Charles Sanders Peirce: Pragmatism

Pragmatism is a principle of inquiry and account of meaning first proposed by C. S. Peirce in the 1870s. The crux of Peirce’s pragmatism is that for any statement to be meaningful, it must have practical bearings. Peirce saw the pragmatic account of meaning as a method for clearing up metaphysics and aiding scientific inquiry. This has led many to take Peirce’s early statement of pragmatism as a forerunner of the verificationist account of meaning championed by logical positivists. The early pragmatism of C.S. Peirce developed through the work of James and Dewey in the U. S. A, and F. C. S. Schiller in Great Britain. Peirce, however, remained unhappy with both his early formulations and the developments made by fellow pragmatists. This lead him, in later life, to refine his own earlier account and rename it “pragmaticism” in order to distinguish it from other more “nominalistic” versions.

The most widely known feature of Peirce’s philosophy is his account of pragmatism. Peirce made his first published attempts at formulating pragmatism in the 1870s, and the maxim he developed there is often regarded as a prototype of the verification principle proposed by logical positivists in the early twentieth century. This early body of work on pragmatism influenced William James who, some twenty years later, publicly declared for the doctrine, named Peirce as its originator, and made the theory common philosophical knowledge. Both Peirce and James took pragmatism to have its roots in older work than Peirce’s late nineteenth century theory. Peirce in particular saw traces of the theory in the work of Kant.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Peirce’s Early Pragmatism
    1. The Purpose of the Maxim
    2. The Maxim and “Hardness”
  3. Peirce’s Later Pragmatism
  4. The Pragmatic Maxim and the Verification Principle
  5. General Problems with The Maxim
  6. Peirce and James: Pragmatism and Pragmaticism
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

The most widely known feature of Peirce’s philosophy is his account of pragmatism. Peirce made his first published attempts at formulating pragmatism in the 1870s, and the maxim he developed there is often regarded as a prototype of the verification principle proposed by logical positivists in the early twentieth century. This early body of work on pragmatism influenced William James who, some twenty years later, publicly declared for the doctrine, named Peirce as its originator, and made the theory common philosophical knowledge. Both Peirce and James took pragmatism to have its roots in older work than Peirce’s late nineteenth century theory. Peirce in particular saw traces of the theory in the work of Kant. However, what Peirce did in the 1870s was to create the first clear formulation of pragmatism as a principle of inquiry and account of meaning.

Peirce returned repeatedly to his early formulations and especially in his later life and worked and re-worked his pragmatic theories, particularly in reaction to the work of William James. Clearly, then, there are two strands to Peirce’s pragmatism: his early statements of the 1870’s and his later work from around the turn of the twentieth century.

2. Peirce’s Early Pragmatism

The earliest clear statement of Peirce’s pragmatism comes from his 1878 paper “How To Make Our Ideas Clear.” In this paper, Peirce introduces a maxim, or principle, which allows us to achieve the highest grade of clarity about the concepts we use. Peirce introduces this principle, which we shall discuss in detail below as the third grade of clarity, as a development of the rationalist notion of “clear and distinct ideas.” Combining his pragmatic maxim with notions of clarity from Descartes and Leibniz, Peirce identifies three grades of clarity or understanding.

The first grade of clarity about a concept is to have an unreflective grasp of it in everyday experience. For instance, my inclination to keep some part of my body in stable contact with a supported horizontal surface at all times suggests that I have an underlying grasp of gravity. The second grade of clarity is to have, or be capable of providing, a definition of the concept. This definition should also be abstracted from any particular experience, i.e., it should be general. So, my ability to provide a definition of gravity (as, say, a force which attracts objects to a point, like the center of the earth) represents a grade of clarity or understanding over and above my unreflective use of that concept in walking, remaining upright, etc.

For Peirce, these two grades of clarity are only part way to a full understanding of a concept; there is a richer level of clarity. It is at this point that he introduces his own third grade of clarity. Peirce says:

Consider what effects, which might conceivably have practical bearings, we conceive the object of our conception to have. Then the whole of our conception of those effects is the whole of our conception of the object. (Peirce 1878/1992, p. 132)

On this account, then, to have a full understanding of some concept we must not only be familiar with it in day to day encounters, and be able to offer a definition of it, we must also know what effects to expect from holding that concept to be true.

