Some words can hurt. Slurs, insults, and swears can be highly offensive and derogatory. Some theorists hold that the derogatory capacity of a pejorative word or phrase is best explained by the content it expresses. In opposition to content theories, deflationism denies that there is any specifically derogatory content expressed by pejoratives.
As noun phrases, ‘insult’ and ‘slur’ refer to symbolic vehicles designed by convention to derogate targeted individuals or groups. When used as verb phrases, ‘insult’ and ‘slur’ refer to actions performed by agents (Anderson and Lepore 2013b). Insulting or slurring someone does not require the use of language. Many different kinds of paralinguistic behavior could be used to insult(verb) or slur(verb) a targeted individual. Slamming a door in an interlocutor’s face is one way to insult them. Another way would be to sneer at them. Arguably, one could slur a Jewish person by performing a “Nazi salute” gesture in their presence. This article focuses on the linguistic meaning(s) that pejorative words encode as symbolic vehicles designed by convention to derogate (or harm) their targets.
Furthermore, it is important to delineate the differences between slurring and insulting. The latter is a matter of causing someone to be offended, where offense is a subjective psychological state (Hom 2012, p 397). Slurring, contrastly, does not require offending a target or eliciting any reaction whatsoever. For instance, the word ‘nigger’, used pejoratively at a Ku Klux Klan rally, derogates African Americans even if none are around to be offended by its use.
This section focuses on five central features of pejoratives: practical features, descriptive features, embedded uses, expressive autonomy and appropriation. An explanation of these features is among the desiderata for an adequate theory of pejoratives.
There is a family of related practical features exhibited by pejoratives. First, pejoratives have the striking power to influence and motivate listeners. Insults and slurs can be used as tools for promoting destructive ways of thinking about their targets. Calling someone ‘loser’, for example, is a way of soliciting listeners to view them as undesirable, damaged, inferior, and so forth. Racial slurs have the function of propagating racism in a speech community. ‘Nigger’, for example, has the function of normalizing hateful attitudes and harmful discriminatory practices toward various “non-white” groups. Speakers have used the term to derogate African Americans, Black Africans, East Indians, Arabs, and Polynesians (among others). This is not to suggest that the derogation accomplished by means of pejoratives is always highly destructive. In some circumstances, insults like ‘asshole’ can be used to facilitate mild teasing between friends.
Second, some pejoratives tend to make listeners feel sullied. In some cases, merely overhearing a slur is sufficient for making a non-prejudiced listener feel complicit in a speaker’s slurring performance (Camp 2013) (Croom 2011). Third, different pejoratives vary in their levels of intensity (Saka 2007, p 148). For instance, ‘nigger’ is much more derogatory toward Blacks than ‘honky’ is toward Whites. Even different slurs for a particular group can vary in their derogatory intensity (for example, ‘nigger’ is more derogatory than ‘negro’). Further, pejoratives exhibit derogatory variation across time. While ‘negro’ was once used as a neutral classifying term, it is now highly offensive (Hom 2010, p 166). A successful theory of pejoratives will need to account for their various practical features.
Gibbard (2003) suggests that the notion of a thick ethical concept, due to Williams (1985), can shed light on the meaning of slurs. In comparison with thin ethical concepts (such as right and wrong, just and unjust), thick ethical concepts contain both evaluative and descriptive content. Paradigm examples include cruel, cowardly and unchaste. For Williams, terms that express thick ethical concepts not only play a role in prescribing and motivating action; they also purport to describe how things are. To say that a person is cruel, for example, is to say that they bring about suffering, and they are morally wrong for doing so. (For more on the distinction between thick and thin moral terms, see Metaethics.) According to Gibbard,
[r]acial epithets may sometimes work this way: where the local population stems from different far parts of the world, classification by ancestry can be factual and descriptive, but, alas, the terms people use for this are often denigrating. Nonracists can recognize things people say as truths objectionably couched. (2003, p 300)
Although Gibbard’s claim that slurring statements express truths that are “objectionably couched” is controversial, it does seem that slurs classify their respective targets. A speaker who calls an Italian person ‘spic’ does not merely say something offensive and derogatory – said speaker simulateneously makes a factual error in classifying his target incorrectly. Similarly, the insult ‘moron’ appears to both ascribe a low level of intelligence to its targets and evaluate them negatively for it. Additionally, as the following example illustrates, some swear words seem to contain descriptive content:
(1) A: Tom fucked Jerry for the first time last week.
B: No, they fucked for the second time last week; the first was two months ago.
Also, consider the following example (Hom 2010, p 170):
(2) Random fucking is risky behavior.
There appears to be genuine disagreement between A and B in (1) and someone who asserts (2) has surely made a claim capable of being true or false. A successful theory of pejoratives should explain, or explain away, apparent descriptive, truth-conditional features.
Potts (2007) observes that most pejoratives appear to exhibit nondisplaceability: the use of a pejorative is derogatory even as an embedded term in a larger construction. An indirect report or a conditional sentence are often vehicles of nondisplacibility; direct quotations, however, are excluded. Consider, for example, that Sue has uttered (3) and another speaker attempts to report on her utterance with (4):
(3) That asshole Steve is on time today.
(4) Sue said that that asshole Steve is on time today.
As long as the occurrence of ‘asshole’ is not read as implicitly metalinguistic—with a change in intonation or an accompanying gesture indicating that the speaker wishes to distance herself from any negative feelings toward Steve—listeners will interpret the speaker of (4) as making a disparaging remark about Steve, even if the speaker is merely attempting to report on Sue’s utterance.
