Personalism is any philosophy that considers personality the supreme value and the key to the measuring of reality. Its American form took root in the late nineteenth century, flowered in the twentieth century, and continues its life in the twenty-first century. Yet, those roots can be traced to Europe and back through Western philosophy to the Mediterranean basin. However, Personalism did not originate exclusively in America, Europe, the Mediterranean basin, or in the West. Personalism thrived in India through the six orthodox schools of Indian philosophy scattered along the Indus River Valley of the Indian subcontinent, and developed parallel to Personalism in the West.
Personalists claim that the person is the key in the search for self-knowledge, for correct insight into reality, and for the place of persons in it. Other than giving centrality to the person, Personalism has no other set of principles or unified doctrine. Although many prominent personalists have been theists, this doctrine is not a requirement. There is also not a common set of methods or definitions, including the definition of person. Respecting that caution, personalists defend the primacy and importance of persons against any attempt to reduce persons either to the Impersonalism of an infrastructure, such as scientific naturalism, or suprastructure, such as metaphysical absolutism. Personalists focus on the concerns of persons living in a personal world. Between the Scylla and Charybdis of either type of Impersonalism, personalists trace the origin of the concept of person and the development of metaphysical personalism from the ancient world to its flowering in Europe and America. Open to the richness of their philosophical tradition, personalists trace their origin and development both on the Indian subcontinent and in the West.
The religious practice and thought spawned by the Vedic (from Veda, “knowledge,” “wisdom”) texts from at least 1500 BCE, form the back drop of Personalism. The term “Hindu” is derived from the river Sindhu (the Indus) where various schools of practice and thought had formed.
Broadly conceived, Personalism in India originates within the main goal of Hindu philosophical inquiry, which is the freedom from misery. Each system of Hindu philosophy seeks to help persons to that end by giving them insight into the nature of ultimate reality and their place in it. These systems advocate self-knowledge, atmavidya, without which the desired freedom is impossible. The nature and destiny of individual persons is the common theme of the six orthodox Hindu philosophical systems: Nyaya, Vaisesika, Sankhya, Yoga, Purva-mimamsa, and Vedanta. The Vaisesika school is frequently lumped together with the Nyaya (“Logic”) school, and Yoga is classically grouped with Sankhya. Each system promises self-knowledge, atmavidya that bonds the systems into a single philosophical tradition.
Seeking freedom from misery through self-knowledge, Hindu personalist schools of thought center on four questions. What is the self? How is it related to the material world? What is the relation of the self to ultimate reality? And, what is the path from pain and misery to liberation?
First, according to each orthodox school, persons are marked by various characteristics, including a permanent and eternal soul (atman) that exists behind the veil of empirical consciousness, and that possesses a physical body (jiva) that exists as part of a changing material world. While it is agreed that the Atman is eternal, unchanging, independent essence, the six orthodox schools differ whether the transcendent I is conscious or unconscious, active or passive. Each school also recognizes that by being connected to the material world persons possess other characteristics, including agency, will, thought, desire, free will, intention, and identity.
Second, personalists focus on the indissoluble reality of the individual soul and on its relation to the empirical consciousness. That soul, the basic reality in humans and all living things, is a transcendent “I,” (atman) and is veiled by a person’s empirical consciousness. It cannot be the object of experience. The empirical consciousness, the experience of objects sensed or being sensed, comes to be interpreted as alien, attributive, essential, adventitious, permanent, or temporary. Schools differ on how to correlate the transcendent “I” and the empirical consciousness. Hindu Personalism views the empirical consciousness as either attributive or alien, monist or dualist.
At one extreme, Sankhya, the oldest school, interprets the dualism of the transcendent “I” and the empirical consciousness as a dualism of spiritual consciousness (purusa) and material nature (prakrti). Purusa is sentient and passive; prakrti is insentient and active. As sentient, purusa experiences products of prakrti and desires emancipation. As passive, purusa can be understood as unaffected and secluded. In Samkhya, the material world is not an illusion; it is real and stands over against the spiritual person. This dualism is motivated by final beatitude. However, achieving it requires, in theistic versions of Sankhya, moral support, compassionate companionship and guidance from a Supreme Being who possesses perfect knowledge and is capable of perfect action. The Yoga thinker Pantanjali (ca. 300 CE) introduced God into atheistic Samkhyan dualism to satisfy the moral demand of the spiritual aspirant. With that addition, the Samkhyan school becomes a theistic Personalism.
At the other extreme, monism is represented as Advaita Vedanta (non-dualistic Vedanta). Sankara (c. 788-820), the leading expounder of Vedanta (literally, “the end of the Veda”) philosophy, states its principle insight that the self is One with Ultimate Reality (Brahman). Thus, the transcendent I includes the empirical many and the Divine One. The triune of Divine One (Brahman), the transcendent I (atman), and the empirical many is a grand unity. Sankara was the most influential Vedanta thinker who espoused the monistic framework as defined in the Upanishads – tat vam asi )”Thou art that” or (“Atman is Brahman”).
Self-knowledge is necessary for the soul to enter beatitude, to be one with Brahman. During a person’s life cycle, the caste system prescribed in the Vedas, eliminated the possibility of social movement, from lower to higher caste. Self-knowledge focused on one’s place in the caste system and its accompanying duties. The soul through its life cycle within a caste system sought virtue, allowing reincarnation in a higher caste. In this way, the virtuous soul achieves release from pain and suffering to Nirvana.
Within the unorthodox systems, such as Ajivikas (fatalists) Charvakas (materialists), Jains (who accept the existence of eternal selves but reject the existence of a supreme God) and Buddhism, Personalism does not develop. Ajivikas adopted materialism on the ground that sense-perception was the only valid means of knowledge. The Ajivika materialists questioned the validity of theological and metaphysical theories that do not come within the ambit of sense-experience. This explains why they rejected the religious version of atmavada, the belief in a metaphysical self.