For instance, a full understanding of the concept of “vinegar” comes from possessing all three grades of clarity about it. If I am able to identify vinegar and use the concept appropriately in my everyday experiences, I display the first grade of clarity about this concept. My ability to define “vinegar” as a diluted form of acetic acid, which is sharp to the taste, displays the second grade of clarity. Finally, from the use of “vinegar” in definitional propositions like “vinegar is diluted acetic acid” and “vinegar is sharp to taste,” I can derive a list of conditional propositions which indicate what to expect from actions upon, and interactions with, this concept. So, for instance, “vinegar is acetic acid” would lead me to form the expectation that “If vinegar is acetic acid, then if I dip litmus paper into it, it will turn red.” Having a list of conditional propositions like this, which express the differences this concept can make to expected experiences, allows me to achieve the highest grade of clarity about that concept. This third and final grade of clarity is the earliest statement of what we now know as the pragmatic maxim; it is the crux of Peirce’s early theory of pragmatism.

It should be clear that Peirce’s pragmatic maxim accords with his scientific inclinations. For Peirce, understanding the practical upshot of our concepts means exploring and experimenting upon the conditional hypotheses that we formulate with them. This not only reflects his broader notion of philosophy as a practical laboratory science, but also informs our conception of Peirce’s pragmatic maxim, as it is expressed in “How to Make Our Ideas Clear,” as an account of meaning. The meaning of a concept is expressed by the list of conditional hypotheses that it generates. Interestingly, this seems to generate an account of meaning with two main elements: use and understanding.

The use element of the pragmatic maxim as an account of meaning is apparent from the meanings of the conditionals generated with the maxim. For instance, the meaning expressed by conditional statements about “vinegar” are not strictly about that concept considered in isolation. Rather, they provide the meaning for propositions containing the concept, such as “vinegar is diluted acetic acid,” or “vinegar is sharp to taste.” These conditional statements concern the practical experimental upshot of these propositions, rather than of the concept abstracted from them. This seems to generate meaning for concepts as they are used in sentences and propositions. It also makes the account of meaning an account of meaning for whole sentences, etc.

The second element of the pragmatic maxim as an account of meaning is understanding. We can see that it is the possibility of our understanding the outcome of taking a hypothesis to be true (in the form of conditional statements) that expresses the meaning of a concept. Since a meaningful statement is one for which we can derive practical and experiential consequences, our understanding, or grasp of those consequences, is our understanding or grasp of the meaning.

a. The Purpose of the Maxim

The pragmatic maxim, then, is the means for achieving the third grade of clarity in our understanding of a concept. The list of conditional statements that we generate for a concept lists the effects and practical outcome that we can expect from this concept if the statements containing it turn out to be true. However, Peirce develops the pragmatic maxim and the clarifying method that it represents with some very particular purpose in mind.

As we have already suggested, Peirce’s main use for the pragmatic maxim is as an account of meaning. Quite simply, this enables Peirce to clearly identify useful and meaningful sentences. For instance, if we do not conceive the object of our conceptions to have any practical bearings, then it clearly does not have meaning. This ability to identify meaningful and meaningless statements allows Peirce to make use of the maxim in two ways.

The first use for the pragmatic maxim is the role it plays in Peirce’s account of Inquiry and the accompanying notions of truth and reality. For Peirce, the attainment of truth comes from taking investigation and inquiry as far as it can go. The beliefs we find ourselves accepting at the limit of inquiry represent the truth. What is more, for Peirce, the only way to take inquiry to its limit is through the adoption of a scientific method. However, some criterion of choice is required in order to find which statements/hypotheses etc. are worth investigating. For Peirce, the pragmatic maxim is just such a criterion. Put in its simplest terms, the pragmatic maxim allows us to see what difference the truth of certain concepts would make to our lives. This knowledge further allows us to decide where the best focus for our scientific investigations and belief-settling inquiry lies. If, of two concepts, our investigating the truth of one over the other is likely to have a greater impact upon our reaching a settled state of opinion, then that is the one we should investigate. The only way we are able to see which of the two concepts is likely to have a greater impact is to use the pragmatic maxim and the final grade of clarity or understanding that it affords us.

