Perception, Objects of

Objects of Perception

Objects of perception are the entities we attend to when we perceive the world. Perception lies at the root of all our empirical knowledge. We may have acquired much of what we know about the world through testimony, but originally such knowledge relies on the world having been perceived by others or ourselves using our five senses: sight, hearing, touch, taste, and smell. Perception, then, is of great epistemological importance. Also, a philosopher’s account of perception is intimately related to his or her conception of the mind, so this article focuses on issues in both epistemology and the philosophy of mind. The fundamental question we shall consider concerns the objects of perception: what is it we attend to when we perceive the world? We begin with five different answers to the question, "On what does my attention focus when I look at the yellow coffee cup in front of me?"

Table of Contents

  1. Direct Realism
  2. Indirect Realism
    1. The Argument from Illusion
    2. Problems for Indirect Realism
      1. Dualism
      2. Adverbialism
      3. The Veil of Perception
  3. Phenomenalism
    1. Problems for Phenomenalism
  4. The Intentional Theory of Perception
    1. Clarification of the Intentional Theory of Perception
      1. Non-Conceptual Content
      2. . Phenomenology
  5. Disjunctive Accounts of Perception
    1. Disjunctivism and Cognitive Externalism
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Direct Realism


Perceptual realism is the common sense view that tables, chairs and cups of coffee exist independently of perceivers. Direct realists also claim that it is with such objects that we directly engage. The objects of perception include such familiar items as paper clips, suns and olive oil tins. It is these things themselves that we see, smell, touch, taste and listen to. There are, however, two versions of direct realism: naïve direct realism and scientific direct realism. They differ in the properties they claim the objects of perception possess when they are not being perceived. Naïve realism claims that such objects continue to have all the properties that we usually perceive them to have, properties such as yellowness, warmth, and mass. Scientific realism, however, claims that some of the properties an object is perceived as having are dependent on the perceiver, and that unperceived objects should not be conceived as retaining them. Such a stance has a long history:

By convention sweet and by convention bitter, by convention hot, by convention cold, by convention colour; in reality atoms and void. [Democritus, c. 460-370 BCE, quoted by Sextus Empiricus in Barnes, 1987, pp. 252-253.]

Scientific direct realism is often discussed in terms of Locke’s distinction between primary and secondary qualities. The Primary qualities of an object are those whose existence is independent of the existence of a perceiver. Locke’s inventory of primary qualities included shape, size, position, number, motion-or-rest and solidity, and science claims to be completing this inventory by positing such properties as charge, spin and mass. The secondary qualities of objects, however, are those properties that do depend on the existence of a perceiver. They can either be seen as properties that are not actually possessed by the objects themselves, or, as dispositional properties, properties that objects only have when considered in relation to their perceivers. On the former interpretation, the cup itself is not yellow, but the physical composition of its surface, and the particular way this surface reflects light rays into our eyes, causes in us the experience of seeing yellow. And, on the latter interpretation, for an object to be yellow is for it to be disposed to produce experiences of yellow in perceivers. Locke is usually seen as being committed to this latter type of account:

Such qualities which in truth are nothing in the objects themselves, but powers to produce various sensations in us by their primary qualities. [Locke, 1690, 2.8.10]

The secondary qualities, then, comprise such properties as color, smell and felt texture.

We have seen that for the naïve realist, objects that are not actually being perceived continue to have all the properties we normally perceive them as having. For the scientific realist, however, only some of the properties we perceive continue to be possessed by objects when there are no perceivers around, these being their primary qualities.

The distinction between primary and secondary qualities is controversial in various ways, but that need not concern us here. What we should be clear on, however, is that the key feature of both naïve and scientific direct realism is that we directly attend to objects whose existence is independent of perceivers, objects that are out there in the world. The following section questions this whole approach.

2. Indirect Realism

The indirect realist agrees that the coffee cup exists independently of me. However, through perception I do not directly engage with this cup; there is a perceptual intermediary that comes between it and me. Ordinarily I see myself via an image in a mirror, or a football match via an image on the TV screen. The indirect realist claim is that all perception is mediated in something like this way. When looking at an everyday object it is not that object that we directly see, but rather, a perceptual intermediary. This intermediary has been given various names, depending on the particular version of indirect realism in question, including "sense datum, " "sensum," "idea," "sensibilium," "percept" and "appearance." We shall use the term "sense datum" and the plural "sense data." Sense data are mental objects that possess the properties that we take the objects in the world to have. They are usually considered to have two rather than three dimensions. For the indirect realist, then, the coffee cup on my desk causes in my mind the presence of a two-dimensional yellow sense datum, and it is this object that I directly perceive. Consequently, I only indirectly perceive the coffee cup, that is, I can be said to perceive it in virtue of the awareness I have of the sense data that it has caused in my mind. These latter entities, then, must be perceived with some kind of inner analog of vision. We shall first look at some weak arguments for this stance. After dismissing these we shall turn to the Argument From Illusion. This is a highly influential argument that many see as persuasive. In addition to supporting indirect realism, the other three theories of perception—phenomenalism, intentionalism and disjunctivism can be seen as responses to it.