Buddhism was founded by Siddhārtha Gautama (c. 563 BCE to 483 BCE), rejected the doctrines of atman or purusa and accepted instead a causal account (paticcasumuppada) of the human personalituy. The person, for Siddhartha, is a causally connected bundle of psychophysical aggregates (namarupa). Kasulis says, “According to Buddhism, therefore, I am not a self-existent being who chooses with what or how I wish to relate to external circumstances.” (Kasulis, 62-63) A Buddhist Personalism, the Pudgalavada arose two centuries after the lifetime of Siddhartha. Smet says, “The pudgalavadins thought that behind the aggregates or groups (skandha) of mental and physical conditions observed by introspection, there must a substrate. Had not the Budda, in a well-known passage, spoken of the ‘bearer of the burden’ – an expression seeming to indicate some sort of ego underlying the aggregates? At the same time the pudgala could by no means be identified with the Atman, because it was merely an integrating function demanded by the aggregates and expressed by them.” (De Smet. 38) Its teaching came too close to the heresy of the eternalism of the Atman and soon died out.
Regarding China and Japan, in neither country’s faiths are persons understood as an eternal essence. The Chinese, deeply influenced by Confucianism (551-479 BCE), believed that humans elevated themselves to a position through examinations and service. The Japanese, deeply influenced by Buddhism, understood persons in terms of their relationships with other humans, nature, and the totality of things. They held to a hierarchical dyadic view of persons.
Parallel to the origin and formation of Personalism in India, China, and Japan, Personalism in the West began in the Mediterranean basin, and through Christianity it spread north to the Atlantic Rim, northern Europe and the British Isles, and America.
Personalists trace the origin of the ontological nature of persons and their supreme importance as key to understanding of Reality to the confluence of Greco-Roman philosophy and Christian experience and theology. Both made significant contributions to the formation of the concept of person
In its early uses, the individual person had no ontological import. Person is first found in Greek and Roman culture. Its roots lie in the Greek word prosopon that refers to the face consisting of that around and near the eyes (pros + accusative of ops). Soon it designated the masks or faces used in the Greek theatre. Its Latin cognate is persona, probably of Etruscan derivation, phersu. Persona referred to a mask functioning as loudspeaker (persono, per, “through” + sona, “resound,” “resound thoroughly”). The mask was worn by actors on stage aiding them by “sounding through” to be heard by an audience. In the Roman theatre persona meant a character and role in tragedy or comedy. In Roman society, the personae of individuals gain their identity, status, and responsibilities from their roles in a hierarchical, honor-shame society. For example, persona came to be used in reference to the king as king, implying a difference between the important social man and the relatively unimportant singular empirical man. By the end of the second century CE persona became a judicial term referring to a Roman citizen as possessor of legal rights, in contrast to a slave who possesses no legal rights, a non-persona
Meanwhile, as Pythagorean, Platonic and Aristotelian philosophical influences continued, individual persons had little philosophical importance. Plato distinguishes between the individual and the universal, and thereby understands the individual through the universal. The individual Socrates participates in the universal, “human being.” To understand the particular “Socrates,” first know the universal, then one can understand and account for the particular. Pythagoras and Plato used the term soma, body, and played on the similarity between soma and sema, body and tomb. Aristotle, against Plato, calls the individual primary substance and the universal conceptual. First substance is that which stands under (hypostasis) a general term referring to whatever stands under something else. But prosopon gained no ontological meaning through that understanding of substance.
Later, persona took on scant ontological meaning among the Stoics and the Neoplatonists. Stoics thought that God forms an ordered universe, a stage on which each human being as rational plays an assigned part. Each prosopon or persona is not only a social role but also the essence of a human being as constituted by God. Possessing no ontological significance in and of themselves, persons are microcosms of the Macrocosm.
In the eastern Mediterranean among the Jews, the Hebrew word, nephesh is sometimes translated as “person.” However, in ancient Hebrew life and culture no word analogous to prosopon or persona appears. Nephesh is more often translated as soul, life, creature, or self. Nephesh can refer to the animating principle of a physical entity or the existential quality or state of life. Usually referring to a human being as a unified entity, no distinction is made between immaterial and material aspects. Nephesh as a whole is created by God; nephesh is not an attribute of a substance. The form/matter and substance attribute distinctions are foreign to ancient Hebrew thinking. However, beginning with Alexander the Great in the 4th century BCE and continuing through the Roman period, the Eastern Mediterranean was Hellenized. New Testament writers, St. Paul for example, would have known nephesh, prosopon, and persona, likely aware of semantic tensions that later found their way in theological debates within the Christian church.
The different Greek and Hebrew-Christian understandings of person moved into focus in the 4th and 5th centuries CE as the Christian church attempted to work out a satisfactory understanding of the Trinity and the individual personhood of Jesus the Christ. The details of the controversies that arose are beyond the limits here. However, central to the controversy was the understanding of the individual person. During the time of Origen (185-254 CE) under the influence of Plotinus (204-269 CE), personae lacked ontological content. Is an individual person an attribute of being; or is an individual person being who, having been created by the free and independent God and who bears God’s image, is free and dependent? If the former, the Greek metaphysical word, ousia, expresses the Trinity, as in una substantia (God) and tres personae, where Father, Son, and the Holy Spirit are understood as three independent Gods. If the latter, person is not an attribute of ousia, but upostasis. Earlier both ousia and upostasis meant substance. Eventually, they were used separately, ousia referring to substance and upostasis referring to individual person. This means that persona is no longer a kind of mask worn by an ontological substrate, ousia. The Greek Fathers, particularly the Cappadocians, led by Gregory of Nazianus (c. 329 – 389 or 390) understood that individual persons are ontologically ultimate, the central thesis of Personalism. However, an understanding of the interior life of persons lay beyond their metaphysical interests.