Peirce’s second use for the pragmatic maxim is to identify those propositions of metaphysics that turn out to be meaningless. For Peirce, the pragmatic maxim enables us to steer clear of metaphysical distractions. The bulk of “ontological metaphysics,” by which Peirce means metaphysics conducted by a priori reasoning alone, has no practical bearing and so will make no contribution to the final fixed state of beliefs. This renders them meaningless. It is this use of the pragmatic maxim as a filter against empty metaphysical statements that ultimately leads to a comparison between Peirce’s maxim and the verification principles of the logical positivists. We will look at the similarities between Peirce’s pragmatic maxim and verificationist accounts of meaning in due course, but for the time being, it is worth noting that both Peirce and the logical positivists see the possibility of ruling out much of metaphysics on the grounds that it has no experiential consequences.

b. The Maxim and “Hardness”

Very quickly, Peirce began to feel that there were difficulties with this early account of the pragmatic maxim. In “How to Make Our Ideas Clear,” Peirce used the concept of “hardness” to illustrate the usefulness of his pragmatic maxim. This lead him to the conditional statement that “If something is hard, it will not be scratched by many other things” as an example, amongst many, of the practical upshot of taking our concept of “hardness” to be true. However, Peirce goes on to raise the question: what do we say about the hardness of a diamond, destroyed before we are able to test it for that quality?

In response, Peirce says that it would not be false to say that the diamond in question was soft. He states that, “there is absolutely no difference between a hard and a soft thing so long as they are not brought to the test” (Peirce 1992-94, vol. II, p. 131). Peirce’s unwillingness to say that the diamond is hard is, in part, a consequence of the way he ties his pragmatic maxim to his account of inquiry. Since any belief that we form about this particular diamond will fail to meet with recalcitrant evidence (there is no longer a diamond to conduct tests upon and so no possibility of confirming or dis-confirming the statement about the hardness of the diamond) we can form any belief we like about its hardness; it is largely a matter of “verbal disagreement.”

Peirce was to return to this issue in his second major period of work on pragmatism with some regret about this counterintuitive feature of his early pragmatic maxim.

3. Peirce’s Later Pragmatism

After his statement of pragmatism in the 1870’s, Peirce did not fully return to it for around twenty years. Peirce had toyed, throughout the 1890’s, with his ideas on the pragmatic maxim but it was not until James’ California Union Address in 1898 that he felt spurred on to a second major effort at formulating his pragmatism. James publicly named the doctrine of pragmatism and identified Peirce as its founder. Famously, James misremembered seeing the term “pragmatism” in Peirce’s “How to Make Our Ideas Clear”. James was, however, correct in identifying this paper as the first source of pragmatism in Peirce’s work. It was from here that James and other pragmatists, like Schiller, took Peirce’s pragmatic maxim and moved it in new directions.

By the turn of the twentieth century, then, Peirce’s need to re-engage with pragmatism was paramount. First of all, it would provide him an opportunity to use James’ acknowledgment of his work to gain a toehold in the philosophical and academic arena. Also, on a less personal level, Peirce did not wholly approve of the directions in which James and Schiller were taking pragmatism. This led him to rename his own brand of pragmatism “pragmaticism,” claiming that this title was “ugly enough to be safe from kidnappers.” Throughout the first decade of the 1900’s, then, Peirce attempted, in Harvard lectures and a series of articles for The Monist, to develop the theory he had first detailed in the 1870’s.