Like the insult ‘asshole’, the gendered slur ‘bitch’ appears to scope out of indirect reports. Suppose Eric utters (5) and someone tries to report on his utterance with (6):
(5) A bitch ran for President of the United States in 2008.
(6) Eric said that a bitch ran for President of the United States in 2008.
It would be difficult to use (6) to give a neutral (non-sexist) report of Eric’s offensive claim. Unless a metalinguistic reading is available for the occurrence of ‘bitch’, anyone who utters (6) in an attempt to report on Eric’s utterance of (5) risks making an offensive claim about women (Anderson and Lepore 2013a, p 29).
Potts claims that one way in which pejoratives are nondisplaceable is that they always tell us about the current utterance situation (2007, p 169-71). Consider
(7) That bastard Kresge was late for work yesterday (#But he’s no bastard today, because he was on time)
Despite the fact that ‘bastard’ is within the scope of a tense operator in (7), it would be implausible to read the speaker as claiming that she disliked Kresge only in the past, as the defective parenthetical (indicated by the hash sign) illustrates.
However, not all pejoratives behave the same way when embedded. Consider (8)-(11):
(8) If Steve doesn’t finish his report by the end of the week, he’s fucked (but I suspect he’ll finish on time.)
(9) Suppose our new employee, Steve, is a bastard (On the other hand, maybe he’ll be nice)
(10) Steve is not a bastard (I think he’s a good guy).
(11) Steve used to be a real fucker in law school (but I like him much better now).
A speaker who utters (8)-(11) need not be said to have made a disparaging claim about Steve. This is because the occurrences of ‘fucked’, ‘bastard’, and ‘fucker’ in (8)-(11) appear to be “narrow-scoping” (Hom 2012, p.387). Thus, at least some embedded uses of pejoratives seem not to commit the speaker to an offensive claim (compare the non-defective parentheticals in these cases with the defective one in (7)).
Slurring words, however, appear to behave differently. As (12) and (13) illustrate, slurs are just as offensive and derogatory when uttered as part of a supposition or embedded in a conditional sentence as when they are used in predicative assertions:
(12) If the guys standing at the end of my driveway are spics, I’ll tell them to leave (#Fortunately, there is no such thing as a spic, since no one is inferior for being Hispanic)
(13) Suppose the next job applicant is a nigger. (#Of course that won’t happen, since no one is inferior for being Black.)
Notice the defectiveness of the parentheticals as attempts to cancel the derogatoriness of the preceding sentences. In general, slurs appear to take wide scope relative to all truth-conditional operators, including negation. Consider the following explicit attempt to reject a racist claim:
(14) It is not the case that Ben is a kike; he is not Jewish!
(14) fails to undermine the derogatoriness of the slur ‘kike’. Seemingly, the trouble is that it only disavows a derogatory way of thinking about Ben, and so it cannot be used to reject a racist attitude toward Jews in general (Camp 2013). Further, as Saka (2007, p 122) observes, even Tarskian disquotational sentences containing slurs appear to express hostility:
(15) “Nietzsche was a kraut” is true iff Nietzsche was a kraut.
A successful theory of pejoratives must explain the behavior of embedded pejorative words and phrases, and more specifically, must account for the fact that slurring words and insulting words appear to behave differently within the scope of truth-conditional and intensional operators. A successful theory must also resolve the apparent tension between the putative descriptive features of slurs, and their behavior under embedding.
The expressive power of a pejorative term is autonomous to the extent that it is independent of the attitudes of particular speakers who use the term. Slurring words appear to exhibit derogatory autonomy– their derogatory capacity is independent of the attitudes of speakers who use them (Hom 2008, p426). For instance, a racist who intends to express affection toward Italians by asserting, ‘I love wops; they are my favorite people on Earth’, has still used the slur in a patently offensive manner (Anderson and Lepore 2013a, p33). Likewise, a competent speaker who knows that ‘kike’ is a term of abuse for Jews could not stipulate a non-derogatory meaning by uttering, “What’s wrong with saying that kikes are smart? By ‘kike’, I just mean Jews, and Jews are smart, aren’t they?” (Saka 2007, p 148).
Some pejoratives are used systematically to accomplish aims other than those for which they were designed. Appropriation refers to the various systematic ways in which agents repurpose pejorative language. For certain slurs, the target group takes over the term to transform its meaning to lessen or to eliminate its derogatory force. This is one variety of appropriation known as linguistic reclamation(Brontsema 2004). The term ‘queer’ is a paradigm case. Although ‘queer’ once derogated those who engaged in sexually abnormal behavior, the term ‘queer’ now contains little to no derogatory force as a result of homosexual women and men appropriating the term. Now, non-prejudiced speakers can use the term ‘queer’ in a various contexts. For instance, phrases such as ‘queer studies program’ and ‘queer theory’ do not derogate homosexuals. In contrast, the slur ‘nigger’ -often marked by an alternative spelling ‘nigga’- has been appropriated more exclusively by the target group, and is often used as a means of expressing camaraderie between group members (Saka 2007, p145). Barring a few rare exceptions, targeted speakers can use the term to refer to one another in a non-denigrating way. Appropriated uses of ‘nigger’ are common in comedic performances and satire. The use of ‘nigger’ in a comedy bit designed to mock and criticize racism need not commit the speaker to racist attitudes (Richard 2008, p.12).