As well as looking at my coffee cup, I can look out of my window and see the stars in the night sky. However, it is a fact (one that can amaze on first discovery) that the star at which I am currently looking may have ceased to exist. The pinpoint of light that I see has taken years to reach me, and in that time the star may have turned supernova. How can I, then, be directly attending to that star when it is no longer there? What must be happening is that the light rays that originated from that star have caused in me the presence of a perceptual intermediary, an intermediary that is still present in my mind, and thus, an intermediary to which I can still attend.

This argument can be applied not just to far distant objects, but to everything we perceive. Light also takes time to travel from the cup to my eyes. Therefore, I am now perceiving the cup as it was a fraction of a millisecond ago. The steam I see rising from it is actually further from the cup than it now appears to me. So again, it cannot be the steam that I directly see since I am not seeing it in the state that it is now in. It must, therefore, be a perceptual intermediary that I perceive.

This, however, is not a persuasive line of argument. One should reject the assumption that the object of perception has to exist at the moment we become perceptually aware of that object. Perception is a causally mediated process, and causation takes time. Because of this, at the time when perceptual processing is complete, the properties of perceived objects may be distinct from those possessed by the object at the time when their causal engagement with our perceptual apparatus began. As said, in extreme cases the objects of perception may no longer exist at the moment when the causal process of perception is complete. One should, therefore, accept that all the events we perceive are to some extent in the past.

The fact that perception is a complex causal process motivates some to offer another weak argument for the indirect realist position. There are many neurophysiological features and physiological entities such as retinal images that are involved in perception. Some conclude that I do not directly see the cup; I see it via such entities, and the indirect realist should take these to be his perceptual intermediaries. The correct response here is to agree (as one must) that such physiological items are indeed intermediaries in the process of perception. They are, however, intermediaries in a different sense. The indirect realist claims that we perceive his intermediaries -- we attend to them -- just as we do to our image in the mirror. His intermediaries are perceptually accessible. This, however, is plainly not true of the physiological components of the perceptual process. They are not, therefore, perceptual intermediaries in the correct sense. They are simply part of the causal mechanism that enables us to perceptually engage with objects, both those around us, and those in the far distance. So far, then, we do not have any reason to give up direct realism. Many, however, have seen the following argument as providing such a reason.

a. The Argument from Illusion

Illusions occur when the world is not how we perceive it to be. When a stick is partially submerged in water, it looks bent when in fact it is straight. From most angles plates look oval rather than round. (We still, of course, believe that the plate is circular and that the stick is straight because of what we know about perspective and refraction; but these objects can still look bent and elliptical if we resist interpreting what we see with respect to such knowledge.) As well as being prey to illusions, we can also have hallucinations in which there is nothing actually there to perceive at all. It is both of these phenomena that are seen to drive the following key argument for indirect realism.

I’ll partly submerge a pencil in my glass of water (the one that is next to my yellow coffee cup). The pencil appears bent. There is, then, a bent shape in my visual field. I know, however, that the pencil is not really bent. (Or, if this were a case of hallucination rather than illusion, there would not be a pencil there at all.) The bent shape of which I am aware, therefore, cannot be the real pencil in the world. Perhaps, then, it is a physical object on the surface of my cornea, or one floating inside my eyeball (it is possible to see such objects). Empirical evidence, however, has shown that there are no such objects that correlate with our perceptual experiences. So, if the bent shape is not a physical object, it must be something mental. As we have seen, these mental items have been coined “sense data”, and it must be these that we attend to in cases of illusion and hallucination.

Let us now turn to the veridical case. Cases of veridical perception are qualitatively identical to those of illusion or hallucination, and so there must be something in common between the normal case and these non-veridical ones. (This is a key assumption to which we shall return.) The conclusion we should draw, then, is that the common factor between the veridical and the non-veridical cases of perception is the presence of a sense datum. Therefore, in cases of veridical perception it is also sense data with which we perceptually engage. According to the orthodox interpretation, Locke can be seen as holding such a theory: “The mind…perceives nothing but its own ideas” [Locke, 1690, 4.4.3]. (Ideas, of course, being mental components akin to sense data.) And, this kind of theory has continued to have a distinguished following, its adherents include Bertrand Russell, Alfred J. Ayer and Frank Jackson (the latter, however, has recently abandoned this view).