The most notable difference between Peirce’s later accounts of pragmatism and his earlier approach is his attitude to the question of whether the destroyed diamond was hard. This had a profound affect on the way he formulated the conditional propositions that constitute the pragmatic meaning of a concept, as we shall see. Recall that in his account of the 1870’s, Peirce maintained that since the diamond was not tested, it made no difference if we said that it was hard or soft. In his later formulations of pragmatism, Peirce states that we can definitely know that the destroyed diamond was hard.

The underlying cause of this change of heart is Peirce’s adoption of a more sophisticated approach to the reality of modal notions like necessity and possibility. In the 1870’s, Peirce’s account of possibility and necessity are based on the epistemological facts about believers in relation to some statement containing modal terms. For instance, to say that something is necessary is just to say that we know it must be the case. And to say that something is possible is just to say that we do not know it not to be the case. This reduces the reality of modal notions to facts about speakers and the words they use. In his later work, Peirce took this account and his early attitude to the diamond example to be crass “nominalism” on his part: he had failed to be a realist about possibilities, or “would-bes,” as he called them.

Peirce’s use of “nominalism” requires some explanation. Nominalism is more normally associated with the medieval discussion on the existence of universals. The nominalist position in this debate sought to explain universals in terms of properties of the words or names used (hence “nominalism” from nominalis or belonging to the name) rather than as separately existing forms. Peirce, however, uses “nominalism” to refer to any theory that does not take the real separate existence of laws, generalities, possibilities etc. seriously. His earlier explanation of possibilities or “would-bes” in terms of properties of knowers, then, counts, for him, as “nominalism.” As such, Peirce’s adoption of a realist position on possibility, that is a commitment to possibilities or “would-bes” as independently real, around 1896/97 provided the foundation for a significant change in his pragmatism.

In his later account of pragmatism, Peirce takes subjunctive conditionals, rather than indicative conditionals, to form the list of conditional propositions that constitute the meaning of our concepts. For instance, on the 1878 account, conditional statements generated for propositions like “vinegar is diluted acetic acid” would include, “If litmus paper is dipped into it then it will turn that paper red.” This is an indicative conditional, expressing what will happen. On this account, it does not make sense to say that a diamond will resist abrasive substances if the diamond is destroyed before testing can take place. Peirce’s later formulation, though, offers us conditionals like, “If we were to dip litmus paper into it then that paper would turn red,” for propositions like “vinegar is diluted acetic acid.” This subjunctive formulation, with regards the diamond example, sees statements like “this diamond is hard” generating a list of subjunctive conditionals like “If we were to rub this diamond with most materials then it would not be scratched.” Conditionals like this hold whether we test the diamond for hardness or not. Consequently, Peirce’s later pragmatism formulates the pragmatic meaning of concepts (or statements) in terms of subjunctive conditionals; his earlier account uses indicative conditionals.

A further development in Peirce’s later expression of pragmatism is the extent to which he places the pragmatic maxim within his wider philosophical account. In the 1870’s, Peirce’s pragmatic maxim is a part of his account of inquiry, suggesting and clarifying concepts worthy of exploration. By the turn of the twentieth century, Peirce’s architectonic vision of philosophy was in full construction and the concept of inquiry was part of a much broader structure. Consequently, Peirce sought to find an alternative expression of his pragmatic maxim more sensitive to the position of inquiry within his architectonic schema. Inquiry was now firmly realized as a part of logic (broadly conceived as semiotic), and more importantly, as one of the normative sciences in Peirce’s architectonic classification. Further, logic was to form the basis of a scientific metaphysics. Peirce’s later pragmatism, then, needed to move away from the more “nominalistic” emphasis of his earlier account, which made meaning a matter of actual descriptive accounts of practical experiences and effects. The strongly descriptive formulation of pragmatic meaning from the 1870’s ran counter to Peirce’s later prescriptivist view of inquiry as the self-controlled, scientific pursuit of concrete reasonableness. This further explains Peirce’s adoption of subjunctive conditionals: they are more sensitive to the prescriptivism of inquiry as a part of the architectonic.