The analysis of the interior life of persons fell to Augustine (354 – 430) who continued the substance view by defining person as “a rational soul using a mortal and earthly body,” (substantia quaedam rationis particeps, regendo corpora accomodata). Nevertheless, a person is one; “a soul in possession of a body does not constitute two persons but one man.” His contribution to Personalism lies elsewhere. His investigation of the inner experience of persons set a new course in philosophy that would not be developed until the modern period. In doing so he developed a key insight of Personalism, an understanding of reality as Person through an understanding of the interior life of persons. He wrote that knowledge of God moves “from the exterior to the interior and from the inferior to the superior.” Further, he argues that in persons, free will is superior to rationality. Yet Augustine continued the metaphysical principle that the higher can affect the lower, but the lower cannot affect the higher.
In the late Roman era or early Middle Ages, the Roman Catholic Church adopted Boethius’ (ca. 480–524 or 525) definition of person, as the Naturæ rationalis individua substantia (an individual substance of a rational nature). In the meantime, the Greek Orthodox Church continued the doctrines of the Cappadocians, particularly Gregory of Nazianus. Though medieval philosophers, such as Thomas Aquinas modified the definition and some such as Scotus and William of Occam were critical, the substance view of person became firmly entrenched in Western philosophy. During the modern period and the nineteenth and twentieth century personalists continued to debate the substance view of persons.
As the grand systems of Christendom in the high Middle Ages cracked under the weight of heavy criticisms from Scotus, Occam, Montaigne, and the new science, a new vision arose in the Renaissance, the emerging self. Though the substance view of persons continued, aided by its institutionalization in the Western church, it was soon challenged. Under Pico della Mirandola, Luther, Descartes, and Locke, Augustine’s careful descriptions and insights into the interior life of persons contributed to emerging selves.
Influenced of pyrrhonistic skepticism, Descartes (1596 – 1650) searched for a new foundation for society, culture, and knowledge, one that measures up to the ideal of certainty as in mathematics. He argues that we can know for certain that we exist and that we can doubt every other knowledge claim, including those of the external world. In this way, inspired by new scientific investigations, he raises problems, particularly the mind-body problem. Rather than the view that God created ex nihilo substances with a rational nature, or persons are substances using a body, Descartes contends that God created two substances, res cogitans and res extensa, mind and body. Central to his view of mind is freedom of the will and rationality. In freedom of the will we find a characteristic of God that is exactly the same as we find in ourselves. God’s reason is so far beyond our finite minds that we cannot with confidence claim that God is rationality. Descartes’ discussion of the interior life of persons in the early 17th century CE continues Augustine’s insights in the late 4th century CE. However, Descartes’ dualism of two kinds of created substances significantly differs from Boethius’ view that a person is an individual substance with a rational nature. Though modified, the substance of persons persisted.
The dichotomy of thought (res cogitans) and extension (res extensa) raises formidable problems regarding the relation between them, encouraging some philosophers to emphasize one or the other. For example, Hobbes’(1588 – 1679) materialism on the side of extended things, and Berkeley’s (1685-1753 CE) spiritualism on the side of thinking things. Hobbes’ view is a good example of appealing to impersonal principles to account for persons, a view personalists uniformly reject as a form of Impersonalism. Berkeley’s view moves Personalism into modern Idealism (mentalism), in contrast to classical Idealism (Ideaism) such as Plato’s, and against the Impersonalism of materialism. Under the influence of Locke and against any form of materialism, Berkeley took what he believed a common sense approach. Holding to a substance view of person, he claimed that “to be is to be perceived or perceive,” esse est percipi aut percipere. The key lies in the word “exist.” Descartes had said that things exist either as thought or extension. However, thought Berkeley, whenever we use the word “exist” we must assume that the mind is involved perceiving something. And, when we or no other person perceives an object, that object exists due to its being perceived by a cosmic mind, God. The “absolute existence of unthinking things [matter] are words without meaning.” Neither do eternal ideas, Plato’s forms, exist apart from perceiving minds. They are abstractions only.
Descartes’ position helped create a modern version of the One and Many problem, first spawned by the Pre-Socratics. Descartes held that God can be grasped through ideas in the mind. Spinoza (1632 –1677) responded that God as substance is not dependent on any other than itself. If God could be grasped through a dependent substance, such as thought, God would be dependent on something other than God’s self for God’s existence. Here, two fundamental characteristics of Personalism were threatened, the rational relation of finite persons to God, and persons as free. Since knowledge of the Cosmic Person through a finite person challenges God as Substance, the relation of the Cosmic Person to finite person becomes problematic. Furthermore, persons as free can be held only so long as Cosmic Person and finite persons are in some way independent. Spinoza claimed that substance can be known only through itself, implying that persons are modifications of being, that they are not distinct as required for individual freedom.
In reaction to Descartes’ dualism and Spinoza’s monism, Leibniz’s (1646 –1716) doctrine of monads offers a pluralism. Both Descartes and Spinoza assumed that extension implies actual size and shape. Leibniz wondered why we cannot assume that all things are compounds or aggregates of simple substances. These substances are not the extended atoms of Democritus or Epicurus. Each simple substance is a monad that is unextended and has no size or shape. Each is a metaphysical point that Leibniz calls souls to emphasize their nonmaterial nature. And, each possesses its own principle of action within itself and behaves according its own created purpose, yet they work together according to God’s preestablished harmony. A person’s identity centers on a dominant monad, his soul, whose life is an “unfolding,” set from the beginning. Since the basic nature of persons is thought, development through life means moving from murky confused ideas to true ones, the way things really are. In this way, Leibniz was the first philosopher to reject the substance of persons and to adopt an agency view, even if deterministic. Some philosophers, such as Leroy E. Leomker (1770-1830), consider Leibniz the first modern personalist, where persons are agents, not substances with an attribute.
Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) and Hegel (1770-1830) exerted major influences on the formation and development of Personalism in the West. Kant’s distinction between the phenomenal and noumenal world reinforced Berkeley’s view of “material” substance and emphasized that the only path to reality is through the practical reason of persons. With his claim that compliance with moral law is the essence of human dignity and personhood, Kant exerted the single most influence on ethical personalists. That influence was transmitted into American philosophy largely through the work of Hermann Lotze (1817-1881).
Within that background, the modern Personalist vision was first stated in the context of a philosophical issue lying at the core of 18th and 19th century German philosophy. The issue was raised in the debate between the followers of Spinoza and those of Leibniz. For Spinozists, Being is one and independent. If Being were more than one, it would not independent; and, if Being is independent it cannot be many. For Leibnizians, reality is a pluralism of monads. The debate between the two systems sharpened to the debate between monism and pluralism. The problem of the One and the Many resurfaced. How can they be reconciled? What philosophical view can do so? At least two alternatives surfaced at the end of the 18th century and the beginning of the 19th.
The first alternative was Hegel’s. According to a recent interpreter, he sought a “‘unification philosophy’ – the need to unify not only life’s various and conflicting powers, but especially the opposing human craving – for individuality and finitude, on the one hand, and for the absolute and the infinite, on the other.” (Hegel, 48) Hegel sought it by brilliantly blending the organic growth of an Aristotle and the Absolutism of a Spinoza into a dynamic monistic system marked by idealism, pantheism, and rationalism.
In reaction to the rationalism of Absolute Idealism and to individual realism, a poet and philosopher and older contemporary of Hegel, Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi (1743-1819) offered the second alternative, Personalism. He thought that Personalism is “‘that form of idealism which gives equal recognition to both the pluralistic and monistic aspects of experience and which finds in the conscious unity, identity, and free activity of personality the key to the nature of reality and the solution of the ultimate problems of philosophy.’” (Bengtsson, 53) The insight of Jacobi continued in Schelling, in the Speculative theists (Immanuel Hermann Fichte, Weisse, Ulrici), to Hermann Lotze, the preeminent philosopher in mid-19th century Germany. It was primarily through Lotze that Personalism arrived in Boston. When Personalism arrives in Boston the distinctive modern characteristics of persons are in place: numerically distinct; individual interiority; freedom of choice among genuine options; autonomy; dignity; and agency. As Personalism makes its way to Boston and the West Coast, Personalism on the European continent and in England responds to German Idealism, specifically to Hegel.
In the debate between monism and pluralism, the traditional problem of the One and the Many resurfaces. But more, metaphysical monism and pluralism lie beneath many modern philosophies that Personalism rejects as impersonal, dehumanizing. Absolute idealism leaves little room for free will and self-determination and cannot be reconciled with the worth of the singular person. Totalitarianisms see persons as means to an end that exist for the interests of the state. Personalists respond insisting on self-determination, responsibility, inherent dignity of all persons. Individualism champions the autonomous self as its own law giver, making all other persons a means to one’s own ends. Personalism contends persons are communal, open to, cooperating with, and respecting the viewpoints of others. Personalism also rejects any reduction of persons to impersonal, deterministic laws, whether those of society, for example Auguste Comte (1798-1857), or of nature, Darwinism evolution. Personalists challenge Comtean philosophical positivism and Naturalism whether that of Darwinism or Samuel Alexander (1859-1938) by appealing to the dignity of individual persons, their free will, and values.
On the European continent, responses to Hegel led to the development of three schools: Paris, Gottingen/Freiburg, and Lublin. In Paris and under the influence of Existentialism, Mounier (1905-1950), Marcel (1889-1973), Paul Ricoeur (1913-2005), and Jacques Maritain (1882-1973) developed distinctive types of Personalism. In Gottingen and Feiburg Phenomenology developed under Husserl (1859-1938) who addressed the question of the relation of objective reality and philosophical reflection. Later he returned to Idealism, precipitating a break with his former students, who, when on their own, made significant contributions to Personalism. These included Max Scheler (1874 – 1928), Dietrich von Hildebrand (1889-1977), Roman Ingarden (1893-1970), and Edith Stein (1891-1942). In Poland, the Catholic University of Lublin is a center of personalist thought whose foremost representative is Karol Wojtyla (1920-2005). Personalism also developed in Prague at Charles University and under the leadership of Jan Patočka (1907 – 1977), one of Husserl’s last students. In Spain José Ortega y Gasset (1883 – 1955) espoused personalist themes. In Italy, Antonio Pavan of University of Padua ably represents Personalism. Personalism also has its adherents in Scandanavia, such as Jan Olof Bengtsson in Sweden. In Scotland the most notable 19th century personalist was Seth Andrew Pringle-Pattison (1856 – 1931), whose thought influenced William James (1842-1910), George Santayana (1863-1952), and George Herbert Mead (1863-1931). In England, Austin Farrer (1904-1968) argued for a personalist theism. John MacMurray (1891 – 1976) was the most notable Scottish Personalist in the first half of the 20th century. In Russia we find a version of Personalism in Berdyaev’s (1874-1948) thought.