Insults are also subject to appropriation. In some contexts, an insult can be used to express something more jocular or affectionate than hateful, such as in the phrase: ‘George is the most lovable bastard I know’. A successful theory of these phenomena need to account for their various appropriated uses.
According to content theories, pejorative words are derogatory in virtue of the content they express. This section contains an overview and discussion of several content theories and their merits, followed by standard criticisms.
For Gottlob Frege, two aspects to the meaning of a term are its reference and its sense. The reference is what the term denotes, while the sense provides instructions for picking out the reference. (For more on this distinction see Gottlob Frege: Language.) Additionally, Frege posited an expressive realm of meaning separate from sense and reference. For Frege, a word’s färbung (often translated as ‘coloring’ or ‘shading’) is constituted by the negative or positive psychological states associated with it that play no role in determining the truth-value of utterances that include it. The terms ‘dog’ and ‘cur’, for example, share the same sense and reference, but the latter has a negative coloring – something like disgust or contempt for the targeted canine (Frege 1892, p.240). Likewise for the neutral term ‘English’ and the slur ‘Limey’, which was once applied exclusively to English sailors, but now targets English people generally:
(16) Mary is English.
(17) Mary is a Limey.
For Frege, both (16) and (17) are true just in case Mary is English. However, for most speakers, ‘English’ is neutral in coloring, while ‘Limey’ is associated with negative feelings for English people.
Although the Fregean approach accounts for the descriptive features of pejoratives as well as the behavior of slurs when embedded, most contemporary theorists reject it (see, for example, Hom (2008)). For Frege, “coloring and shading are not objective, and must be evoked by each hearer or reader” (1897, p 155). On his view, a pejorative term’s coloring is not conventional (in any sense of the term); rather, coloring consists only in subjective (non-conventional) associations speakers have with the term. Dummett (1981) diagnoses the problem with positing an essentially subjective realm of meaning: the meaning of a linguistic sign or symbol cannot be in principle subjective, since it is what speakers conveyto listeners. Given the subjective nature of coloring, Fregeans are committed to holding that the derogatory power of slurs is due to subjective associations held by speakers and listeners. As a result, Fregeans will have difficulty accounting for expressive autonomy (Hom 2008, p 421). For instance, Fregeans will have trouble explaining why ‘nigger’ can be just as derogatory in the mouth of a racist as it is when uttered by a non-racist. In reply, Fregeans might offer a dispositional theory of coloring. Consider an analogy with a dispositional theory of color, according to which a thing is yellow, for example, if it disposes normal agents in appropriate conditions to have a qualitative experience of yellow. Similarly, Fregeans might hold that a slur S has a negative coloring to the extent that uttering or hearing S disposes speakers and listeners to have derogatory attitudes toward the target. This approach could generalize to other pejorative terms. Consider Frege’s example of ‘cur’. On the revised version of the theory, ‘cur’ has a negative coloring to the extent that competent listeners who hear the term predicated of a dog are disposed to think of the targeted canine as flea-ridden, mangy, and dangerous. Such an account might be promising, but much more would need to be said about how hearing the word disposes listeners to think in derogatory ways. As it stands, the Fregean view does little to explain how pejoratives can be so rhetorically powerful.
Another main theory of pejoratives is a descendent of the metaethical view known as expressivism. According to the version of expressivism developed by Ayer (1936), moral and aesthetic statements do not express propositions capable of being true or false, and merely serve to express and endorse the speaker’s own moral sentiments. For Ayer, an assertion of ‘Stealing is wrong’ does not express a truth-evaluable proposition; rather, it merely expresses the speaker’s disapproval of stealing. (For more on expressivism, see Non-Cognitivism in Ethics.)
One might extend Ayer’s expressivism to cover pejoratives. On this view, derogatory statements containing pejoratives do not express propositions capable of being true or false – they merely express a non-cognitive attitude, such as disapproval, of the target group. An expressivist theory of pejoratives is well suited to explain the behavior of slurs under embedding. However, it will have difficulty accounting for their descriptive features. As noted above, a speaker who calls an Italian person ‘spic’ has seemingly made a classificatory error. If slurs lack descriptive content, and merely serve to express non-cognitive attitudes, then it is unclear how they could classify their targets.
Saka (2007) offers an alternative, hybrid expressivist theory of slurs, according to which slurs contain both expressive and descriptive content (see also Kaplan (2004)). Saka denies that there is a single belief or proposition expressed by slurring statements such as ‘Nietzsche was a kraut’. Rather, such statements express an attitude complex, which includes (i) the pure belief that Nietzsche was German, and (ii) a cognitive-affective state toward Germans (Saka 2007, p 143). Saka’s hybrid theory could plausibly account for the descriptive, truth-conditional features of pejoratives.
However, it is not clear that either the pure expressivist theory of pejoratives or Saka’s hybrid theory can extend to all pejoratives. According to a standard objection to metaethical expressivism, the so-called Frege-Geach problem, one can utter a sentence containing a moral predicate (such as ‘good’, ‘evil’, ‘right’, and ‘wrong’) as the antecedent or consequent of a conditional sentence without making a moral judgment. Expressivists about moral terms are unable to account for the sameness of content in both asserted and non-asserted contexts, so the objection goes. For example, as Geach (1965) observed, the following is a valid argument:
(18) If tormenting the cat is wrong, then getting your brother to do it is wrong.
(19) Tormenting the cat is wrong.
(20) Therefore, getting your brother to do it is wrong.