Peirce also needed an account of pragmatism more sympathetic to his metaphysics. By the turn of the century, Peirce had come to realize fully the role of metaphysics in his system, and rather than dispose of it as empty theorizing, Peirce felt the need to reconstruct it as a meaningful science. His early account of the pragmatic maxim was strongly empirical and in “How To Make Our Ideas Clear,” Peirce defines “practical effects” as “sensible effects” (Peirce 1992-94, vol. I, p. 132), or “effects [...] upon our senses” (ibid., p. 131). This tying of the meaningful to the observable needs careful statement if it is not to rule out all but the immediate experiences of our senses. Peirce’s earliest characterization runs close to this. However, his later accounts attempt to broaden the notion of experience beyond the directly observable in an attempt to avoid rendering all metaphysics empty.

Peirce draws a distinction between “real” and “ideal” experience. The former is what we would normally think of as experience through the senses. The later involves diagrammatic reasoning, employed by mathematicians for instance. For Peirce, “ideal” experience involves performing transformations and operations upon diagrams, and “experiencing,” or observing, the result. Algebraic equations and the transformations we perform upon them, for instance, count as diagrammatic or “ideal” experiences. Since “ideal” reasoning is, in many ways, just mathematical and deductive experience, we might take Peirce to be doing little more than pre-empting the logical positivist’s allowance of analytic statements as valid sentences; he simply draws the distinction between the empirically observable and the analytic in a different way. However, Peirce is doing more than this.

Peirce’s mature philosophy is infused with his realism about possibility and generality. Both are important for his scientific metaphysics. What he needs is some way of explaining our experience of these things. The ability to reason, deduce, and infer allows us to use laws and habits and identify possible outcomes and, at the same time, take them seriously as real generalities and possibilities. This has an interesting effect on Peirce’s later notion of the pragmatic maxim. By 1903 and the Harvard Lectures on Pragmatism, the notion of practical effects from the earlier formulation had developed. Peirce, now sensitive to his own modal realism and more sophisticated metaphysical requirements, took the pragmatic maxim to “allow any flight of imagination provided this imagination ultimately alights upon a possible practical effect” (Peirce 1992-94, vol. II, p. 235).

4. The Pragmatic Maxim and the Verification Principle

Peirce’s pragmatic maxim is often compared with the logical positivist’s verification principle of meaning. With a clearer grasp of the pragmatic maxim, particularly in its later, more mature incarnation, it is worth commenting upon this comparison.

There are, indeed, certain similarities between the pragmatic maxim and the verification principle. For instance, the verification principle takes a sentence to be meaningful if there exists an experience that confirms or disconfirms it. As such, it shares with the pragmatic maxim an experiential or practical criterion of meaning; for both, a proposition must have some observable effect in the world to be meaningful. Also of interest, is that both purposefully use their criterion of meaning (through experiential effects) to identify “meaningless” statements. For both, a hypothesis with no observable or practical effects is without meaning. What is more, both use this ability to identify meaningless statements to reassess the content of metaphysics and demarcate worthwhile philosophy from areas where no real contribution can be made. For instance, Peirce thinks that his pragmatic philosophy can make no real contribution to areas of practical ethics: Logical positivists either class ethics with metaphysics as disposable, or make it a matter of opinion.

However, once we are aware of how Peirce’s account of pragmatism began to develop, the similarities between the maxim and the verification principle begin to get a little strained. Furthermore, some of the marked differences between the verification principle and all of Peirce’s formulations of the maxim become more prominent. First, although both share a desire to reassess metaphysics, the verificationists wish to render it obsolete; this was never an objective for Peirce. For Peirce, the reassessment of metaphysics involves bestowing upon it a scientific respectability and, although this objective is clearer in his later work, he always intended to retain some form of metaphysical philosophy.

The other crucial difference between the pragmatic maxim and the verification principle is the notion of experience. For verificationists, a verifiable experience is a directly observable one, i.e. observable in terms of simple sensory experience. Peirce, on the other hand, particularly with his later formulations of the maxim, has a broader concept of experience. As we have seen, Peirce’s modal realism, or commitment to the reality of “would-bes” characterizes his later accounts. This marks a crucial difference between the two and logical positivist like Carnap would no doubt feel uncomfortable with Peirce’s claims here. Peirce would no doubt think that the logical positivists were too “nominalistic.” Clearly then, Peirce’s pragmatic maxim is not simply a forerunner to the verification principle.