Before the mid-19th century few in North America discussed the thought of German philosophers such as Kant, Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762-1814), Schelling (1775-1854), Hegel, and Lotze. As demands of academic life increased, young American philosophers completed their philosophical preparation with a year or two of study in Germany. When they returned, no longer fully embracing the old Scottish orthodoxy, their thinking was framed by the Spinoza-Leibniz debate, sometimes understood by theologians and many philosophers as the pantheism-individual freedom debate, and by reductions of persons to deterministic laws of society and nature. Deliberating within that framework, they thoroughly discussed the Personalism they learned while studying with Hermann Lotze at Gottingen. Among that group were George Santayana (who wrote his doctoral dissertation at Harvard University on Lotze), William James (1863-1952), Josiah Royce (1855-1916), and Borden Parker Bowne (1847-1910). That conversation grew into what Werkmeister in the mid-20th century calls the “first complete and comprehensive system of philosophy developed in America which has had lasting influence and which still counts some of our outstanding thinkers among its adherents.” (Werkmeister, 103.)
Those historical roots found their way into American philosophy and formed at least four distinctive branches of Personalism. These four branches are idealistic (against threat of naturalism and realism), realistic (against reducing all to mind or person), organismic (against idealism, personalistic realism), and ethical (against collectivism and reduction of personality to mechanism and the body-brain).
Idealistic Personalism – The most distinctive type of Personalism in America, excluding Platonism or Kantianism, this idealism is expressed in three different forms: absolutistic, panpsychistic, and personalistic. Influenced by Jamesian pragmatism, Absolutistic idealists contend that reality is quantitatively and qualitatively one absolute mind, spirit, or person. All other beings, including physical and human ones, are ontologically manifestations of the absolute mind. Josiah Royce, William Ernest Hocking (1873-1966), and Mary Whiton Calkins (1863-1929) represented this view. Panpsychists are deeply influenced by Leibniz, who held that God, the supreme monad, creates all other monads and places them in a preestablished harmony. Rejecting absolute idealism, they hold that reality is composed of psychic entities of varying degrees of consciousness. Both A. N. Whitehead (1861-1947) and Charles Hartshorne (1897-2000) can be called, with qualification, panpsychists. Finally, for personalistic idealists, quantitatively, reality is pluralistic, a society of persons; and qualitatively, reality is monistic; it is person. The Infinite Person or God is the ground of all beings and the creator and sustainer of finite persons. In that sense, personalistic idealists are theistic. Representatives of this branch of Personalism include Borden Parker Bowne, Edgar Sheffield Brightman (1884-1953), Peter A. Bertocci (1910-1989), and Leroy Loemker (1900-1985).
Realistic Personalism – These personalists agree with idealistic personalists that Reality is spiritual, mental, and personal. They disagree about the ontological status of the natural order. Nature is neither intrinsically mental nor personal. It is a natural order created by God. Realistic personalism is most notably expressed by Neo-Scholastics in Europe such as Jacques Maritain (1882-1973), Emmanuel Mounier (1905-1950), and Pope John Paul II (1920-2005), and in America W. Norris Clarke (1915- 2008) and John F. Crosby (1944 -). In America some realistic personalists stand outside the scholastic tradition, notably Georgia Harkness (1891-1974).
Personalistic Organicism – A recent form of Personalism was developed by Frederick Ferre (1933-2013). Rejecting panpsychism and personalistic idealism and influenced by Whitehead’s philosophy of organism, Ferre argues for a personalistic organicism. He claims in Living and Values that persons are “organisms with especially well-developed mental capacities leading to special needs and powers.” (Ferre, Living, 140) By these powers they can “perceive and manipulate the world, can vocalize and socialize, can create language, can imagine and plan by use of symbols freed from the immediate environment, and can guide behavior by ideal norms.” (Ferre, Living, 140)
Ethical Personalism – These personalists stress the crucial role of values in ontology and the moral life. Ethical Personalism is well represented by George Holmes Howison (1834-1916) who focuses on the Ideal or God toward which all uncreated persons move and the standard by which they measure the degree of their individual self-definition. Practically, ethical personalists concentrate on the dignity and value of persons in moral decision making.
Josiah Royce’s thought was motivated by a religious view of life and reality, with an emphasis on the self and community. He sought to realize his philosophical goals through a synthesis of two traditions: the rationalistic system building of philosophers in the West, and the pragmatic emphasis on experience and practice, distinctive of American philosophical activity since the late nineteenth century. Royce also had a long and abiding interest in science and scientific inquiry and was deeply influenced by Charles Sanders Peirce (1839-1914). He wove these strands during his long and productive career.
At the root of Royce’s system is a concept of the self. Early in his career, the Absolute appears as the Self who knows all in one synoptic vision. Rejecting realism, mysticism, and critical rationalism, his central thesis is that to be real is to be a determinate, individual fulfillment of a purpose. Later he focused more on mediation and the idea of system. Toward the end of his career, the self appears as social. He developed a social theory of reality, a community of interpretation. He called this community “the Beloved Community” whose goal was to possess the truth in its totality.
William James, a leading pragmatist, shared with personalists a key insight. James said, “The more perfect and more eternal aspect of the universe is represented in our religions as having personal form. The universe is no longer a mere It to us, but a Thou, if we are religious; and any relation that may be possible from person to person might be possible here.” (William James, 27-28)
Mary Whiton Calkins, a student of Josiah Royce and William James at Harvard, taught psychology, classics, and philosophy at Smith College. Influenced by Royce and James, she adopted a monistic personal idealism and a personalistic psychology. In 1905, Calkins was elected president of the American Psychological Association and in 1918, she was elected president of the American Philosophical Association.