If, as the metaethical expressivist claims, ‘wrong’ merely expresses a speaker’s approval, then it is a mystery how the term ‘wrong’ could carry the same content in (19) and when embedded in the antecedent of the conditional sentence in (18), given that (19) expresses a moral judgment while (18) does not. Hom (2010) argues that expressivist theories of swears face a similar challenge. Consider the following argument:
(21) If George fucked up his presentation, he will be fired.
(22) George fucked up his presentation.
(23) Therefore, he will be fired.
In order for this argument to be valid, the pejorative term ‘fucked’ must have the same semantic content in (21) and (22), despite the fact that (21) does not express a negative attitude about George, while (22) does. It is difficult to see how the pure expressivist theory could account for this. Although Saka’s hybrid theory has the potential to explain the preservation of content between (21) and (22), his view will have difficulty accounting for the fact that (21) expresses no negative attitude about George.
Additionally, one might worry that the non-cognitive attitudes posited by expressivism are too underspecified to account for derogatory variation (‘kraut’ is less derogatory than ‘nigger’ is, and so forth). Do all pejoratives express something like ‘contempt’ or ‘hostility’ or do the negative attitudes differ for each term? Saka claims that derogatory variation among slurs is due to the historical circumstances that led to their introduction and sustain their derogatory power (Saka 2007, p148). But the appeal to historical context here is illicit if the derogatoriness of slurs is to be explained by an attitude complex expressed by speakers who use the term. After appealing to external institutions to explain the derogatory features of slurs, it appears that the posited attitude complex has no remaining explanatory work.
Finally, expressivists need to do more to explain how the expression of negative attitudes relates to the practical features of slurs. In particular, they need to specify a notion of expression that makes it clear how the expression of hostility (or contempt, and so forth) toward a target could motivate listeners to feel similarly.
Richard (2008) holds that slurs express derogatory attitudes toward their targets, but unlike Saka he claims that slurs lack truth-conditional content. Richard is not a pure expressivist, since he does not take the derogatory content of slurs to be a negative affective state. He denies that slurring speech is false by claiming that to apply the term ‘false’ to an utterance is to claim that the speaker made an error that can be corrected by judicious use of negation. Nevertheless, examples like “My neighbor isn’t a chink; she’s Japanese,” suggest that it cannot. Richard also denies that derogatory statements containing slurs can be true. He acknowledges that predicating a slur of someone entails classifying him or her as a member of a particular group, but he denies that correct classification suffices for truth. For instance, Richard holds that the anti-Semite can correctly classify a person as Jewish by calling them ‘kike’, but when a speaker slurs a Jewish person with ‘kike’, they have not simply classified them as Jewish nor have they merely expressed an affective state (like hatred or contempt) – they have misrepresented the target as being despicable for being Jewish. According to Richard, we cannot endorse the classification as true without also endorsing the representation as accurate. On his view, whatever truth belongs to a classification is truth it inherited from the thought expressed in making it, and the thought expressed by the anti-Semite who uses the slur ‘kike’ is the mistaken thought that Jews are despicable for being Jewish (Richard 2008, p. 24).
Although Richard’s view could potentially make sense of the behavior of slurs under embedding, he does not offer a positive theory of how slurs represent their targets. He might hold that the relevant sort of representation is imagistic. Perhaps hearing a slur puts an unflattering image of the target group in the minds of listeners. In any event, Richard offers no help here. Instead, he is interested only in establishing that there are numerous statements – among them, derogatory statements containing slurs – that have a determinate content, yet are not truth-apt. Others include applications of vague predicates to borderline cases and statements that give rise to liar paradoxes. As it stands, nothing in Richard’s view helps us see how misrepresenting a target by means of calling them a pejorative word has the power to motivate listeners to think derogatory thoughts about them. Thus, Richard’s view leaves the practical features of slurs unexplained.
Further, there are reasons to be doubtful of Richard’s claim that slurs always misrepresent their targets. While this claim seems plausible in the case of racial slurs, it is not obviously true of all slurring words. Consider ‘fascist’, which is a slur for officials in an authoritarian political system. On Richard’s view, to call Mussolini and Hitler fascists is to represent them as contemptible for their political affiliation. Presumably, this would not be to misrepresent them. Richard might agree, and respond that the concept of truth is not what we should use when evaluating a slurring performance as accurate or inaccurate. In that case, Richard still owes a positive account of how such words can accurately represent their targets. Absent these details, it is difficult to evaluate Richard’s claims.
Hornsby (2001) offers a theory of the derogatory content of slurs, but her view could be extended to cover other pejoratives:
It is as if someone who used, say, the word ‘nigger’ had made a particular gesture while uttering the word’s neutral counterpart. An aspect of the word’s meaning is to be thought of as if it were communicated by means of this (posited) gesture. The gesture is made, ineludibly, in the course of speaking, and is thus to be explicated…in illocutionary terms. (p 140)
According to Hornsby, the gestural content of a slur cannot be captured in terms of a proposition or thought. Rather, “the commitments incurred by someone who makes the gesture are commitments to targeted emotional attitudes” (2001, p140). Hornsby’s gestural theory has the potential to account for slurs’ expressive autonomy and their offensiveness when embedded. Unfortunately, Hornsby’s central thesis is unclear. On one interpretation, she holds that a speaker who uses a slur actually performs a pejorative gesture in the course of uttering it, although the gesture itself is elliptical. On another interpretation, she is claiming only that using a slur is analogous to performing a derogatory gesture. For either interpretation, there is a lacunae in Hornsby’s theory. If the first interpretation is what Hornsby intends, she owes an account of what the posited gestures are supposed to be. Perhaps she thinks that to call an African American ‘nigger’ is to perform an elliptical “throat slash” in their direction (Hom 2008, p418). Or maybe uttering ‘nigger’ amounts to giving targets “the finger”. If this is what Hornsby intends, she owes an account of how it is possible to perform an elided gesture. On the other hand, if Hornsby is merely claiming that derogatory uses of slurs are analogous to pejorative gestures, she needs to specify how tight the analogy is.