5. General Problems with The Maxim

Although there are clear differences between the pragmatic maxim and the verification principle, they are similar enough for Peirce to face some of the same difficulties encountered by Logical Positivists. A general difficulty for the verification principle is how to formulate it in a way that ensures the right kind of sentences count as meaningful. Traditional criticisms of the verification principle include the thought that in some of its formulations, it is too austere. Sentences about the past, unobservable entities like quarks, etc. are meaningless since there are no directly observable experiences that can confirm them. Peirce felt that this austerity towards meaning was an upshot of his early formulations of the pragmatic maxim, ruling out all metaphysics, including the kind that he felt might be respectable enough to count as meaningful. This led to the more generous construal of experience in his later formulations.

However, whether or not Peirce’s later formulations in terms of “possible practical effects” allow too much to count as meaningful is open to debate. For instance, because the formulation of the maxim in terms of possible practical effects, rather than actual or realized effects, seems to shift the focus of the maxim to expectations rather than actions, the body of meaningful sentences arguably becomes too inclusive. If we can show that some hypothesis or statement has some possible practical effect, then the Christian expectation of the second coming of Christ, say, and the avoidance of sin that it results in, seems to count towards the pragmatic meaning of “God is real.” Although Peirce does actually attempt to argue for the existence of God along similar lines, suggesting that “God is real” has the possible practical effect of seeing man’s “self-controlled conduct” increase (Peirce 1992-94, vol. II, p. 446), it is not clear that this development of the maxim is entirely healthy. The use of the pragmatic maxim in Peirce’s later work appears to take on metaphysical baggage that had previously been disposed of, allowing what counts as meaningful to run out of control. It seems, then, that the pragmatic maxim, in all of its formulations, struggles to steer a course between the austerity of the early pragmatism, and the laxity of the later more metaphysically tolerant formulations.

One final peculiarity of the pragmatic maxim, in both its early and late formulations, is that all propositions ultimately become future referring. This is fine with most hypotheses like “diamonds are hard” or “vinegar is diluted acetic acid,” since it is their contribution, possible or otherwise, to future experience that matters. However, statements or hypotheses about the past, rather oddly, become focused on their future effects. So, the pragmatic meaning of “John F. Kennedy was assassinated” generates conditionals about our future investigations, checking history books, reading the Warren report, watching TV footage, and asking those who knew him, etc. This feels counterintuitive, since the statement in question, “John F. Kennedy was assassinated,” seems to be about what happened to J.F.K., rather than about our experiences in unearthing support for its truth.

Despite this rather counterintuitive generation of future referring conditionals for hypotheses about the past, it is not clear that it does a great deal of damage to Peirce’s pragmatism. Rather, it is just a quirk of the maxim’s expression of meaning in terms of action or expectations.

6. Peirce and James: Pragmatism and Pragmaticism

One truly interesting issue for Peirce’s pragmatism is the relationship it bears to the work of the pragmatic philosophers that followed him. Peirce’s pragmatism influenced William James, John Dewey, Josiah Royce and F.C.S Schiller to name but a few of his American and British contemporaries. However, the influence upon and contrast with the work of William James is perhaps the most interesting. This is because although Peirce’s maxim and his work in the 1870’s provide the foundation for many early pragmatists, it is James that popularized the pragmatist approach to philosophy and James’ pragmatism that looms large in our common philosophical understanding of the doctrine. Also, because of the role of James as popularizer, it is his development that prompted much of Peirce’s later reevaluation of his own theory. In order to see what is unique and interesting in Peirce’s pragmaticism, then, it is worth emphasizing some of the crucial differences between Peirce and James’ take on pragmatism.

