace of vocation trumps loyalty to family. The freedom to follow this divine will cannot be constrained by appeals to familial obedience.

A second argument appeals to reciprocity. Just as Jacqueline Pascal had delayed her vocation for years to nurse her ailing father, her brother must now sacrifice his desire for Jacqueline’s services as nurse and secretary to her desire to pursue her destiny as a nun. The sacrifice of personal desires must be shared equally among the squabbling siblings. “You should be consoled enough in the knowledge that out of considerations for your feelings I did not enter the convent more than six years ago and that except for you I would have already taken the veil….It is only my concern to respect those I love that has led me to delay my happiness until now. It is not reasonable that I prefer myself to others any longer. Justice demands that they do some violence to their own feelings in order to compensate me for the violence I did to myself during four years” [Letter of 7 May 1652 to Blaise Pascal]. In pursuing their vocational goals, women enjoy the same rights as do men. The letter firmly rebukes the effort of Blaise Pascal to block his sister’s vocational freedom by insisting that she remain in her gendered role of domestic caregiver.

In her Report to Mother Prioress [RMP], written in the immediate aftermath of the crisis of the dowry, Soeur Jacqueline chronicles the crisis and praises the wisdom of the conduct of the convent superiors, especially the abbess Mère Angélique Arnauld and the novice mistress Mère Agnès Arnauld, in its resolution. The Report celebrates Port-Royal’s policy of respecting vocational freedom by accepting candidates who have no economic resources, thus abolishing the longstanding requirement of a dowry for a cloistered nun, and by refusing candidates who are being placed in the convent under duress, usually by their male guardians, or who lack a genuine vocational motive. The wise superiors link the freedom to pursue a vocation in the midst of familial opposition to other freedoms: the psychological freedom to embrace goods higher than family loyalty, and the spiritual freedom to serve God in material poverty.

Mère Angélique counsels Soeur Jacqueline that the opposition of her siblings to her vocation should free her to see that the idealized family she had created in her religious fervor was an illusion. Despite its painfulness, this confrontation with the family should liberate her from a creaturely attachment that had stifled complete attachment to the Creator. “Haven’t you known for a long time that we must never count on the affection of creatures and that the world loves only its own? Aren’t you happy that God is making you recognize it in the person of those you least expected it from [Blaise Pascal and Gilberte Pascal Périer] to remove any doubt on this issue before you leave them completely?” [RMP]. Mère Agnès argues that the prospect of an undowered entry into the convent can foster a greater spiritual freedom since material poverty increases one’s dependence on divine providence. “No temporal benefit can be compared with this, because there is nothing more profitable to religious life than true poverty” [RMP]. The familial opposition and material deprivations often provoked by a woman’s determined pursuit of her vocation can foster a deeper psychological independence and spiritual freedom in the persevering subject.

c. Freedom of Conscience

Written during the crisis of the signature, Jacqueline Pascal’s letter of June 23, 1661 expresses her opposition to the mandated signature of the formulary assenting to the papacy’s condemnations of the five heretical propositions concerning grace and of Jansenius for having defended the censured propositions. Addressed to Soeur Angélique de Saint-Jean Arnauld d’Andilly, a fellow leader of the non-signeuse faction in the convent, the letter is actually written to be presented to Antoine Arnauld, the uncle of Soeur Angélique de Saint-Jean and the convent’s theological advisor. The architect of the droit/fait distinction, Arnauld had counseled the nuns to sign the formulary without reservation since the archdiocesan vicars of Paris had prefaced the controversial formulary with a pastoral letter that explicitly recognized the legitimacy of this distinction in interpreting the signature. In her letter, Soeur Jacqueline contests Arnauld’s position as a dangerous species of casuistry. In defending the right to refuse to sign the formulary, she defends the broader right of conscience to refuse to assent to what one believes to be a falsehood, despite the appeals to obedience by religious and civil authorities.