There are various problems with this argument and we shall look at some of these in the following section. However, whether or not the argument is successful, there is no doubt that it has been highly influential. The theories of perception covered in the rest of this article are in part driven by the argument from illusion. Phenomenalism (section 3) accepts the existence of sense data, but denies that they play the role of perceptual intermediaries between the world and us. There is no world on the other side of our sense data; or, we should conceive of the material world as a construction of our sense data. Intentionalism (section 4) agrees that there is indeed something in common between the veridical and the non-veridical cases. However, this common factor should not be seen as an object, but rather, as intentional content. And finally, disjunctivism (section 5) undercuts the argument from illusion by rejecting the assumption that there must be something in common between the veridical and non-veridical cases. We will discuss these theories below, but first we shall consider the problems with the very idea of sense data, and with the argument from illusion itself.

b. Problems for Indirect Realism

i. Dualism

Many see a problem with respect to the metaphysics of sense data. Sense data are seen as inner objects, objects that among other things are colored. Such entities, however, are incompatible with a materialist view of the mind. When I look at the coffee cup there is not a material candidate for the yellow object at which I am looking. Crudely: there is nothing in the brain that is yellow. Sense data, then, do not seem to be acceptable on a materialist account of the mind, and thus, the yellow object that I am now perceiving must be located not in the material world but in the immaterial mind. Indirect realism is committed to a dualist picture within which there is an ontology of non-physical objects alongside that of the physical. There are, however, two major difficulties with dualism. These difficulties are outlined below.

The first and greatest problem for the dualist concerns explaining the interaction between mind and body. Remember, the indirect realist accepts that there is a world independent of our experience, and, in veridical cases of perception it is this world that somehow causes sense data to be manifest in our minds. How, though, can causal interactions with the world bring about the existence of such non-physical items, and how can such items be involved in causing physical actions, as they appear to be? If I have a desire for caffeine, then my perception of the coffee cup causes me to reach out for that cup. A non-physical sense datum causes the physical movement of my arm. Such causal relations seem to be counter to the laws of physics. The physical view of nature aims to be complete and closed: for every physical event there is a physical cause. Here, though, the cause of my reaching out for the cup is in part non-physical, and thus, the closure of physics is threatened. The only way to maintain both physical closure and the causal efficacy of the mental is to claim that there is overdetermination, i.e. that my reaching for the cup has two causes, one involving sense data, and one involving purely physical phenomena, either of which is in itself sufficient to bring about that action. This line, however, is difficult to accept since according to such an account my perception of the cup is incidental to my action: I would have reached for the cup even if I was not consciously aware that it was there. There are, then, problems in reconciling a non-physical conception of sense data with certain widely held views concerning causation.

A dualistically conceived mind appears to be paradoxical in the same way as fictional ghosts are: ghosts can pass through walls, yet they do not fall through the floor; they can wield axes yet swords pass straight through them. Similarly, the mind is conceived as both distinct from the physical world, and also causally efficacious within it, and it is not clear how the mind can coherently possess both features. Descartes himself admitted that he was stumped by the problem of how to account for the interaction between physical entities and the mental realm:

It does not seem to me that the human mind is capable of conceiving quite distinctly and at the same time both the distinction between mind and body, and their union; because to do so, it is necessary to conceive them as a single thing, and at the same time to conceive them as two things, which is self-contradictory. [Descartes, 1970, 142]

A second problem associated with the non-physical nature of sense data is that concerning their spatial location. Our perception presents objects as lying in spatial relations with respect to each other. According to the indirect realist, the objects of perception are sense data, and thus, our perceptual experience presents one sense datum as being in front of another, and that green one to the left of that red one: “The relative positions of physical objects in physical space must more or less correspond to the relative positions of sense data in our private spaces” [Russell, 1912, p. 15]. But how can this be so? On the Cartesian conception of dualism, the non-physical does not have spatial dimensions, and so how can one component of this realm be seen as in front of another? And, how can such non-physical entities be describable in the spatial way we describe physical bodies? How can a non-physical sense datum be round or square? The non-physical nature of sense data seems to threaten the coherence of an indirect realist description of sensory experience. We can say that we see the round green object as just to the left of the square red one if we are talking about spatially located objects in the world, but not if we are talking about non-physical mental items, items for which the idea of spatial location has no application.