The primary difference between Peirce and James is that the pragmatic maxim in Peirce’s work is a theory of meaning, but in the hands of James, it becomes a theory of truth. This, however, is due to more crucial differences between the two that mean James’ notion of pragmatism far outstretches a simple meaning criterion, and reflects his more fundamental thoughts about philosophy in general. This comes most prominently to the fore in their basic ideas about the place of pragmatism in philosophy as a whole.

Firstly, Peirce and James have different ideas about the philosophical uses to which a pragmatic method should be put. James is famously anti-intellectualist in his philosophy, distrusting the extent to which we can answer all the important human questions with a materialistic and scientific approach to understanding the universe and our place in it. Peirce, on the other hand, particular in his later work, sees the whole of philosophy embedded within a scientific system and the pragmatic maxim centrally embedded in philosophy. The consequence is that James tends to see pragmatism, and his philosophy, as the stepping off point where materialist and purely intellectualist sciences fail to answer our questions about which beliefs are justifiable. Religious and moral questions require a separate criterion of justification, and this is where a pragmatic method determines what difference I take some such belief to have, and why it is reasonable to hold that belief.

For Peirce, philosophy in general, and the pragmatic maxim in particular, should never stray this far from scientific inquiry. The important philosophical questions, and those with which the pragmatic maxim are concerned, remain firmly within the realm of scientific and intellectualist inquiry. As far as Peirce is concerned, the questions to which James is inclined to apply a pragmatic method are largely beyond the realm of fruitful philosophical inquiry. For Peirce pragmatism is strictly within the realms of scientific sensibilities: for James, it begins at the point where our scientific explanations fall short.

These two different outlooks on philosophy and pragmatism underwrite two very different attitudes to the usefulness of pragmatism entirely. Peirce sees pragmatism as a logical principle. The maxim is a tool of analysis designed to make our concepts clear and logically precise. For James, pragmatism is a philosophical outlook. For him, pragmatism is an approach to philosophy that looks towards the consequences of belief, which looks at human action, and moves the whole enterprise of understanding them, away from scientifically founded philosophy. These two different attitudes result in some further interesting features of the two philosophies.

Firstly, James’ pragmatism, in many ways, looks like a total break with traditionalist concerns. For James, pragmatism makes a move away from the philosophies of Kant and Hegel, with their emphasis upon first principles, categories etc. Indeed, the neo-pragmatism of Richard Rorty takes James’ work to be the decisive shift from traditional philosophy to modern concerns. Of course, Peirce’s philosophy retains the architectonic approach with first principles and categories and looks traditionalist as a result. In many ways, it is these features of Peirce’s work that leaves Rorty unconvinced by Peirce’s status as a pragmatist philosopher.

In another respect though, it is James that looks to have remained within the traditionalist mold and Peirce’s pragmatism that looks progressive. James’ particular take on pragmatism looks towards the individual and the effects of belief upon some person or another. Peirce’s pragmatism on the other hand, looks towards experience in general and effects across persons. For Peirce, the establishment of habit across persons and communities is what is interesting about “practical upshots,” not individual action and reaction. The contrast between James’ individualist approach and Peirce’s communalism is interesting. Individualism is characteristic of much of traditional philosophy, particularly since Descartes, and in this respect, James retains much of the baggage of traditional philosophy. Peirce’s communalism, though, has a particular resonance with contemporary attitudes, particularly since the later Wittgenstein.