Camp (2013) offers a perspectival theory of slurs. On her view, slurs are so rhetorically powerful because they signal allegiance to a perspective, which is an integrated, intuitive way of thinking about the target group (p335). For Camp, a speaker who slurs some group G non-defeasibly signals his affiliation with a way of thinking and feeling about Gs as a whole (p340). The perspectival account offers an explanation for why slurs produce a feeling of complicity in their hearers, that is, why non-racist listeners tend to feel implicated in a speaker’s slurring performance. Camp describes two kinds of complicity. First, there is cognitive complicity:
The nature of semantic understanding, along with the fact that perspectives are intuitive cognitive structures only partially under conscious control, means that simply hearing a slur activates an associated perspective in the mind of a linguistically and culturally competent hearer. This in turn affects the hearer’s own intuitive patterns of thought: she now thinks about G’s in general, about the specific G (if any) being discussed, and indeed about anyone affiliated with Gs in the slurs’ light, however little she wants to. (p343)
Second, there is social complicity: the fact that there exists a word designed by convention to express the speaker’s perspective indicates that the perspective is widespread in the hearer’s culture, and being reminded of this may be painful for non-prejudiced listeners (Camp 2013, p344; see also Saka 2007, p 142). Camp’s theory also has the potential to explain linguistic reclamation. When a slur is taken over by its target group and its pejorative meaning is transformed; the derogatory perspective it once signaled becomes detached and the term comes to signal allegiance to a neutral (or positive) perspective on the target.
One might take issue with Camp’s claim that complicity is due to speakers signaling the presence of racist attitudes. In general, merely signaling one’s own perspective is insufficient for generating complicity. For instance, one might signal one’s libertarian political perspective by placing a ‘Ron Paul’ bumper sticker on one’s car, yet this behavior is not likely to make observers feel complicit in the expression of a libertarian perspective. Even signaling one’s racist attitudes need not lead others to feel complicit. For instance, one might overtly signal a racist perspective by refusing to sit next to members of a certain race on a bus or by crossing the street whenever a member of a certain race is walking toward them; however, in most cases, this sort of behavior is not likely to activate a derogatory perspective in observers or make observers feel complicit. Thus, the fact that slurs signal a derogatory perspective, if it is a fact, does not explain why slurs tend to make listeners feel complicit in the expression of a derogatory attitude.
In some cases, what a speaker means is not exhausted by what she literally says. Grice (1989) distinguishes what a speaker literally says with her words from what she implies or suggests with them. Grice posited two kinds of implicature: conversational and conventional. When a speaker communicates something by means of conversational implicature, she violates (or makes as if to violate) a conversational norm, such as provide as much information as is required given the aim of the conversation. The hearer, working on the assumption that the speaker is being cooperative, attempts to derive the implicatum (that is, what the speaker meant, but did not literally say) based on the words used by the speaker and what conversational norm she has (apparently) violated. Suppose that Professor A has written a letter of recommendation for her philosophy student, X, that reads, “Mr. X’s command of English is excellent, and his attendance at tutorials has been regular” (Grice 1989, p 33). The reader, recognizing that A does not wish to opt out, will observe that she has apparently violated the maxim of quantity: seemingly, she has not provided enough information about X’s philosophical abilities for the reader to make an assessment. The most reasonable explanation for A’s behavior is that she thinks X is a rather bad student, but is reluctant to explicitly say so, since doing so would entail saying something impolite or violating some other norm. According to Grice, sometimes the conventional meaning of a term determines what is implied by usage of the word, in addition to determining what is said by it. If a sentence s conventionally implies that Q, then it is possible to find another sentence s*, which is truth-conditionally equivalent to s, yet does not imply that Q. Consider the sentences ‘Alexis is rich and kind’ and ‘Alexis is rich, but kind’. For Grice, these two sentences have the same literal truth-conditions (they are true just in case Alexis is both rich and kind), but only the latter implies that there is a contrast between being rich and kind (in virtue of the conventional meaning of ‘but’). (For more on Grice’s theory of implicature, see Philosophy of Language.)
One might apply Grice’s theory of implicature to pejoratives. A theory that understands pejorative content as conversationally implicated content has little chance of succeeding. First, it seems that the pejorative meaning of a slur needn’t be worked out by the listener in the way that a conversational implicature must be (Saka 2007, p136). Second, conversational implicata are supposed to be cancellable, but the derogatory content of a slur is not (Hom 2008, p434). According to Grice, for any putative conversational implicatureP, it will always be possible to explicitly cancel P by adding something like ‘but not P’ or ‘I do not mean to imply that P’. And it is clear that the derogatory contents of slurs are not explicitly cancellable, as the following defective example illustrates: ‘That house is full of kikes, but I don’t mean to disparage Jewish people’.