ii. Adverbialism

Some see the argument from illusion as begging the question. It is simply assumed, without argument, that in the non-veridical case I am aware of some thing that has the property that the stick appears to me to have. It is assumed that some object must be bent. One can, however, reject this assumption: I only seem to see a bent pencil; there is nothing there in the world or in my mind that is actually bent. Only if you already countenance such entities as sense data will you take the step from something appears F to you to there is an object that really is F. Such an objection to indirect realism is forwarded by adverbialists. We can illustrate their claim by turning to other everyday linguistic constructions, examples in which such ontological assumptions are not made. “David Beckham has a beautiful free kick” does not imply that he is the possessor of a certain kind of object -- a kick -- something that he could perhaps give away or sell in the way that he can his beautiful car. Rather, we take this to mean that he takes free kicks beautifully. When one gives a mean-eye, one looks meanly at somebody else; one does not offer them an actual eye of some kind. Similarly, then, when one perceives yellow one is sensing in a yellow manner, or yellowly. Our perception should be described in terms of adverbial modifications of the various verbs characteristic of perception, rather than in terms of objects to which our perceptual acts are directed. As I sip my drink, I see brownly and smell bitterly; I do not attend to brown and bitter objects, the inner analogues of the properties of the cheap coffee below my nose. As Wittgenstein often took great pains to point out, many philosophical problems are simply the result of grammatical confusion, or, as Lowe puts it, “an inconvenient legacy of Indo-European languages” [Lowe, 1995, p. 45]. In describing our perceptual experiences we are not describing the visual and olfactory properties of mental items; but rather, we are talking about the manner in which we experience the external world. Thus, if one can give an account of what it is to experience in a brown and bitter manner, then one can account for perception without relying upon sense data. This, we shall see below, the intentionalist and the disjunctivist attempt to do.

iii. The Veil of Perception

Indirect realism invokes the veil of perception. All we actually perceive is the veil that covers the world, a veil that consists of our sense data. What, then, justifies our belief that there is a world beyond that veil? In drawing the focus of our perception away from the world and onto inner items, we are threatened by wholesale skepticism. Since we can only directly perceive our sense data, all our beliefs about the external world beyond may be false. There may not actually be any coffee cups or olive oil tins in the world, merely sense data in my mind. However, for this to be a strong objection to indirect realism, it would have to be the case that direct realism was in a better position with respect to skepticism, but it is not clear that this is so. The direct realist does not claim that his perceptions are immune to error, simply that when one correctly perceives the world, one does so directly and not via an intermediary. Thus, things may not always be the way that they appear to be, and therefore, there is (arguably) room for the sceptic to question one-by-one the veracity of all our perceptual beliefs.

3. Phenomenalism

Some have embraced the skepticism suggested by indirect realism and accepted the anti-realist position that there is no world independent of the perceiver. Two strategies that take this line are idealism and phenomenalism. Berkeley (1710) is an idealist. For him, physical objects consist in collections of ideas or, what have later come to be called, "sense data." It is only objects conceived of in this way of which we can have knowledge. Sense data, however, cannot exist if they are not being perceived, and so, ‘physical’ objects conceived of in this way are also dependent on perceivers. For Berkeley, therefore, the universe simply consists in minds and the sense data that they perceive. There is only immaterial substance.

A consequence of such an account would seem to be that when we do not perceive the world it does not exist; there are gaps in the existence of objects. Berkeley, however, attempts to avoid this conclusion by claiming that God "fills the gaps." God perceives the objects that are not perceived by us, and thus, sustains their existence; an existence, though, that subsists merely in the realm of ideas or sense data.

[A]ll the furniture of the earth….have not any subsistence without a mind…their being is to be perceived or known,….consequently, so long as they are not actually perceived by me or do not exist in my mind or that of any other created spirit, they must either have no existence at all or else subsist in the mind of some external spirit.... it being perfectly unintelligible….to attribute to any single part of them an existence independent of a spirit. [Berkeley, 1710, part 1, para. 6]

Such a position is of course highly problematic, but perhaps surprisingly, some of its idealistic elements were widely adopted in the early twentieth century by a group of philosophers called ‘phenomenalists.’

Idealists conceive of the world in terms of our actual experiences (and, for Berkeley, those of God). Phenomenalists hold a related position: for them, propositions about the physical world should be seen as propositions about our possible experiences. Or, as Mill (1867) claims, material objects are nothing but “permanent possibilities of sensation.” Phenomenalism is classically taken as a conceptual thesis: statements about physical objects have the same meaning as statements describing our sense data.

The meaning of any statement which refers to a material thing may be fully conveyed in statements which refer solely to sense-data or the sensible appearance of things. [Chisholm, 1948, p. 152. Note, however, that this is not Chisholm’s own view]

Phenomenalism, therefore, avoids the problem of gaps in a distinct way. Physical objects can exist unperceived since there is the continued possibility of experience. To say that the paper clip is in my drawer is to say that I would see it on opening that drawer. The world, then, is described in terms of our current sense data, and in terms of conditionals that detail which sense data we would encounter in counterfactual and future situations. We must, however, be careful to note the crucial difference between the realist and anti-realist readings of such conditionals. Realism, be it direct or indirect, has an account of why such a conditional holds: I will have the experience of perceiving a paper clip since there exists independent of my mind a real paper clip in the drawer. Phenomenalists, however, do not ground their conditionals in this way since there is no world independent of our (possible) experiences. To say that the paper clip is in my drawer, is simply to say that the flux of sense data characteristic of the experience of  opening a drawer will be followed by the experience of perceiving the silvery-colored sense data that constitutes a perception of a paper clip. There is no mention here of an independent world; such conditionals are only described in terms of the content of one’s experiences.

To make the phenomenalist claim clear, it is useful to look at the distinction between dispositional and categorical properties. Conditionals can be used to describe dispositional properties such as solubility: that lump of sugar is soluble since it will dissolve if I put it in my cup of coffee. Dispositional properties, however, usually have a categorical grounding. Sugar is soluble because of its chemical structure. The conditionals of the phenomenalist, however, should be taken as describing dispositions that do not have such a grounding. The regularities in our experience that they pick out do not have a categorical basis, unlike the psychological regularities of the realist that are grounded in our engagement with the existent external world. The experiential regularities of the phenomenalist are brute; nothing further can be said about why they hold.

a. Problems for Phenomenalism

For many, the idealistic nature of phenomenalism is unpalatable. A consequence of phenomenalism would seem to be that if there were no minds then there would be no world. This is so since ‘physical’ objects are simply constructs of our (possible) experience. Let us also consider the thoughts of others. I seem to be able to interpret what you are thinking by considering your behavior, by watching your actions and listening to your utterances. Your behavior, however, like the rest of the material world, simply consists of my sense data and the counterfactual relations of these mental items. Thus, phenomenalism invokes a solipsistic picture in which it is my sense data alone that constitute the world. A phenomenalist sitting here reading this article from the screen must claim that the computer monitor simply consists in the possibility of sensations that their own physical body (also a part of the material world) also has this nature, and that the people which can be seen in the street outside are similarly constructs of the phenomenalist’s own sense data. Phenomenalism is a very radical stance to take.

Also, even for those who do not have qualms about adopting such an idealistic and solipsistic stance, there are arguments which suggest that phenomenalism cannot complete the project it sets itself. A key argument against phenomenalism is the argument from perceptual relativity. Chisholm (1948) argues that one cannot provide translations of statements about physical objects in terms of statements about sense data. For a phenomenalist, the statement that there is an old green olive oil tin to my right means that the experience of reaching to the right would, on encountering the jagged rim, be followed by a sharp sensation; and that the sensation of turning my head would be followed by the presence of green sense data in my visual field. However, such fluxes of experience need not occur in this way. With gloves on, I would not feel such a sharp sensation; and, I may be color blind or the lights may be out and thus I may not experience green sense data. The sensations I have depend on various facts about me (the perceiver) and my environment. There are no lawlike conditional statements that describe the relation between sensations considered in isolation from physical aspects of the perceiver and of the world.

To calculate the appearances with complete success, it is necessary to know both the thing perceived and the (subjective and objective) observation conditions, for it is the thing perceived and the observation conditions working jointly which determine what is to appear. [Chisholm, 1948, p. 513]

A phenomenalist cannot account for such observation conditions since he is not permitted to talk of the physical states of the perceiver or those of the environment. He can only talk of sense data and the relations between them. Therefore, according to Chisholm, there are no phenomenalist translations to be had, and thus, phenomenalism fails.

4. The Intentional Theory of Perception

The last two positions at which we shall look deny that sense data are involved in perception. To do this they must find alternative responses to the argument from illusion, and they must provide a story that explains how we are in direct contact with the world.

Intentionalists emphasize parallels between perceptions and beliefs. Beliefs represent the world: I now have a belief about the pencil tin (the one that used to contain olive oil), and this belief represents that particular part of the world as being green. Beliefs, then, possess aboutness or what philosophers of mind call “intentionality.” Intentionality is considered to be an essential feature of the mind, and it describes the property that certain mental states have of representing -- or, being about -- certain aspects of the world. The aspects of the world that a belief is about can be specified in terms of its intentional content. The intentional content of my current belief is that tin is green. The intentionalist claim is that perceptions are also representational states (intentionalism is sometimes called representationalism). I can, then, believe that that tin is green, and I can also perceive that it is. You are about to perceive that the first word of the next paragraph is “Let.” Your perception is intentional: it is about a word on the screen; and, its content is that the next word is “Let.”

Let us see how the intentionalist reacts to the argument from illusion. The key claim will be that representational states can be in error. I can have false beliefs: I can believe that my cup is full when it is not; and I can have beliefs about non-existent entities: I can believe that the Tooth Fairy visited me last night. Such beliefs are analogous to the non-veridical perceptual cases of illusion and hallucination. In both belief and perception, the world is represented to be a certain way that it is not. And, crucially, the intentionalist has an account of what such veridical and non-veridical cases have in common: their intentional content. My perception has the representational content, there is a bent pencil there, whether or not there really is such a pencil in the world (I might have been duped and an actual bent pencil placed in the glass). In the veridical case this content correctly represents the world; in the non-veridical case it does not. Intentionalists, therefore, agree with sense datum theorists that there is an aspect of perception that is shared by the veridical and the non-veridical cases. This shared component, however, is not the presence of a perceptual object, but rather, that of a certain intentional content. Therefore, both intentionalists and sense datum theorists can be seen as providing representational accounts of perception: intentional content and the sense data of the indirect realist represent the state of the independent external world. Intentionalists, however, have representation without an ontological commitment to mental objects.