In defending her resistance to the signature, Soeur Jacqueline insists on the gravity of the injustice represented by the ecclesiastical condemnations endorsed by the formulary. In indicating assent to these condemnations, one is willingly assenting to a libel of an innocent man and denying the truth concerning a central principle of the Christian faith, the redeeming grace of Christ. “I think you [Antoine Arnauld] know only too well why it is not just a question in this matter of a holy bishop [Jansenius], but that his condemnation formally contains a condemnation of the grace of Jesus Christ. Now, if our world is so miserable that no one can be found to be willing to die to defend the honor of a just person, it is appalling to discover that no one is willing to do so for justice itself” [Letter of 23 June 1661]. In this perspective, Jansenius in his Augustinus had correctly interpreted Saint Augustine’s theory of grace. Repeatedly lauded by church councils and popes as the “Doctor of grace,” whose teaching was normative on the subject, Saint Augustine had correctly interpreted the doctrine of Saint Paul on grace. This was itself a divinely inspired presentation of the grace of Christ himself, the heart of the Christian gospel. To appear to assent to this condemnation of Jansenius not only does a grave injustice to an innocent theologian, it imperils the salvation of the signer, because one would appear to be renouncing the very grace of Christ.

Given the moral stakes involved in signing the formulary, Soeur Jacqueline rejects Arnauld’s droit/fait distinction as a devious obfuscation of the issue. The Jansenists might claim that the signature only indicates assent to matters of droit (the church’s condemnation of the five heretical propositions), but the general public will interpret the signature as an assent to matters of fait (the condemnation of Jansenius) as well. “Although it is true we submit to these judgments [of the papacy] on what concerns faith, most people are confused about these issues because of ignorance [of these distinctions]. Those with personal interests in the dispute so strongly want to mix fact and law together that they turn these two into the same thing. So what is the effect of your [approach to the] formulary except to make the ignorant believe and give the malicious a pretext to assert that we agree with everything in it and that we condemn the doctrine of Jansenius, which the last [papal] bull clearly condemned?” [Letter of 23 June 1661]. Soeur Jacqueline dismisses Arnauld’s subtle distinctions as a dissemblance worthy of the Jesuit casuistry condemned by her brother in his Provincial Letters.

In place of the legalistic distinctions defended by Arnauld, Soeur Jacqueline counsels frank resistance to the pressures to sign the formulary. The resistants should simply assert that their conscience will not permit them to assent in any way to a judgment they believe to be untrue. “What prevents us and what prevents all the clergy who know the truth from saying when we are given the formulary for signature: I know the reverence I owe the bishops but my conscience does not permit me to attest by my signature that something is in a book I have never seen—and after that, just wait for what will happen? What are we afraid of? Banishment and dispersion for the nuns, confiscation of temporal goods, prison and death, if you will? But isn’t this our glory and shouldn’t it be our joy?” [Letter of 23 June 1661]. Martyrdom rather than legalistic compromise is the path for fidelity to the grace of Christ and the Augustinian/Jansenist teaching that defends it. Strikingly, Soeur Jacqueline repeatedly appeals to the rights of conscience as the ground for refusing to engage in a morally dangerous dissimulation.

In other passages, Soeur Jacqueline condemns the manipulation of conscience exercised by ecclesiastical and civic authorities in the campaign of the formulary. In demanding public assent to their condemnation of Jansenius, church authorities have overstepped the bounds of the obedience the church can rightly expect of its members. “What they can rightly want from us through the signature they propose for us is a witness to the sincerity of our faith and to our perfect submission to the church, to the pope, who is its head, and to the archbishop of Paris, who is our superior; however, we do not believe that they have the right to demand on this issue a justification of their faith by persons who have never given any reason to doubt it.” [Letter of 23 June 1661] The condemnation of the political motives behind the campaign of coercion is particularly pointed. “Do not doubt that this procedure of signature and of declaration of one’s faith is a usurpation of power with very dangerous consequences. This is chiefly being done by the authority of the king. Subjects should not resist, I believe; however, there are at least some tokens of submission one should not offer because one cannot consider them anything other than a violence to which one surrenders to avoid scandal” [Letter of 23 June 1661]. Neither loyalty to the Vatican nor fealty to the crown can justify abandonment of one’s conscientious judgment concerning the truth.