Stenner (1981), Whiting (2007, 2013) and Williamson (2009) have argued that the derogatory content of some pejorative words and phrases is best understood in terms of conventional implicature. According to a conventional implicature account of slurs (hereafter, the ‘CI account’), slurs and their neutral counterparts have the same literal meaning, but slurs conventionally imply something negative that their neutral counterparts do not. For instance, ‘Franz was German’ and ‘Franz was a Boche’ are the same at the level of what is said – they have the same literal truth-conditions, that is, they are both true just in case Franz was German. But ‘Franz was a Boche’ conventionally implies the false and derogatory propositionthat Franz was cruel and despicable because he was German. One virtue of the CI account is that it explains the descriptive features of pejoratives as well as expressive autonomy.
One objection to the CI account is that it is controversial whether there is any such thing as conventional implicature. Bach (1999) argues that putative cases of conventional implicature are actually part of what is said by an utterance. Bach devised the indirect quotation (IQ) test for conventionally implicated content. Suppose that speaker A has uttered (24), and speaker B has reported on A’s utterance with (25):
(24) She is wise, but short.
(25) A said that she is wise and short.
According to Bach, since B has left out important information in her indirect report, namely information about the purported contrast between being wise and short, that information must have been part of what was said, as opposed to what was implied, by A’s utterance. Hom (2008) uses Bach’s IQ test to undermine the CI account of slurs. Suppose A uttered (26) and B reported on A’s utterance with (27):
(26) Bill is a spic.
(27) A said that Bill is Hispanic.
According to Hom, since B has misreported A, the derogatory content of the slur must be part of what is said, and so the CI account fails. Notice, however, that Hom’s use of Bach’s test does not show that the derogatoriness of slurs must be part of their literal semantic content, since “what is said” could refer to pragmatically enriched content (see, for example, Bach (1994)). A more serious objection is that even if Griceans are correct in holding that an utterance of ‘Italians are wops’ carries a negative implicature about Italians, more would need to be said in order to explain how implying something negative about Italians could bring about complicity in listeners, and motivate listeners to discriminate against Italians. Consider a paradigm case of conventional implicature: a speaker who asserts ‘P but Q’ commits herself to a contrast between P and Q by virtue of the conventional meaning of ‘but’. However, there is no reason to think that bystanders would automatically feel complicit in the speaker’s claim. Yet listeners often find themselves feeling complicit in the expression of a negative attitude just by overhearing a slur. Even if terms like ‘but’ are capable of triggering a kind of complicity, it is surely not the robust sort of complicity triggered by slurs. Potts (2007) offers a non-propositional version of the CI account. Potts understands pejorative content in terms of expressive indices, which model a speaker’s negative (or positive) attitudes in a conversational context. He offers the following schema for an expressive index:
<a I b>
where a and b are individuals, and I is an interval that represents a’s positive or negative feelings for b in the conversational context. The more narrow the interval, the more intense the feeling. If I = [-1, 1], then ais essentially indifferent toward b. If I = [0.8, 1], then a has a highly positive attitude toward b. If I = [-0.5, 0], then a has negative feelings for b. For Potts, the conventionally implicated content of a pejorative is a function that alters the expressive index of a conversational context. So, for example, if Bill calls George a ‘spic’, the expressive index might shift from <Bill [-1, 1] George>, where Bill is indifferent to George, to <Bill [-0.5, 0] George>, where Bill has negative feelings toward George. Potts’s theory could potentially account for complicity. He might argue that a feeling of complicity results from taking part in a conversation whose expressive index has been lowered due to the use of a slur. One problem with Potts’s theory is that expressive indices are supposed to measure psychological states of conversation participants, and these can depend on a variety of idiosyncratic features of the participants – their background beliefs, values, and so forth. This makes it difficult to see how the expressive content of pejoratives could be objective and speaker-independent (Hom 2010, p180).
Additionally, Potts’s numerical modeling of attitudes seems too coarse-grained to explain the differences between slurs and other pejoratives. One could shift the expressive index of a conversation by using an insult like ‘asshole’ or even by using non-pejorative language. For instance, Bill might lower the expressive index in a conversation about his colleague, George, by pointing out that George is late for work and that he’s not dressed appropriately for the office. Bill could also lower the index by uttering, ‘Here comes George!’ in a contemptuous tone of voice. If Potts is correct, the pejorative content of slurs like ‘nigger’, ‘chink’, and ‘spic’ should be understood in terms of expressive indices. However, in that case, Potts will have difficulty explaining the distinctively racist nature of these words, which derogate individuals qua members of particular racial groups.
In the philosophical literature, to presuppose a proposition P is to take P for granted in a way that contrasts with asserting that P (Soames 1989, p.553). According to one widely accepted theory, presupposed content is best understood in terms of attitudes and background beliefs of speakers. According to Robert Stalnaker’s theory of pragmatic presupposition, each conversation is governed by a conversational record, which includes the common ground, that is, the background assumptions mutually accepted by participants for the purposes of the conversation. The pragmatic presuppositions of an utterance are the requirements it places on sets of common background assumptions built up among conversational participants (Soames 1989, p.556). Mutually accepted background assumptions are subject to change over the course of a conversation. Lewis (1979) observes that information can be added to (or removed from) the conversational record when necessary in order to forestall presupposition failure and make what is said conversationally acceptable. For instance, if a speaker says, ‘Avery broke the copy machine’ in the course of a conversation, and it was not already mutually understood by the speaker and her listeners that a copy machine was damaged, then it will be assumed for the purposes of the conversation that some salient copy machine was broken. Schlenker (2007) argues that pejorative content is best understood in terms of presupposition. Consider how the presupposition theory covers slurs. Suppose (28) is asked in a conversation:
(28) Was there a honky on the subway today?