Intentionalism is driven by current themes in the philosophy of mind. Many in that field are optimistic about providing a broadly scientific, causal account of representation and intentionality. If one could provide such an account then a naturalistically acceptable theory of perception should be seen to drop out of this research. To explain perception one does not have to posit non-physical sense data; rather, one could simply use one’s naturalistic account of intentional content, since, according to intentionalists, the important features of perception are captured by this notion.

a. Clarification of the Intentional Theory of Perception

i. Non-Conceptual Content

There is a debate concerning the nature of the representational content relevant to perception. We are talking of content, so all are agreed that such content is evaluable as correct or incorrect. The question of whether the world is as it is represented to be is always pertinent. The debate, however, concerns whether all such representational content must be conceptually structured (see McDowell, 1994, lecture 3); or, whether some of the representational content involved in perception is non-conceptual (see Peacocke, 1992, chapter 3). (A concept is a constituent of thought that is apt for being the content of a judgment or a belief.) Two arguments that suggest the existence of non-conceptual content are those concerning the fine-grain of experience and the experience of animals.

It seems implausible that I have a distinct concept for every shade of brown that I perceive in the pair of battered old corduroy trousers that I am now wearing, or concepts corresponding to all the nuances of my neighbor’s distorted music that I am currently hearing through my study wall. Our experience appears to be more finely grained than our conceptual repertoire. If one is an intentionalist, then one could invoke representational content that is not conceptual to account for the richness of one’s experience. Also, many are unwilling to ascribe conceptual capacities to animals (at least if one goes far enough down the phylogenetic ladder). However, those same people are often less restrictive with their ascription of experiential properties. They would like to allow animals to have experiences and perception without a conceptual framework within which to structure them. If one is an intentionalist, then non-conceptual content could also be invoked to account for animal perception.

ii. Phenomenology

There are problems associated with accounting for the phenomenological features of perception. My experience consists in more than simply representing that the world is a certain way; it is also the case that the way I acquire representations strikes my consciousness distinctively. Right now there is a faint sound of a road drill syncopating with the reverse warning beep of a supermarket delivery truck; the yellow cup in front of me is slowly fading to brown as a cloud passes overhead; and the smell of coffee is struggling to get past my persistent cold and the pungency of my throat lozenges. All of this is part of my perceptual experience, and for the intentionalist, this experience consists in such representational content as, the truck is emitting a beep, and, my throat lozenge is pungent. There is also, however, something “it is like” to be having such representations (see Nagel, 1974). Our experience has a phenomenological dimension, a dimension that you are probably currently imagining. The shrill beep goes right though me, and the lozenge is so strong that although it pervades my consciousness, I somehow also feel sharper, clearer, more finely tuned to the quality of the air that I am breathing. The intentionalist, therefore, must also account for these phenomenological properties of perception. I shall look at two responses here, one that develops the intentionalist line in order to account for these features of perception, and one that takes such considerations to show that a pure intentionalist account is untenable.

One route that the intentionalist could take is to identify the phenomenological aspects of our experience with the representational. Naturalistically minded philosophers attempt to provide a causal account that explains how our mental states, experiences and perceptions have the intentional content that they do. One could, then, claim that the causal processes that ground intentional content also have a phenomenological aspect. It is the very same state that has both representational content and phenomenological features.

There are, however, problems associated with such a claim. Some see an unbridgeable gap between physical and phenomenological phenomena (see Levine, 1983). Any account couched in terms of the broadly physical properties of the brain cannot hope to capture the conscious, phenomenological dimension of thought and perception.

[There is] the feeling of an unbridgeable gulf between consciousness and brain process…This idea of a difference in kind is accompanied by slight giddiness. (Wittgenstein, 1953, § 412)

Others, however, see this explanatory gap as illusory (see Tye, 2002). Here, though, is not the place to pursue this debate.

The second broad response to the phenomenology of experience is to claim that representational properties alone cannot account for perception, and thus, one should reject the intentionalist project. If one is to account for what it is like to perceive the world, then one also requires sensational properties (properties distinct from those relevant to representation). Peacocke (1988) supports this line. He suggests examples in which there are aspects of our experience that have the same representational content, yet which differ in their phenomenological character. He therefore claims that representational content alone cannot account for phenomenology. Ahead of you on the motorway are two trucks, one just ahead and one near the horizon. You represent them as being of the same size and as moving at the same speed. There is, however, a sense in which the nearer one seems bigger to you -- it takes up more of your visual field -- and, it moves across your visual field at a faster rate. These features of your experience, then, are not captured in terms of representational content. Peacocke’s claim, therefore, is that “concepts of sensation are indispensable to the description of the nature of any experience” [Peacocke, 1983, p. 4].