Soeur Jacqueline’s defense of the right of conscience is a gendered one. She explicitly defends the right of women to engage in religious controversies which many considered the exclusive prerogative of ordained clerics. In her perspective, women have the duty as well as the right to disobey civil and ecclesiastical authorities when they engage in grave injustices. “I know very well that it is not up to girls to defend the truth, although one might say on the basis of the recent sad events that since the bishops currently have the courage of girls, the girls must have the courage of bishops. Nonetheless, if it is not up to us to defend the truth, it is up to us to die for the truth and prefer anything rather than abandoning it” [Letter of 23 June 1661]. Against the prejudice that women may not engage in theological disputes due to ignorance or to their subordinate status, Jacqueline Pascal insists on the duty of women to defend the religious truth which they hold in conscience.

d. Apophatic Theology

Throughout her writings of maturity, Jacqueline Pascal practices an apophatic theology, that is, a theology that speaks of God only in terms of what may not be said about God. Her theology stresses the alterity of God, His otherness. Like her brother Blaise, she often focuses on the Deus absconditus, the hidden God whose nature is obscured from sinful human view. Written in 1651when she was a laywoman under Port-Royal’s spiritual direction, On the Mystery of the Death of Our Lord Jesus Christ (MD) expresses this apophatic approach to the divine essence and attributes.

In this meditation on the crucifixion of Christ, Jacqueline Pascal stresses how the divinity remains hidden in Christ. The physical details of the crucifixion veil the divinity from human view. The corporal sufferings, the moment of death, the clothing used, and the burial ritual strictly follow the laws of nature and the social customs of the period. Only the vision of faith can perceive the divinity. The criminal nature of the manner of Christ’s death constitutes an especially powerful veil over his divinity. “The death of Jesus made him contemptible for the evil. For them it was a veil that hid his divinity from their eyes and gave them terrible matter for blasphemy” [MD no.18].

Jacqueline Pascal’s treatise underscores the psychological passivity of Christ during the passion. Christ is depicted as insensible toward the evils that surround him. “Jesus died in an insensibility toward all evils, even toward his body covered with wounds” [MD no.20]. The meditation encourages the disciple to cultivate this insensibility by withdrawing from unnecessary commerce with the world and by seeking the grace to accept reversals of fortune with equanimity.

This portrait of the insensibility of Christ on the cross, manifesting the insensibility of the divine essence, reflects the neo-Stoic strain in the theology and ethics of the Jansenist movement. Freed from the flux of passions, the disciplined will of the righteous must be abandoned to the will of God. But in the Jansenist perspective, the divine will remains veiled. The God who saves the elect through an inscrutable decree of providence transcends the limits of human reason as well as human imagination. The obscure divine essence is best approached through a path of negation, focusing on what God is not.

4. Reception and Interpretation

With the publication of separate editions of the works of Jacqueline Pascal by Victor Cousin and Armand Prosper Faugère in 1845, Jacqueline Pascal was acclaimed for her pioneering treatise on the education of women. In the late nineteenth century, Cadet, Carré, and Ricard analyzed her contribution to the philosophy of education. Their commentaries, however, assimilated her work to that of the Jansenist messieurs who conducted the petites écoles for boys. The distinctive pedagogy of the convent school and the theological empowerment of women represented by Jacqueline Pascal’s model of education received scant attention. The recent research of Delforge has provided a clearer view of the specificity of the pedagogy defended by Jacqueline Pascal and the theological telos of her educational approach.

Jansenist hagiographical literature has long celebrated Jacqueline Pascal as a martyr to conscience against ecclesiastical and civil persecutors during the crisis of the signature. Her letter of June 23, 1661, defending the rights of conscience during this controversy, is a staple of Jansenist anthologies and of the French literature of resistance. The relationship of Soeur Jacqueline’s defense of conscience to questions of religious truth, however, has not always been perceived in portraits of her as a pre-Enlightenment crusader for the rights of the persecuted individual.

Recent scholarly works on Jacqueline Pascal by Conley, Delforge, and Lauenberger indicate a growing international interest in Soeur Jacqueline’s own philosophical theories and a disinclination to interpret her only as an auxiliary to her brother Blaise. The neo-feminist expansion and reinterpretation of the philosophical canon of the early modern period has placed the philosophy of Jacqueline Pascal in a gendered light. Her theories of education and of freedom constitute part of a broader defense of the right of women to develop a theological culture, to pursue a personal vocation, to act as spiritual directors, and to maintain theological convictions against the paternalistic pressures of church and state.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Pascal, Jacqueline, et al. Lettres, Opuscules et Mémoires de Madame Périer et de Jacqueline, Soeurs de Pascal, et de Marguerite Périer, sa Nièce, Publiés sur les Manuscrits Originaux par M.P. Faugère, ed. Armand Prosper Faugère. Paris: Auguste Vaton, 1845.
    • A digital version of this critical edition of the works of Jacqueline Pascal is available online at Gallica: Bibliothèque numérique on the webpage of the Bibliothèque nationale de France.
  • Pascal, Jacqueline. Oeuvres Complètes avec tous les Documents Biographiques et Critiques, les Oeuvres d’Étienne, de Gilberte et de Jacqueline Pascal et celles de Marguerite Périer, la Correspondence des Pascal et des Périer. 4 vols., ed. Jean Mesnard. Paris: Desclée de Brouwer, 1964-1991.
    • The standard contemporary critical edition of the works of Jacqueline Pascal, especially useful for the historical context it provides for Pascal’s writings.
  • Pascal, Jacqueline. A Rule for Children and Other Writings. Trans. and ed. John J. Conley. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2003.
    • A contemporary English translation of Jacqueline Pascal’s works with philosophical commentary.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Cadet, Félix. L’éducation à Port-Royal: Saint-Cyran, Arnauld, Lancelot, Nicole, De Saci, Guyot, Coustel, Fontaine, Jacqueline Pascal. Paris: Hachette, 1887.
    • An appreciation of Jacqueline Pascal’s educational theories from a secular perspective.
  • Carré, Irénée. Les Pédagogues de Port-Royal: Saint-Cyran, De Saci, Lancelot, Guyot, Coustel, Le Maître, Nicole, Arnauld, etc., Jacqueline Pascal. Paris: C. Delgrave, 1887.
    • An analysis of Jacqueline Pascal’s educational theories within the context of Port-Royal’s pedagogical practices.
  • Cousin, Victor. Jacqueline Pascal: Premières études sur les femmes illustres et la société du XVIIe siècle. 8th edition. Paris: Didier, 1877.
    • Dated but lively biography of Jacqueline Pascal. The edition of the works of Pascal contained in the book contains many lacunae.
  • Delforge, Frédéric. Jacqueline Pascal (1625-1661). Paris: Éditions Nolin, 2002.
    • A well-documented biography of Jacqueline Pascal, especially useful in its attention to her theology and educational philosophy.
  • Lauenberger, Robert. Jacqueline Pascal: die Schwester des Philosophen. Zürich: Theologischer Verlag, 2002.
    • A scholarly study of the mutual theological influences between Jacqueline and Blaise Pascal.
  • Mauriac, François. Blaise Pascal et sa Soeur Jacqueline. Paris: Hachette, 1931.
    • A penetrating study of the relationship between Jacqueline and Blaise Pascal written from the perspective of a Catholic novelist sympathetic to Jansenism.
  • Périer, Gilberte Pascal. La vie de Monsieur Pascal, suivi de La vie de Jacqueline Pascal. Paris: Éditions de la Table Ronde, 1994.
    • Gilberte Pascal Périer’s biographical sketch of her sister is the first of the biographies of Jacqueline Pascal.
  • Pouzet, Régine. Chronique des Pascal; “Les Affaires du Monde” d’Étienne Pascal à Marguerite Périer (1588-1733). Paris: Honoré Champion, 2001.
    • A well-documented history of the Pascal family with detailed analysis of the conflicts among the three Pascal siblings.
  • Ricard, Antoine. Les Premiers Jansénistes et Port-Royal. Paris: Plon, 1883.
    • A sympathetic analysis of Jacqueline Pascal’s educational philosophy from a Catholic perspective.
  • Société des Amis de Port-Royal. Deux Grandes Figures d’Auvergne: Gilberte et Jacqueline Pascal. Chroniques de Port-Royal, no. 31, 1982.
    • The entire volume is devoted to the sisters Pascal. The articles by Delforge, Cahné, Goyet, and Magnard analyze the literary career, educational work, and spirituality of Jacqueline Pascal.

Author Information

John J. Conley
Email: jconley1@loyola.edu
Loyola College in Maryland




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