According to Schlenker, if none of the conversation participants dissent, a derogatory proposition (or set of such propositions) – for example, that Caucasians are despicable for being Caucasian, that the speaker and the audience are willing to treat Caucasians as despicable – is incorporated into common ground.
There are several problems with the presupposition theory of pejoratives. First, as Potts (2007), Hom (2010), and Anderson and Lepore (2013a) observe, presuppositions can be cancelled when sentences that trigger them are embedded in an indirect report, but the derogatoriness of embedded slurs cannot be cancelled. Compare (29) with (30):
(29) Frank believes that John stopped smoking, but John has never smoked.
(30) #Eric said that a nigger is in the white house, but Blacks are not inferior for being Black.
Ordinarily, an assertion of ‘John stopped smoking’ presupposes that John previously smoked. When embedded in an indirect report, however, the presupposition can be cancelled, as (29) illustrates. In contrast, (30) appears to convey something highly offensive, which cannot be cancelled by the right conjunct. If the presupposition account were correct, we would expect (30) to be inoffensive and non-derogatory. Also, as Richard (2008) has observed, derogation with slurs needn’t be a rational, cooperative effort between speakers. According to Richard,
[a] pretty good rule of thumb is that someone who is using these words is insulting and being hostile to their targets. But there is a rather large gap between doing that and putting something on the conversational record. If I yell ‘Smuck!’ at someone who cuts me off…[a]m I entitled to assume, if you don’t say ‘He’s not a smuck’, that you assume that the person in question is a smuck, or are hostile towards him? Surely not. (2008, pp.21-2)
Inferentialism is the thesis that knowing the meaning of a statement is a matter of knowing the conditions under which one is justified in making the statement; and the consequences of accepting it, which include both the inferential powers of the statement and anything that counts as acting on the truth of the statement (Dummett 1981, p 453). In this view, one knows the meaning of the term ‘valid’, for example, if one knows the criteria for applying ‘valid’ to arguments, and one understanding the consequences of such an application, namely that an argument’s validity provides a basis for accepting its conclusion so long as one accepts its premises.
Dummett (1981) offers an inferentialist account of slurs (see also Tirrell (1999) and Brandom (2000)). Dummett posits two inference rules for slurs: an introduction rule and an elimination rule. The introduction rule gives sufficient conditions for applying the slur to someone and the elimination rule specifies what one commits oneself to by doing so. Consider the slur ‘boche’, which was once commonly applied to people of German origin:
The condition for applying the term to someone is that he is of German nationality; the consequences of its application are that he is barbarous and more prone to cruelty than other Europeans. We should envisage the connections in both directions as sufficiently tight as to be involved in the very meaning of the word: neither could be severed without altering its meaning (454).
Williamson (2009) formalizes Dummett’s inference rules for ‘boche’ as follows:
x is a German
Therefore, x is a boche
x is a boche
Therefore, x is cruel
Brandom (2000) endorses the inferentialist account of slurs, and notes a sense in which slurs are unsayable for non-prejudiced speakers. On his view, once one uses a term like ‘boche’, one commits oneself to the thought that Germans are cruel because of being German. The only recourse for non-xenophobic speakers, Brandom concludes, is to refuse to employ the concept, since it embodies an inference one does not endorse. The inferentialist theory is well suited to explain the descriptive features of slurs as well as expressive autonomy. The theory also accounts for why a slur is derogatory toward an entire group of individuals, even when a speaker intends only to derogate a single person in a particular context with the term.
However, there are numerous objections to the inferentialist’s treatment of slurs. First, Hornsby (2001) questions whether it is possible to spell out for every slur the consequences to which its users are committed. Further, as Williamson (2009) observes, a speaker might grow up in a community where only the pejorative word for a group is used. For instance, someone may only know Germans as people who are ‘boche’ without knowing the term ‘Germans’. In that case, the speaker could be competent with ‘boche’ (she could know that it is a xenophobic term of abuse) without knowing the word ‘German’. Thus, knowing the ‘boche-introduction’ rule is not necessary for competency with the slur.
Hom (2008) offers a theory of the semantic content of slurs. According to Hom, the derogatory content of a pejorative term is wholly constituted by its literal meaning. Hom makes use of the semantic externalist framework first developed by Putnam (1975) and Kripke (1980). Semantic externalism holds that the internal state of the particular speaker of a word does not fully determine the word’s meaning, which is instead determined, at least partly, by external social practices of the linguistic community to which the word actively belongs. For more on semantic externalism, see Internalism and Externalism in the Philosophy of Mind and Language. According to Putnam (1975), one can competently use terms like ‘elm’ and ‘beech’ without understanding the complex biological properties of each kind of tree, as long as one stands in the right sort of causal relation to the social institutions that determine their meaning. Similarly, according to Hom, the meaning of a slur is determined by a social institution of racism that is constituted by a racist ideology and a set of harmful discriminatory practices. Hom offers the following formal schema for the semantic content of slurs:
Ought to be subject to p*1 + … + p*n because of being d*1 + … + d*nall because of being NPC*,
where p*1 + … + p*n are prescriptions for harmful discriminatory treatment derived from a set of racist practices, d*1 + … + d*n are negative properties derived from a racist ideology, and NPC* is the semantic value of the slur’s neutral counterpart (Hom 2008, p.431). Hom calls his view Combinatorial Externalism (CE). On this view, ‘chink’ expresses the following complex, socially constructed property as part of its literal meaning: ought to be subject to higher college admissions standards, excluded from managerial positions…, because of being slanty-eyed, devious…, all because of being Chinese.
According to Hom, one motivation for CE is that it accounts for the common intuition that slurs have empty extensions. A non-racist might say ‘There are no chinks; there are only Chinese.’ Given that no one ought to be subject to discriminatory practices because of their race, CE predicts that all racial slurs have null extensions. Hom’s semantic analysis also accounts for expressive autonomy, since the social institutions that determine the meanings of slurs are independent of the attitudes of particular speakers. Finally, CE accounts for non-derogatory, appropriated uses of slurs by in-group members. For Hom, when a targeted group appropriates a slur, they create a new supporting social institution for the term which imbues the term with a new (non-pejorative) semantic content.
Hom (2012) extends CE to cover swears. Consider Hom’s analysis of ‘John fucked Mary’:
to say that John fucked Mary is to say (something like) that they each ought to be scorned, ought to go to hell, ought to be treated as less desirable (if female), ought to be treated as more desirable (if male), ought to be treated as damaged (if female), …, for being sinful, unchaste, lustful, impure, … because of having sexual intercourse with each other. (Hom 2012, p 395)
In speech communities wherein ideologies support progressive ideas about sex and reject the meaning of the term, the term will come to have a different semantic content because the above prescriptions will no longer be a part of the semantic content of ‘fucked’.
CE faces several objections. First, the behavior of embedded slurs poses a problem for CE (see Richard (2008), Jeshion (2013) and Whiting (2013)). According to Hom (2012), derogation requires the actual predication of a slur to a targeted individual. Notice that a speaker who utters (31) has not literally assigned negative properties to anyone or prescribed negative practices for anyone, yet the utterance appears to be highly offensive and derogatory:
(31) If there are any spics among the job applicants, do not hire them.
If Hom is correct, non-prejudiced speakers should be able to endorse utterances like (31), since they would be true, given their false antecedents (Richard 2008, p17). In response, Hom (2012) suggests that wide-scoping intuitions about pejoratives can be explained by what they conversationally imply. (31) indicates that the speaker thinks that some Hispanic individuals are inferior and ought to be excluded from employment opportunities. However, if this is correct, there should be contexts where the speaker can felicitously follow up her utterance with ‘not that I mean to imply that Hispanic people are inferior or that they should be discriminated against’, since conversational implicata are cancellable. But the use of the slur in (31) seems non-defeasibly racist and derogatory. As Jeshion (2013) observes, following the utterance up with ‘but I don’t mean to imply anything derogatory’ does not get the speaker off the hook.
Finally, Jeshion (2013) objects that CE’s account of the semantic content of slurs has it backwards. She argues that ideologies and social practices must antedate slurs, and this is a problem because the use of a slur for a particular group often plays a role in the creation and development of such institutions and practices. If so, a social institution could not be the source of a slur’s pejorative content.
Anderson and Lepore (2013a, 2013b) deny that the characteristic features of slurs are due to the contents they express. Their proposal is simply that “slurs are prohibited words; as such, their uses are offensive to whomever these prohibitions matter” (2013a, p.21). Anderson and Lepore note that quotation does not always eliminate the offensiveness of pejoratives (see also Saka 1998, p.122). An utterance of (32), for example, would be offensive despite the quotational use of the slur it contains:
(32) ‘Nigger’ is a term for blacks.
Anderson and Lepore argue that content theorists will have difficulty accounting for the widespread practice of avoiding the word ‘nigger’ completely (using the locution ‘the N-word’ in place of quoting the term).
Deflationism accounts for the behavior of embedded slurs. However, it faces several objections. First, the theory offers little by way of an explanation of the practical features of slurs. (Croom 2011) Pointing out that slurs are prohibited words does not help us understand how they are such effective vehicles for spreading prejudice. Additionally, Whiting (2013) observes that it is possible for there to be slurs in the absence of taboos or social prohibitions. In a society in which the vast majority of speakers are prejudiced toward a particular racial group, and the targeted group members have internalized racist attitudes, it may be that no one objects to the use of slurs or finds them offensive, yet slurs might still be derogatory. Thus, social prohibitions cannot be all there is to the derogatoriness of slurs.
Finally, by defining slurs as merely prohibited words, Anderson and Lepore rule out a priori the possibility of slurs that are appropriate and morally permissible. One example might be ‘fascist’, which targets individuals based on political affiliation; using this slur to denigrate an authoritarian dictator need not (and perhaps should not) be prohibited.
Since the 1980s, philosophical work on pejoratives has focused primarily on two questions: what (if anything) do pejoratives mean, and how is derogation by means of pejoratives accomplished? Researchers working on these questions would do well to familiarize themselves with empirical literature on pejoratives (for empirical studies on the behavioral and psychological effects of overhearing slurs, see Kirkland and others. 1987, Carnaghi and Maass 2007, and Gadon and Johnson 2009).
Work on slurs in the philosophy of language and linguistics has implications for debates in other disciplines. For instance, in answering the question of whether there should be legal restrictions on hate speech (which may involve the use of slurs), we will need to get clear on how hate speech harms its targets (Hornsby 2001). Legal theorists interested in these issues will want to pay careful attention to the literature discussed in this article. (For a discussion of whether laws against hate speech are justified, see Waldron 2012.)
University of Connecticut
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