Advocates of Peacocke’s line often favor the existence of qualia (singular: quale). These are seen (by some) as the non-representational, phenomenological properties of experience. One must, however, be very careful when reading the literature concerning qualia since the term is sometimes used in other ways. Others see it as merely referring to the phenomenological aspects of our experience (whether or not these can be captured in representational terms). In this sense, qualia are uncontroversial; they merely commit one to the claim that our experience is conscious. Others, notably Dennett (1991, chapter 12), take qualia to be essentially private, and our knowledge of them to be incorrigible. Conceived thus, he denies that there are such entities.

We have, then, been considering whether the phenomenological aspects of perception can be integrated into an intentionalist account. In summary, one can either identify these phenomenological features with the causal processes that are constitutive of the representational content of perception, or one can take such features to demand that an account of perception must include properties other than those that are representational.

5. Disjunctive Accounts of Perception

Finally we have a rather different approach. Disjunctivism denies the key assumption that there must be something in common between veridical and non-veridical cases of perception, an assumption that is accepted by all the positions above, and an assumption that drives the argument from illusion. For the disjunctivist, these cases certainly seem to be the same, but they are, however, distinct. This is because in veridical perception the world is presented to us. The world is not just represented as being a certain way, as for the intentionalist; but rather, the world partly constitutes one’s perceptual state. Thus, one’s perceptual state when hallucinating is entirely distinct from one’s perceptual state when actually attending to the world. To be in the state that I am in when I veridically perceive a green tin, there really has to be something there that is green. This, remember, is also one of the commitments of the sense datum theorist; but for the disjunctivist, the green item is in the world, it is not an internal mental object.

This position is called “disjunctivism” because when I seem to see a green tin, I am either perceiving a green tin or it is as if there is a green tin in front of me (a disjunction of perceptual states). I am not in a perceptual state that is common to both types of experience.

Of facts to the effect that things seem thus and so to one, we might say, some are cases of things being thus and so within the reach of one’s subjective access to the external world, whereas others are mere appearances. [McDowell, 1986, p. 241]

Disjunctivism can avoid the argument from illusion since it does not accept that veridical and non-veridical perceptual states are in any way the same (they only seem to be). We do not, therefore, have to posit a common factor, either in the form of a sense datum, or an intentional content. There is, then, a key difference between the strategies of the intentionalist and the disjunctivist: intentionalists answer the argument from illusion by claiming that veridical and non-veridical perceptions have a type of representational state in common, whereas disjunctivists undercut the argument by claiming that there is no need to posit such a common factor.

Proponents of disjunctivism see their position as upholding certain common sense assumptions about the nature of perception. It is claimed that both sense datum theorists and intentionalists do not account for the idea that it is the qualities of the tin in front of me of which I am directly conscious. This is because for the former it is the qualities of a mental sense datum that are the focus of my consciousness; and for both, the content of one’s experience could be just the same even if there was not a tin there and one was hallucinating. Such accounts, then, do not capture the intuition that the nature of my current experience is constituted by my consciousness of the properties of the tin at which I am looking.

However, in any particular case the disjunctivist must accept that he cannot tell which disjunct holds. When prey to illusion or hallucination, it can seem to you as if you are really perceiving the actual state of the world, and thus, it seems to you that you are in the same perceptual state that you would be in if the world was really how you perceive it to be. A consequence of disjunctivism, then, is that one can be not only deluded about the state of the world, but also about the state of one’s own mind. When one is unknowingly prey to illusion or hallucination, one is in fact in an entirely distinct perceptual state from the state that one takes oneself to be in. This is an anti-Cartesian position since:

In a fully Cartesian picture, the inner life takes place in an autonomous realm, transparent to the introspective awareness of its subject. [McDowell, 1986, p.236]

[The mind is] a realm of reality in which samenesses and differences are exhaustively determined by how things seem to the subject, and hence which are knowable through and through by exercising one’s capacity to know how things seem to one. [Ibid. P.249]

a. Disjunctivism and Cognitive Externalism

A consequence of disjunctivism is that two physically identical brains can be in distinct perceptual states. Imagine there is a demon or a very clever scientist who uses his supernatural powers or hi-tech wizardry to simultaneously remove the green tin from existence, while stimulating my brain in the way that it would have continued to be stimulated if the green tin had remained there on my desk. If this were so, experientially everything would appear to me to be the same as it is now, and, ex hypothesi, the flux of my brain states would also be the same as that which is currently occurring as I now look at the tin. According to the disjunctivist, however, such demonic intervention will induce in me an entirely distinct perceptual state, that of a hallucinatory rather than a veridical perception. Many cannot accept this consequence of disjunctivism. They claim that the mind must supervene on the brain, i.e. that if the physical states of two brains are identical, then so too must be the thoughts, experiences, and perceptions manifest in those brains.

However, the disjunctivist conclusion can be embraced by those who accept cognitive externalism. For such externalists, the world plays a constitutive role in determining the content of our mental states: “Cognitive space incorporates the relevant portion of the ‘external’ world” [McDowell, 1986, p. 258]. The contents of the brain alone do not determine the nature of our thoughts and experiences. There is, however, some notion of supervenience maintained in that the mind supervenes on the brain together with its causal links to the environment: if there are two identical brains causally connected to the same features of their environment, then the mental states manifest in those brains must also be identical.

Various arguments have been forwarded for this externalist position; most notable is Putnam’s Twin Earth thought experiment (1975). We can imagine two physically identical characters, Oscar and Toscar; Oscar lives here and Toscar lives on Twin Earth, a superficially identical planet over the other side of the universe. Oscar and Toscar are molecule for molecule alike, right down to the structure of their brains; and, they both have beliefs about the clear stuff that lies in puddles and rains from the sky. On Twin Earth, however, this clear refreshing liquid is in fact XYZ and not H20. Toscar, then, is thinking about different stuff to Oscar, and therefore, the thoughts of Oscar and Toscar have different content, even though we have specified that everything inside their heads is the same. The externalist stance can be summarized thus: “Thought content ain’t in the head” (to hijack Putnam’s phrase). Disjunctivists hold a parallel claim: since it is the state of the world that determines the content of one’s perceptual state, hallucinations have nothing perceptually in common with veridical perceptions even though all could be the same inside one’s head. Therefore, one must accept such externalist thinking if one is to take on the disjunctivist position.

We have, then, come to the end of our survey and we have found that perception is the focus of rich philosophical debate. We have seen that it is the point at which the philosophy of mind, epistemology and metaphysics meet. Therefore, one’s account of the objects of perception will be characteristic, not only of one’s views on how we acquire knowledge about the world, but also, of one’s philosophical perspective on such wider issues as those concerning the constitution of the mind, the constitution of the world, and crucially, how the former engages with the latter.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Barnes, J., Early Greek Philosophy, Penguin, London, 1987.
  • Dennett, D., Consciousness Explained, Little, Brown and Company, New York, 1991.
  • Descartes, R., Descartes: Philosophical Letters, Trans. / ed. A. Kenny, Clarendon Press, Oxford, 1970. Levine, J., "Materialism and Qualia: The Explanatory Gap" in Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 64, pp. 354-361, 1983.
  • Locke, J., An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, ed. P. H. Nidditch, 1975, Clarendon Press, Oxford, 1690.
  • Lowe, E. J., Locke on Human Understanding, Routledge, London, 1995.
  • McDowell, J., "Singular Thought and the Extent of Inner Space" in Mind, Knowledge and Reality (1998) Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass., pp. 228-259, 1986.
  • McDowell, J., Mind and World, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass., 1994.
  • Nagel, T., "What it is like to be a Bat" in Philosophical Review, 83, pp. 435-56, 1974.
  • Peacocke, C., Sense and Content, Oxford University Press, Oxford, 1983.
  • Peacocke, C., A Study of Concepts, MIT Press, Cambridge, Mass., 1992.
  • Putnam, H., "The Meaning of Meaning" in Philosophical Papers, Volume 2, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, 1975.
  • Tye, M., Consciousness, Color, and Content, A Bradford Book, MIT Press, Cambridge, Mass., 2002.
  • Wittgenstein, L., Philosophical Investigations, tr. G. E. M. Anscombe, Blackwell, Oxford, 1953.

Suggestions for Further Reading

For indirect realism see:

  • Ayer, A. J., The Foundations of Empirical Knowledge, MacMillan, London, 1947.
  • Russell, B., The Problems of Philosophy, Oxford University Press, Oxford, 1912.
  • Grice, H. P., "The Causal Theory of Perception" in Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume, 35, pp. 121-52, 1961.
  • Jackson, F., Perception: A Representative Theory, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, 1977.

For phenomenalism see:

  • Mill, J., An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy, Longmans Green, London, 1867.
  • Berkeley, G., A Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge, in Berkeley: Philosophical Works, ed. M. R. Ayers (1975) Dent, London, 1710.
  • Chisholm, R., "The Problem of Empiricism" in Journal of Philosophy, 45, pp. 512-517, 1948.

For intentionalism see:

  • Tye, M., Ten Problems of Consciousness, A Bradford Book, MIT Press, Cambridge, Mass., 1995.
  • Armstrong, D. M., Perception and the Physical World, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London, 1961.

For disjunctivism see:

  • Hinton, J. M., Experiences, Clarendon Press, Oxford, 1973.
  • McDowell, J., ‘Criteria, Defeasibility and Knowledge’ in Mind, Knowledge and Reality (1998) Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass., 1982.

Author Information

Daniel O’Brien
Email: dan_obi@hotmail.com
The University of Birmingham