William Ernest Hocking believed the universe is independent of human minds but is discoverable through phenomenology. Sometimes thought of as the American Husserl, he studied for three months with Husserl at Gottingen. Scolded by the Harvard Philosophy Department for wasting his time with an unknown philosopher, he went to Berlin to complete his year abroad. Yet, Husserl’s phenomenology made a deep impression on Hocking. Through careful phenomenological analysis, Hocking unpacked everyday phenomena and found that “nature can no longer be fully understood from the atoms upward but only from consciousness or selfhood outwardly.” (Howie, “Hocking’s ‘Transfigured Naturalism,’” 219) Philosophy must be idealistic. Further, values keep emerging as we learn more about the world and ourselves. The mental life has unity, is deep and mysterious, and finally coheres in a single will. The finite person is an imperfect image of the universe. Influenced by personal idealism and Royce’s absolute idealism, the final unity is a self infinite in depth and mystery. The self or person is also a natural thing that is completely determined. More than a natural thing, the self is free to determine what will be fact in the next moment. Though nature and mind are in opposition to each other, one subject to the laws of nature, the other transcending them, through the ceremonies of religion that opposition is overcome.
Borden Parker Bowne claimed to be the first personalist in any thoroughgoing sense, having developed a systematic metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, and psychology. He taught at Boston University from 1876 until his death in 1910. Metaphysically Bowne was a pluralistic idealist like Howison. But his theism distinguishes his Personalism from Howison’s. God, the Divine Person, is both creator and world ground. Finite selves are created, and nature is the energizing of the Cosmic Mind. As world ground, the Divine Mind is the “self-directing intelligent agency” that accounts for the order and continuity of the phenomenal world.
Bowne was not only a systematic philosopher but also a caustic critic of Hegel’s absolutism, Spencer’s evolutionism, and all forms of materialism. These criticisms were expressed in his famous chapter in Personalism, “The Failure of Impersonalism.” In addition, any form of dogmatism or fundamentalism was the target of his searing attacks, especially when held by religious leaders in the Methodist Church.
Bowne’s teaching at Boston University attracted many young talented philosophers, some of whom formed the second generation of personalists in America. The most important among them were Albert Knudson (1873-1953), who continued the personalist tradition in the Divinity School of Boston University; Ralph Tyler Flewelling (1871-1960), who developed the School of Philosophy at the University of Southern California; and Edgar Sheffield Brightman, who led the Philosophy Department at Boston University from 1919 until his death in 1953.
Brightman (1884-1953) was the leading exponent in America of Personalist Idealism during the first half of the 20th century CE. Educated at Brown, Brightman earned his doctorate in Philosophy at Boston University under the founder of Personalism in America, Borden Parker Bowne.
Though an ordained Methodist minister and an authority on the Old Testament, for most of his scholarly life his central interests lay in the fields of Ethics, Philosophy of Religion, and Metaphysics.
A creative, brilliant, original philosopher, Brightman, in agreement with other Boston University personalists, sought truth to guide creative living in the most empirically coherent interpretation of experience. Rejecting the skepticism of Descartes, beginning the search for truth within experience, and advancing and testing hypotheses, Brightman developed the distinction between the shining present and the illuminating absent. Pointing beyond itself, the shining present is unintelligible without reference to an illuminating absent. Though the shining present does not prejudice the nature of the illuminating absent, Person is the hypothesis that most coherently illumines the shining present.
Brightman contended that everything that exists [or subsists] is in, of, or for a mind on some level. He defined Personalism as the hypothesis that all being is either a personal experience (a complex unity of consciousness) or some phase or aspect of one or more such experience. Nature is an order generated by the mind of Cosmic Person. Finite persons are created and grounded by the uncreated God, and as such possess free will. Reality is a society of persons.
Brightman’s most impressive work is his Moral Laws, in which he works out, along lines heavily indebted to Hegel, a thoroughgoing ethical theory. In ethics Brightman adopted perfectionism that moved from the abstract universal to the concrete universal. In its moral development, personality should be guided by moral laws, a kind of “regulatory system.” Understood dialectically, “the moral life is a special instance of the relation of the universal to the particular,” wherein the personality can achieve both the best possible and rational freedom. (Deats and Robb, 111) In this way, personality under the guidance of reason, seeks to become the best it can be, a fully integrated personality.
Central to his philosophy of religion is his well-known revision of the traditional view of God. If personality is the basic explanatory model, God must be seen as temporal. As temporal, God is not timeless but omnitemporal. Brightman agrees with the traditional view of God as infinite in goodness, but he disagrees that God is infinite in power. To maintain that God’s power is infinite seriously compromises the goodness of God. If evil is to be taken seriously, the will of God must be understood as limited by the nonrational Given within God’s nature. This nonrational condition in God is neither created nor approved by God, but God maintains constant and growing control of it. This controversial view was debated within personalist circles. For example, L. Harold DeWolf (1905-1906) followed Bowne’s traditional theism rather than Brightman’s, and Peter A. Bertocci (1910-1989) found in Brightman’s revisions a cogent and intelligible theism.
Bertocci, following Brightman as the leading personalist at Boston University, enriched the understanding of person through his work in psychology. Bertocci claims in “Why Personalistic Idealism?” that the person “is a self-identifying, being-becoming agent who maturing and learning as he interacts with the environment, develops a more or less systematic, learned unity of expression and adaptation that we may call his personality.” Bertocci is well known for his view that the essence of person is time. He is best known in the field of philosophy of religion for his wider teleological argument that provided increased evidence for God’s existence.
Personalism simultaneously developed in Boston and California. One of the first American philosophers to employ the term Personalism was Howison at the University of California. After graduating from Harvard and early in his career, he was one of the St. Louis Hegelians. A thorough discussion of Hegel, however, led Howison to champion the finite individual and reject the absorption of the individual in the Absolute. In this way, Howison opposes Royce’s absolutism.