One final difference in the pragmatisms of Peirce and James, then, are their different attitudes to the reality of modal notions like possibility and necessity. James saw pragmatism as fundamentally “nominalistic.” As such, the reality of possibilities and so on is explained in James’ philosophy in a way similar to that of the early Peirce, i.e. subjective and epistemological. Peirce’s own mature take on modal notions, as we know, is to be a realist about “would-bes.” This makes his pragmatism focus less on actual occurrences and more on potential effects. It also has the further effect of making his pragmatism take the idea of laws and long run habit more seriously; the idea of natural law concerning the “hardness” of diamonds is, after all, part of his explanation of why the destroyed diamond can count as hard.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Peirce, C.S. 1931-58. The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, eds. C. Hartshorne, P. Weiss (Vols. 1-6) and A. Burks (Vols. 7-8). (Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press).
    • The first wide spread presentation of Peirce’s work both published and unpublished; its topical arrangement makes it misleading but it is still the first source for most people.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1982 —. The Writings of Charles S. Peirce: A Chronological Edition, eds. M. Fisch, C. Kloesel, E. Moore, N. Houser et al., (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • The ongoing vision of the late Max Fisch and colleagues to produce an extensive presentation of Peirce’s views on a par with The Collected Papers, but without its idiosyncrasies. Currently published in eight volumes (of thirty) up to 1884, it is rapidly superseding its predecessor.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1992-94. The Essential Peirce, eds. N. Houser and C. Kloesel (Vol. 1) and the Peirce Edition Project (Vol. 2), (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • A crucial two volume reader of the cornerstone works of Peirce’s writings. Equally important are the introductory commentaries by Nathan Houser.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1878/1992. “How To Make Our Ideas Clear.” In The Essential Peirce, Vol.1, eds. N. Houser and C. Kloesel. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press), pp. 124-141.
    • Peirce’s first statement of pragmatism and the source to which James refers as the seminary of his own pragmatism.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1903/1998. “Harvard Lectures on Pragmatism.” In The Essential Peirce, Vol.2., ed. The Peirce Edition Project. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press), chs. 10-16.
    • Often difficult later statement of Peirce’s pragmatism. It is here that Peirce tries to expound his own mature views on pragmatism as part of an architectonically embedded logic, dependent upon ethics and aesthetics.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1905/1998. “What Pragmatism Is.” In The Essential Peirce, Vol.2., ed. The Peirce Edition Project. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press), pp. 331-345.
    • One of Peirce’s late Monist articles on pragmatism where he publicly distinguishes his “pragmaticism” from the pragmatism of James. The rest of the Monist series, and other work on his “pragmaticism” are reproduced in The Essential Peirce, Vol.2 and are worth looking at.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Gruender, D. 1983. “Pragmatism, Science and Metaphysics.” In The Relevance of Charles Peirce, ed. Eugene Freeman. (La Salle, IL: Monist Library of Philosophy), pp. 271-291.
    • Expands the often-made comparison between Peirce’s pragmatic maxim and the verification principle by comparing Peirce’s and Carnap’s accounts of meaning and science.
  • Hookway, C.J. 1997. “Logical Principles and Philosophical Attitudes: Peirce’s Response to James’ Pragmatism.” In The Cambridge Companion to William James, ed. Ruth Anna Putnam. (New York: Cambridge University Press), pp. 145-165.
    • Interesting, useful and detailed comparison of the work of James and Peirce, emphasizing their different motivations in using pragmatism, with particular emphasis on Peirce’s own understanding of James’ work.
  • Hookway, C.J. 2000. “Avoiding Circularity and Proving Pragmatism.” In Truth, Rationality, and Pragmatism. (Oxford: Clarendon Press), pp. 285-303.
    • A discussion that takes Peirce’s later concerns with the logical status of pragmatism further than we have done here. Hookway details Peirce’s late concern with attempting to “prove” his own pragmatic maxim by discussing the structure that such a proof should take.
  • Houser, N. 1998. “Introduction to The Essential Peirce Vol. 2.” In The Essential Peirce, Vol.2, ed. The Peirce Edition Project. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press), pp. xvii-xxxviii.
    • Houser’s introduction and discussion of the papers included in The Essential Peirce Vol. 2, offers a detailed look at the development of Peirce later thoughts on pragmatism. Further, a discussion of Peirce’s efforts to a find a “proof” for his maxim provides useful insight into Peirce’s pragmatism.
  • Misak, C., 1991. Truth and the End of Inquiry. (Oxford: Oxford University Press)
    • In chapter one of this book, Misak discusses the pragmatic maxim at length and investigates its different formulations from early to late, assessing their shortcomings. Of particular interest, is her insistence on the importance of pragmatism to Peirce’s account of truth.

Author Information

Albert Atkin
Email: pip99aka@sheffield.ac.uk
University of Sheffield
United Kingdom