Howison succinctly stated his position, quoted by Buckman and Stratton in George Holmes Howison, “All existence is either (1) the existence of minds, or (2) the existence of the items and order of their experience; all the existences known as ‘material’ consisting in certain of these experiences, with an order organized by the self-active forms of consciousness that in their unity constitute the substantial being of a mind, in distinction from its phenomenal life.” Devoted to empiricism, Howison rejected creation. “These many minds . . . have no origin at all – no source in time whatever. There is nothing at all, prior to them, out of which their being arises. . . . They simply are, and together constitute the eternal order.” Collectively they move toward their own fulfillment as measured by the eternal standard to God.
Later at the Univesity of Southern California, Ralph Tyler Flewelling, a student of Bowne’s Personalism, taught Boston University Personalism as enriched into Democratic Personalism. He defined person as “A self-conscious unique unity capable of reflection upon its conscious states, of self-direction and transcending time. The self-identifying subject of experience, possessor of intrinsic values and creative powers. A continuum in a time-space world.” (quoted in Gacka, “American Personalism,” 160; also see R. T. Flewelling, The Person; or The Significance of Man,” 332). Emphasizing personal freedom, dignity, human potential, creativity, intrinsic moral worth, and community, Flewelling promoted Personalistic Democracy. He said, “The only abiding basis for democracy is respect for the sanctity of the person.” This includes respect for those “possibilities which reside in varying degree in every person. . . This means that personality is recognized as an intrinsic value, the most precious possession of society and the greatest source of social ‘advance and welfare.’” (Gacka, 161)
African personalists focus on total liberation and empowerment of African Americans, releasing them from oppression, and on the dignity and self-worth, especially lacking among young African American males. The conception of persons and God and the primacy of person are two appealing features of Personalism. Among American African personalists, the best known was Martin Luther King (1929-1968). King translated Personalism into social action by applying it to racism, economic exploitation, and militarism. Following closely its major themes, he emphasized the existence of a personal God, the dignity and sacredness of persons, the existence of an objective moral order and corresponding moral laws, freedom, and moral agency. ” (Burrows, Personalism, 77-78) However, the precedent for King’s social Personalism was set by John Wesley Edward Bowen (1855-1923), a student of Bowne’s, whom Burrows cites in Personalism as the “first African American academic personalist.” Rufus Burrow, Jr. (1951-) argues for a militant Personalism that considers the African American experience. Holding firmly to central personalist themes, he argues in Personalism for the sanctity of the body, the dignity of women, “we-centeredness plus I-centeredness,” preference for the poor and oppressed, immediate and radical social change, and respect for non-human life forms.
Earlier, John Wesley Edward Bowen (1855-1933) became the first African American to earn a Ph.D. degree at Boston University. Devoted to the centrality of person, Bowen argued that the importance of higher education for blacks lay in developing persons into men and women who would occupy important positions in society. Bowen also argued that progress must be intentional and accepted as slow, that social problems must be solved individualistically, and for a “concrete, not abstract ‘brotherhood’ of all persons.” (Burrows, Personalism, 80)
Recently, J. Deotis Roberts (1927- ), a student of the British personalist Herbert H. Farmer and a black liberation theologian, emphasized that the conscious person is both “the highest intrinsic value and is personal, emphasis on freedom and self-determination, and focus on persons-in-community.” (Burrows, Personalism, 80). His thought can be organized around four personalist principles: the dignity of the whole person, God as personal, freedom and moral agency, and persons-in-community. Blacks are not subhuman, as they have often been treated; they possess intrinsic worth as whole persons and not as minds and bodies. The God of the Bible is personal and loves each of the creatures. Though God is responsible for all that happens in the world, humans are responsible for all moral wrongdoing. Finally, humans can fulfill, develop themselves only in community, which implies “sharing and caring based upon fellow feeling and deep fellowship. Ujamaa, ‘togetherness,’ ‘familyhood,’ is descriptive of community.” (Roberts, quoted by Burrows, Personalism, 85)
Feminists agree with the Personalism of Roberts and other black liberation theologians, but they emphasize the dignity and worth of black women to a degree unknown before. They do so in the context of the four personalist principles mentioned above.
Vine Deloria, Jr. (1933 – 2005), a Standing Rock Sioux, exploring the metaphysics of American Indians finds personalistic themes, including a personal universe, dignity and sacredness of life, the existence of a moral order, and moral responsibility.
Every individual, whether a person, a tree, a bison, an alligator, or the sun are fundamental to the world we live in. Never isolated, what they are is constituted by their relationships. Each individual has a personality distinguished by its power and place. Power is the living energy that inhabits the universe, and place is the relationship an individual has to other individuals. More broadly, place is the relationships of things to each other. In this way, an ear of corn is distinguished from the person who picks it and from the buffalo that provides meat for nourishment and hides for shelter and clothing. Power and place contribute to one’s habitude, “an attitude or awareness of a deep system of experiential relations on which the world is building or living. The key here is recognizing that experience is the undeveloped and untheorized site where the divisions between subjective and objective, material and spiritual, and an entire series of dichotomies disappear.” (Wildcat, “Understanding the Crisis,” in Power and Place, 34). One acquires this through the clan system developed in geographical and ecological environments. For example, the Seminole, living in the wetlands of Florida establish an important relationship the alligator, while the Cherokee, living in the mountains of North Carolina do not. One’s habitude contributes to the richness of one’s personality, to one’s interrelationships with other individuals, and to an understanding of the path one is to walk. Power, place, and habitude suggest that the interrelated universe is alive and personal and must be approached with respect. Living and its quality depend on it.
All relationships have a moral content. Contemplating an action, a person must consider whether the proposed action is appropriate. Harvesting plants involves respecting the plants, their power and place in relationship to other individuals. Considering the impact on others and the consequences of one’s action, one must never intrude into the lives of other. The universe is built upon constructive and cooperative relationships that must be maintained.
Not only must one’s actions correlate with other personalities but also with the larger movements of the universe. They followed the principle that whatever is above must be reflected below. In their villages most tribes constructed their dwellings after some model of the universe. They reproduced the cosmos in miniature and believed that spiritual change would be followed by physical change. In this way, they participated in cosmic rhythms.
Through these relationships humans understand what they are, what they are to be, and what they are to do. Deloria points out that “everything that humans experience has value and instructs in some aspect of life. . . . The real interest of the old Indians was not to discover the abstract structure of physical reality but rather to find the proper road along which for the duration of a person’s life, individuals were supposed to walk. . . . The universe is a moral universe.” (Mankiller, “Foreward,” in Spirit and Reason, vii)
Personalism in Latin America developed in the 20th century against the historical background of scholasticism (16th - 19th centuries) and naturalism and positivism (19th century). The contemporary period (late 20th into 21st centuries) continued idealistic and personalistic discussions of axiology and social philosophy, manifested a shyness regarding metaphysics, emphasized existentialist themes, and witnessed the rise of dialectical materialism. The discussion of Personalism chiefly took place in three centers of philosophical activity, Argentina, Mexico, and Puerto Rico.
In Argentina, two philosophers distinguished themselves. Alejandro Korn (1860-1936), in reaction to positivism, introduced German philosophy to his countrymen and was known as “the teacher of knowledge and virtue” and “The Philosopher of Liberty.” Emphasizing the role of intuition as the basis of knowledge and the social idealism, his views were not fully developed. Franscisco Romero (1891-1962), a younger contemporary of Korn, arriving at his philosophy by way of psychology, was a sworn foe of mechanistic and behaviorist view of persons. Persons are whole, a structure not determined by its parts. They are both of the psyche, the lower, subjective, egotistic aspect of the self; and spirit, the objective and altruistic tendencies of the self. He thought that person is the key to reality. Persons have the ability to transcend subjectivity and grasp a superindividual order, and order that transcends him. Romero thought Josiah Royce’s The World and the Individual as the greatest contribution America has made to systematic and speculative philosophy.
Mexico is the second outstanding center of philosophical activity. Chief among its eminent thinkers is José Vasconcelos (1882-1959). Though critical of idealism and leaning decidedly toward Thomistic realism, he is deeply theistic and personalistic. Holding to a theistic monism, the universe is a living whole that finds its unity in God. His chief themes are individuality, freedom, purposeful creativity, cosmic reality in process, personality, and God. Vasconcelos, unlike most philosophers in North America, was a man of action, standing for the president of Mexico, though never elected. Bergson’s call to philosophers to “think like men of action and act like men of thought” was often heeded in Latin America.
The third center is Puerto Rico, whose most distinguished thinker was Eugenio Maria de Hostos (1839-1903). An ethical and social idealist, Hostos stressed the supreme worth personality, the dignity of persons. That is the foundation stone of civilization itself. No mere ivory tower, idealistic thinker, Hostos gave a realistic analysis of the danger inherent in what he called our “machine civilization.”
In addition to those centers of philosophical activity and their signal figures, other philosophers who discussed personalist themes were Antonio Caso in Mexico (1883-1946), Alejandro Deustua (1849-1945) and Victor Andres Belaunde (1883-1966) in Peru, Enrique Molina in Chile, and Carlos Vas Ferreira (1872-1959) in Uruguay. Recently, Ignacio Ellacuria (1930-1989) of San Salvador developed Liberation Philosophy that focused on the social and personal imperative to overcome dependency as the path toward the fullness of one’s humanity. Common themes among them include dynamic stress on action, the philosophy of persons, freedom of persons, and the law.
Regarding direct of influence of North American Personalism on Latin American philosophers, when Latin American philosophers became aware of North American philosophy, it was Personalism, especially that of Edgar Sheffield Brightman that attracted them most among then-living philosophers. Josiah Royce also attracted them, especially The World and the Individual, as we have seen. But, it was Brightman’s Personalism that exerted the greatest influence. The interest was reciprocal. Brightman established the first graduate course in Latin American philosophy in the United States. (Cornelius Kruse, 149)
Personalists in North America carry on a vibrant philosophical discussion. They are developing, modifying, and challenging concepts and themes central to 20th century Personalism. They include Richard C. Bayer at Fordham University, drawing on Catholic social thought and affirming the dignity of persons, focuses on personal development and a modified market economy. Patrick Grant at University of Victoria, British Columbia, outlines a Personalism approach appropriate for a post-modern and post-Marxist cultural phase. Thomas R. Rourke at Clarion University and Rosita A. Chazarreta Rourke at Duquesne University, heavily influenced by Mounier, Dorothy Day and the Catholic Worker movement, defend Personalism as an alternative to liberal capitalist and socialism. Erazim Kohak (1933-), drawing on the early work of Edmund Husserl (1859-1938) and Max Scheler (1874-1928), developed a personalistic view of nature. John Howie (1929-2000) developed an environmental ethics along personalist lines. Randall Auxier (1961-), editor of Library of Living Philosophers, writes on Brightman, Hartshorne, Royce, and Whitehead and is rethinking time, a category central to Brightman’s thought. Doug Anderson writes on Pierce and American philosophy. Currently, the center of studies in Personalism is in the department of philosophy of South Illinois University, where it is taught in the American philosophy program. Rufus Burrow, Jr. writes on African Personalism, particularly Martin Luther King, Jr. Thomas O. Buford founded and edited The Personalist Forum, now The Pluralist, and writes in education, epistemology, American Personalism, and philosophy of culture. Also, he and Charles Conti of University of Sussex Brighton England formed The International Forum on Persons in 1988. It holds biennial meetings alternating between North American and Europe. Alternating with the international meetings, Jim McLachlin holds a week-long summer conference on Personalism at Western Carolina University in the mountains of North Carolina.
Thomas O. Buford
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 25, 2011 | Originally published: