Edmund Husserl, founder of the phenomenological movement, employs the term “phenomenology” in its etymological sense as the activity of giving an account (logos) of the way things appear (phainomenon). Hence, a phenomenology of time attempts to account for the way things appear to us as temporal or how we experience time. Phenomenology offers neither metaphysical speculation about time’s relation to motion (as does Aristotle), nor the psychological character of time’s past and future moments (as does Augustine), nor transcendental-cognitive presumptions about time as a mind-dependent construct (as does Kant). Rather, it investigates the essential structures of consciousness that make possible the unified perception of an object that occurs across successive moments. In its nuanced attempts to provide an account of the form of intentionality presupposed by all experience, the phenomenology of time-consciousness provides important contributions to philosophical issues such as perception, memory, expectation, imagination, habituation, self-awareness, and self-identity over time.Within the phenomenological movement, time-consciousness is central. The most fundamental and important of all phenomenological problems, time-consciousness pervades Husserl’s theories of constitution, evidence, objectivity and inter-subjectivity. Within continental philosophy broadly construed, the movements of existential phenomenology, hermeneutics, post-modernism and post-structuralism, as well as the work of Martin Heidegger, Jean-Paul Sartre, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Hans George Gadamer and Jacques Derrida, all return in important ways to Husserl’s theory of time-consciousness. After devoting considerable attention to Husserl’s reflections on time-consciousness, this article treats the developments of the phenomenological account of time in Heidegger, Sartre, and Merleau-Ponty.
Phenomenology maintains that consciousness, in its very nature as activity, is intentional. In its care for and interest in the world, consciousness transcends itself and attends to the world by a myriad of intentional acts, e.g., perceiving, remembering, imagining, willing, judging, etc.—hence Husserl’s claim that intentional consciousness is correlated (that is, co-related) to the world. Although the notion of intentionality includes the practical connotations of willful interest, it fundamentally denotes the relation conscious has to objects in the world. Of these many modes of intentionality, time-consciousness arguably constitutes the central one for understanding consciousness’s intentional, transcending character. Put differently, time-consciousness underscores these other intentional acts because these other intentional acts presuppose or include the consciousness of internal time. For this and other reasons, Husserl, in his On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1893-1917) (1991), deemed time-consciousness the most “important and difficult of all phenomenological problems” (PCIT, No. 50, No. 39). Together with Analyses Concerning Passive and Active Syntheses (2001), Cartesian Meditations (1997) and Die ‘Bernaur Manuskripte’ über das Zeitbewußtseins 1917/18 (2001), this work seeks to account for this fundamental form of intentionality that the experience of temporal (e.g., spatial and auditory) and non-temporal (e.g., mathematical and logical) objects alike presupposes.
All experience entails a temporal horizon, according to phenomenology. This claim seems indisputable: we rush, we long, we endure, we plan, we reminisce, we perceive, we speak, we listen, etc. To highlight the difficulty and importance of explaining the structures of consciousness that make possible the experience of time, Husserl, like his contemporaries Henri Bergson and William James, favored the example of listening to a melody. For a melody to be a melody, it must have distinguishable though inseparable moments. And for consciousness to apprehend a melody, its structure must have features capable of respecting these features of temporal objects. Certainly, we can “time” the moments of a temporal object, a melody, with discrete seconds (measured by clocks). But this scientific and psychological account of time, which, following Newton, considers time as an empty container of discrete, atomistic nows, is not adequate to the task of explaining how consciousness experiences a temporal object. In this case of Newtonian time, each tone spreads its content out in a corresponding now but each now and thus each tone remains separated from every other. Newtonian time can explain the separation of moments in time but not the continuity of these moments. Since temporal objects, like a melody or a sentence, are characterized by and experienced as a unity across a succession, an account of the perception of a temporal object must explain how we synthesize a flowing object in such a way that we (i) preserve the position of each tone without (ii) eliminating the unity of the melody or (iii) relating each tone by collapsing the difference in the order between the tones.
Bergson, James and Husserl realized that if our consciousness were structured in such a way that each moment occurred in strict separation from every other (like planks of a picket fence), then we never could apprehend or perceive the unity of our experiences or enduring objects in time otherwise than as a convoluted patchwork. To avoid this quantitative view of time as a container, Husserl’s phenomenology attempts to articulate the conscious experience of lived-time as the prerequisite for the Newtonian, scientific notion of time’s reality as a march of discrete, atomistic moments measured by clocks and science. In this way, Husserl’s approach to time-consciousness shares much in common with these popular nineteenth Century treatments of time-consciousness. Yet to appreciate fully Husserl’s account of time-consciousness—the uniqueness of his contribution beyond other popular nineteenth Century accounts (deWarren 2008), and the priority he affords it in his own thinking—we first must understand phenomenology’s methodological device, the phenomenological reduction.
Husserl believed that every experience for intentional conscious has a temporal character or background. We experience spatial objects, both successive (e.g., a passing automobile) and stationary (e.g., a house), as temporal. We do not, on the other hand, experience all temporal objects (e.g., an imagined sequence or spoken sentence) as spatial. For the phenomenologist, even non-temporal objects (e.g., geometrical postulates) presuppose time because we experience their timeless character over time; for example, it takes time for me to count from one to five although these numbers themselves remain timeless, and it takes some a long time to understand and appreciate the force of timeless geometrical postulates (PCIT § 45; see Brough 1991). To this point, common sense views of time may find Husserl agreeable. Such agreement ceases, however, for those who expect Husserl to proclaim that time resembles an indefinite series of nows (like seconds) passing from the future through the present into the past (as a river flows from the top of a mountain into a lake). This common sense conception of time understands the future as not-yet-now, the past as no-longer-now, and the present as what now-is, a thin, ephemeral slice of time. Such is the natural attitude’s view of time, the time of the world, of measurement, of clocks, calendars, science, management, calculation, cultural and anthropological history, etc. This common sense view is not the phenomenologist’s, who suspends all naïve presuppositions through the reduction.
Phenomenology’s fundamental methodological device, the “phenomenological reduction,” involves the philosopher’s bracketing of her natural belief about the world, much like in mathematics when we bracket questions about whether numbers are mind-independent objects. This natural belief Husserl terms the “natural attitude,” under which label he includes dogmatic scientific and philosophical beliefs, as well as uncritical, every-day, common sense assumptions. Not a denial of the external world, like Descartes methodologically proposed, the phenomenological reduction neutralizes these dimensions of the natural attitude towards experience in order to examine more closely experience and its objects just as they appear to conscious experience (Ideas I §§ 44-49; Sokolowski 2000). Put less technically, one could consider phenomenology a critical rather than habitual or dogmatic approach to understanding the world. To call phenomenology a critical enterprise means that it is an enterprise guided by the goal of faithfully describing what experience gives us—thus phenomenology’s famed return to the things themselves—rather than defaulting to what we with our dogmas and prejudices expect from experience—thus phenomenology’s famed self-description as a “pressupositionless science” (Logical Investigations)
That the phenomenologist suspends her natural attitude means that a phenomenology of time bypasses the inquiry into both natural time considered as a metaphysical entity and scientific world time considered as a quantitative construct available for observation and necessary for calculation (PCIT § 2). Without prejudice to the sciences, the reduction also suspends all philosophical presuppositions about time’s metaphysical, psychological or transcendental-cognitive nature. Hence, the phenomenological reduction enables Husserl to examine the structures of consciousness that allow us to apprehend and thus characterize the modes of temporal objects appearing as now, past or future. As Husserlians often express it, Husserl concerns himself not with the content of an object or event in time (e.g., listening to a sentence) but with how an object or event appears as temporal (Brough 1991).
As this discussion about the effect of the reduction on Husserl’s account of time implies, Husserl distinguishes three levels of time for our consideration: (3) world[ly] or objective time; (2) personalistic or subjective time; and (1) the consciousness of internal time. We can make assessments and measurements, e.g., declaring things simultaneous or enduring, at the level of objective time only because we experience a succession of mental states in our subjective conscious life. Our awareness of objective time thus depends upon our awareness of subjective time. We are aware of subjective time, however, as a unity across succession of mental states because the consciousness of internal time provides a consciousness of succession that makes possible the apprehension and unification of successive mental states (PCIT No. 40; Sokolowski 2000).
Husserl’s contention that all experience presupposes (1) at first appears as an exhaustively subjective denial of time’s reality, particularly in light of the reduction. Moreover, since we believe that natural time precedes and will outlast our existence, we tend to consider (3) more fundamental than (1). As such, some may find Husserl’s privileging of (1) counterintuitive (Sokolowski 2000). Of course, such a passively received attitude or belief about time and our place therein amounts to cultural prejudice in favor of the scientific view of human beings as mere physical entities subject to the relentless march of time. A brief example may help us better understand Husserl’s objective and thus dispel these reservations: When listening to a fifty minute lecture (level 3), one may experience it as slow or as fast (level 2). Still, each listener’s consciousness has a structure (level 1) that makes it possible for her to apprehend (3) and (2). This structure in (1) functions in such a way that each listener can agree about the objective duration of the lecture while disagreeing about their subjective experience of it. If (1) changed subjectively as (2), then we never could reach a consensus or objective agreement about (3). For the phenomenologist, who seeks to give an account (logos) of the way things appear as temporal, the manifest phenomenon of time is not fundamentally worldly/objective or psychological/subjective time (Brough, 1991). Concerned with how temporal phenomena manifest themselves to conscious perceivers, the phenomenologist examines (1), namely the structures of intentional consciousness that make possible the disclosure of time as a worldly or psychological phenomenon. To begin to explain the priority of (1), Husserl highlights how the now and past are not a part of time considered according to the natural attitude view of (3) or (2).
It should be clear already that Husserl does not privilege the Newtonian view of time as a series of now, past and future moments considered as “things,” containers for “things,” or points on the imagined “time-line” (PCIT §§ 1-2, No. 51). Conversely, he considers the present, past, and future as modes of appearing or modes by which we experience things and events as now, no longer (past) or not yet (future). For example, though I experience the event of the space shuttle Columbia’s explosion as past, the past is not some metaphysical container of which the Columbia shuttle tragedy is a part; the past is the mode in which the Columbia shuttle tragedy appears to me. This does not mean that Husserl views time as something that flows willy-nilly, or that the time of the Columbia shuttle tragedy is contemporaneous with the time of your reading this entry. Husserl acknowledges that “time is fixed and that time flows” (PCIT § 31, No. 51). When we count from one to ten, two always occurs after one and before three regardless of how far our counting progresses; likewise, the temporal event of the Columbia shuttle tragedy occupies an unchanging, determinate temporal position in world-time, “frozen” between what came before and after it, ever-receding into the past of world time (history) without losing its place. Phenomenology helps to clarify the common sense understanding of time as a container—a metaphysical placeholder—that contains events. This common sense understanding of time as a container persists because we forget that we first understand these fixed temporal relations and position thanks to the modes of appearing, namely now, past and future (Brough, 1991).
As Husserlians put it, Husserl considers the now as conscious life’s absolute point of orientation from which things appearing as past and future alter (PCIT §§ 7, 14, 31, 33). Since the now and past are not a part of time but the modes by which things appear to me as temporal, each now that becomes past can accommodate many events simultaneously, e.g., one may remember where one was when the shuttle exploded, what anchor man one might have heard, what channel one was watching, who one was with, etc. (PCIT § 33; Brough 2005). The very fact that this experience becomes part of one’s conscious life implies that one experienced it in the now. Moreover, I can remember what events preceded and succeeded this tragedy, e.g., that my grade-school class filed into the auditorium or that my teacher sniffled as she led us back to our classroom. The very fact that one can place the event in relation to preceding and succeeding events implies both that one never experiences the now in isolation from the past and future and that one experiences the relation between now, past and future without collapsing these three modes of appearing (PCIT § 31).
These reflections on temporal objects and experienced time indicate that the flow of our conscious life is the condition for the possibility of the disclosure of temporal objects and experienced time, a condition that begins from the privileged standpoint of the now, which, again, nevertheless occurs in an interplay with past and future rather than in isolation from them. More than this descriptive account of some essential features of time’s appearance, however, Husserl’s phenomenology of time-consciousness concerns itself with the structure of the act of perceiving that allows us to apprehend a temporal object as unified across its manifold moments. Indeed, our preliminary reflections on time depend upon a series of successive events but a succession of experiences or perceptions is not yet an experience or perception of succession. Husserl turns his attention toward (1)—the transcendental level of internal time-consciousness—in order to explain how (2) and (3) become constituted conscious experiences.
When we say that Husserl focuses his attention on (2) and (1), we mean that his writings on time-consciousness attempt to explain how time and experienced time appear to consciousness. This explanation begins, for Husserl, by confronting the paradox of how to account for the unity of a process of change that continues for an extended period of time, a unity that develops in succession, e.g., listening to a sentence or watching a film (PCIT No. 50). To unravel this theoretical knot, Husserl believed, philosophy must realize that, beyond the temporality of the object, the act of perceiving has its own temporal character (PCIT No. 32). Consider the phrase, “Peter Piper picked a pack of pickled peppers” at the word, “picked.” In this example, I hear “picked” yet somehow must hold onto “Peter” and “Piper” in just the order in which I originally apprehended them. Husserl contends that insofar as a temporal object such as a sentence occurs across time in a now that includes what is no longer, consciousness too must extend beyond the now; indeed, if all I heard were different words in each new now without connecting them to past related words, then I never would hear a sentence but only a barrage of sounding words. Consciousness not only must extend beyond the now, but it also must extend in such a way that it preserves the determinate temporal order of the words and modifies their orientation to the now. Indeed, if I preserved the words in a simultaneous or haphazard order, then I never would hear a sentence but only a jumble of words.
To account for the unity of succession in a way that avoids these difficulties, Husserl will not explain consciousness’ extension beyond the now in an act of perception by merely importing a view of Newtonian time into the mind or translating such a view of natural time into a transcendental condition of the mind. This was Kant’s dogmatic failure in the “Transcendental Aesthetic” of his Critique of Pure Reason (Crisis 104 ff.). Nor will Husserl’s account of the “perception” of a temporal object conclude, as Augustine’s did, that consciousness extends beyond the now thanks to its “present of things no longer” and a “present of thing yet to come” that echoed Augustine’s description of the soul’s distention (PCIT § 1; Kelly 2005). Such an Augustinian account of “the present of thing no longer” cannot explain the perception of a temporal object because it traps the heard contents in the now (as a present of things no longer remains present nevertheless). Augustine’s notion of a “present of things no longer” can explain consciousness’ extension beyond the now only as a result of a memorial recollection. But memory drags past nows—and the contents occurring therein—back into the present, thereby rendering past moments simultaneous with a present moment and effectively halting time’s flow. Any account of temporal awareness that explains consciousness’’ extension beyond the now by recourse to memory conflates the acts of memory and perception and thus proves inadequate to explain the conscious perception of a temporal object. Memory gives not the perception of a temporal object but always only what it is capable of giving: a memory (PCIT No. 50; Brough, 1991).
With respect to this problem of conflating memory and perception, Husserl indicates two consequences. First, the distention of the now through memory leaves us with a situation where, as Husserl admits, at any given moment I perceive only the actually present word of the sentence; hence, the whole of the enduring sentence appears in an act that is predominantly memory and only marginally perception (PCIT § 12). Experience tells us, however, that we “perceive” (hear) the whole sentence across its present (now) and absent (past or future) words rather than hearing its present word and remembering (or expecting) the others (PCIT § 7). Indeed, something quite different occurs when I hear a sentence and when I remember the event of the Columbia shuttle tragedy. Second, having conflated the past and the present by making recourse to memory as a means to explain consciousness’ extension beyond the now, such a theory violates the law of non-contradiction, for the mode of the present cannot present something as past, but only as present, and vice versa (PCIT No. 14). In short, on such Augustinian theory, everything remains ‘now’ and nothing can overcome that fact (Brough 1993; Kelly 2005).
The problem of the consciousness of time becomes properly phenomenological when Husserl asks how one explains the original consciousness of the past upon which one can recognize an object as past rather remembering a past moment. Put differently, the problem of time becomes phenomenological when Husserl begins to seek an account of the generation of a sense or consciousness of pastness upon which (the) perception (of a temporal object) and memory depend. Indeed, to claim that we remember something presupposes the very sense of the past we are trying to explain (Sokolowski 2000). An adequate account of the perception of a temporal object first requires a discussion of how consciousness extends beyond the now, i.e., an account of the difference between the consciousness of succession and the remembrance of a succession of consciousnesses (PCIT No. 47; Brough 1972).
Unlike previous theories addressing the consciousness of time, Husserl shifts his attention from an account of what is perceived as temporal to an account of the temporality of that which does the perceiving. Put differently, he tightens his focus, so to speak, recognizing that when one perceives a temporal object one also experiences the flow of the intentional act of perception (Brough 1991). In order to solve the aforementioned paradox of how to account for the unity of a temporal object over the succession of its parts (e.g., the sentence across it many words), Husserl turns his attention to consciousness’ lived experience, to the structures of consciousness at level (1) that make possible the unification of the manifold moments of that act of perception at level (2) and the perceived object at level (3) (PCIT No. 41).
To explain how consciousness extends beyond the now in its act of perception, Husserl begins to think that consciousness itself must have a “width.” And this is just to say that consciousness must have a sense of the past and a sense of the future to begin with (Sokolowski 2000). To this end, Husserl attempts to argue that consciousness extends to capture past moments of experience and temporal objects therein by “retaining” and “protending” the elapsed and yet to come phases of its experience and thereby the past words that do not presently exist (when I reach a certain point in listening to a sentence) yet remain related to the present experience (PCIT, No. 54; Zahavi, 2000). Rather than attempt to explain the unity of a succession of discrete consciousnesses correlated with a succession of discrete moments in a temporal object, Husserl attempts to explain the consciousness of succession that makes possible the apprehension of a succession of consciousnesses.
Husserl thus speaks almost exclusively of consciousness’ living-present, and he characterizes this life of consciousness with three distinguishable yet inseparable moments: primal impression, retention, and protention. This tripartite form or intentional structure of the living-present should not be thought of as discrete, independently occurring pieces in a process (or procession). Such an atomistic view of the living-present’s structure will not work. Were the moments of the living-present thought as such, we would have to remember or re-present each past state of consciousness. Not a knife-edged moment, Husserl describes the life of consciousness, the living-present, as extended like a comets tail, or saddle-back, to use the image William James preferred, moments comprising an identity in a manifold (James) (PCIT § 10).
Consciousness is no longer a punctual box with several acts functioning in it simultaneously and directing themselves to the appropriate instances of the object. Admittedly, it is difficult to talk of this level of the consciousness of internal time, and Husserl himself claims we are reduced to metaphors (PCIT §§ 34-36). In a perhaps inadequate metaphor, Husserl’s theory of the living-present might be thought of as presenting a picture of consciousness as a “block” with relevant “compartments” distinguished by “filters” or “membranes,” each connected to and aware of the other. In this life of consciousness, Husserl maintains, consciousness apprehends itself and that which flows within it. As Husserl describes it, retention perceives the elapsed conscious phase of experience at level (1) and thereby the past of the experience at level (2) and the past of the object at level (3). The moments of retention and protention in the tripartite form of consciousness that is the living-present make possible consciousness’ extension beyond the now in such a way that avoids the problem of simultaneity and enables consciousness to attend determinately to the temporal phases of the object of perception. Unlike Augustine’s notion of a present of things no longer, which remembered or re-presented a past content in the now, Husserl draws a distinction between memory and retention. On the one hand, memory provides a “consciousness of the [instant] that has been” (PCIT § 12). On the other hand, retention “designates the intentional relation of phase of consciousness to phase of consciousness” (PCIT No. 50), i.e., a “consciousness of the past of the [experience]” (PCIT No. 47) and thereby the instant of the object that has been.
This distinction does not mean that memory differs from retention merely as a matter of temporal distance, the former reaching back further into time. Rather, Husserl draws a structural distinction between memory and retention: The former is an active, mediated, objectifying awareness of a past object, while the latter is a passive, immediate, non-objectifying, conscious awareness of the elapsed phase of conscious experience. First, memory reveals itself to be an act under the voluntary auspices of consciousness, whereas retention occurs passively. Second, while memories occur faster or slower and can be edited or reconstructed, retention occurs “automatically” and cannot be varied at one’s whim (though it can, at level 2, be experienced as faster or slower, as noted above in our example of listening to a lecture). Third, remembering re-produces a completed temporal object, whereas retention works at completing the consciousness of a temporal object, unifying its presence and absence. Fourth, as the representation of a new intentional object, memory is an act of presenting something as past, as absent, whereas the retention that attempts to account for the perception of an object over time constitutes an intuition of that which has just passed and is now in some sense absent, an act of presenting something as a unity in succession. Fifth, memory provides us with a new intentional object not now intuitively presented as the thing itself “in person”—e.g., remembering my friend’s face when she is absent from me in this moment—whereas retention accounts for the perception across time of an object now intuitively presented for me—e.g., the progressive clarity of my perception of my friends face as she approaches me from the street. Sixth, despite memory’s character as a presenting act, when it represents to me my friend’s face it represents it in the now with a change in temporal index or a qualification of the remembered object as past, whereas retention holds on to that which is related to my present perception in a mode of absences (e.g., as when I hear “picked” while retaining “Peter Piper”). Seventh, memory depends upon or is “founded” upon retention as the condition of its very possibility, for memory could never represent an object as a completed whole if retention did not first play its role in constituting across time the object now remembered (PCIT, No 50; Zahavi; Brough 1991.
To explain time-consciousness at level (1), then, Husserl comes to favor the theory that consciousness of the past and future must be explained by the intentional direction of retention and protention to the past and future of consciousness’ lived experience rather than a mode of memorial apprehension that issues from the now to animate past impressions. Returning to our above example of listening to a sentence, when I hear “picked,” I do not remember “Peter Piper.” Rather, I intuitively perceive the sentence as a temporally differentiated yet nonetheless related to the current [of this] experience. To be sure, the words do not occur simultaneously; each word passes and yet remains relevant to the presently lived experience. The interpreter of Husserl must take care at this point not to read the turn to consciousness as entailing a loss of the perceived; rather, what is retained is precisely the impressional moment as experienced in that moment and having been retained in this experience. In fact, this account allows that the words, “Peter Piper,” have passed, metaphysically, but remain on hand in this apprehension of “picked” thanks to consciousness’ retention of its past phase of experience wherein it heard the related words, “Peter Piper.” As a moment of the intentional relationship between the phases of consciousness’ living-present, retention “automatically” experiences its intuitively present conscious life and determinately provides a consciousness of the past of the experience.
Husserl’s account of the living-present ultimately articulates the condition for the possibility of all objectifying acts, a condition itself not objectified. As such, the discussion of retention brings us to the bottom line, the final and most difficult layer of intentional analysis, namely consciousness’ double-intentionality (PCIT No. 54).
The living-present marks the essence of all manifestation, for in its automatic or passive self-givenness the living-present makes possible the apprehension of the elapsed phases of the life of consciousness and thereby the elapsed moments of the transcendent spatio-temporal object of which the conscious self is aware. This is possible, Husserl argues, because the “flow” (PCIT § 37) of conscious life enjoys two modes of simultaneously operative intentionality. One mode of intentionality, which he terms Langsintentionalität, or horizontal intentionality, runs along protention and retention in the flow of the living-present. The other mode of intentionality, which Husserl terms the Querintentionalität, or transverse intentionality, runs from the living-present to the object of which consciousness is aware (PCIT No. 45; Brough 1991).
Husserl explains the unity of these two intentional modes as a consciousness wherein the Querintentionalität is capable of intending a temporal object across its successive appearings because the Langsintentionalität provides consciousness’ self-awareness and awareness of its experiences over time. As an absolute flowing identity in a manifold—of primal impression, retention and protention—the stream of conscious life in the living-present constitutes the procession of words in the sentence that appears and is experienced sequentially in accordance with the temporally distinct position of each word. Husserl thus describes consciousness as having a “double-intentionality”: the Querintentionalität, which objectively and actively grasps the transcendent object—the heard sentence—and the Langsintentionalität, which non-objectively and automatically or passively grasps consciousness’ lived-experience—the flow of the living-present (PCIT No. 45). That I hear the words of the fifty-minute lecture and feel myself inspired or bored is possible only on the basis of my self-awareness or consciousness of internal time.
Though Husserl terms this consciousness that is the special form of horizontal intentionality in the living-present a “flow,” he employs the label “metaphorically” because the living-present’s flow manifests itself, paradoxically, as a non-temporal temporalizing (PCIT § 32, No. 54). That the living-present temporalizes means that it grasps its past and future as absent without reducing its past and future to the present, thus freezing consciousness temporal flow. To capture Husserl’s image of a non-temporal flow more aptly, some commentators prefer the image of shimmering (Sokolowski 1974). As Husserl himself admits that we have no words for this time-constituting phenomenon, the image of shimmering seems a more appropriate descriptor, for Husserl understand the living-present paradoxically as a standing-streaming (PCIT No. 54). Though non-temporal, Husserl assigns the living-present a time-constituting status, for this absolute consciousness makes possible the disclosure of temporal objects insofar as it makes possible the disclosure of consciousness’’ temporality by accounting for our original sense of the past and of the future in the retentional and protentional dimension of the living-present (PCIT § 37).
Husserl must characterize the flow as non-temporal. If that which makes possible the awareness of a unity in succession itself occurred in succession, then we would need to account for the apprehension of the succession unique to the living-present, and so on and so forth, ad infnitum (PCIT, No. 39, No. 50). An infinite regress of consciousness, however, would mean that we never would achieve an answer to the question of what makes possible the consciousness of time. In order to avoid an infinite regress, then, and in accordance with experience, which tells us that we do apprehend time and temporal objects, Husserl describes the living-present’s flow as a non-temporal temporalizing. This argument in favor of the non-temporal character of the living-present brings us to the two senses in which the special form of intentional consciousness is an absolute consciousness.
First, Husserl characterizes the living-present as absolute because a non-temporal consciousness that needs no other consciousness behind it to account for its self-apprehension is just that, absolute, the bottom line. Second, as the absolute bedrock of intentional analysis (Sokolowski 2000), the absolute flow as a mode of intentionality peculiar to the living-present conveys a move away from a model of awareness or intentionality dependent upon a subject’s relation to an object. If philosophy construes all awareness according to an object-intentionality model of awareness, i.e., the dyadic relation of a subject (knower) to an object (known), then it can never account for the relation between knower and known in the case of self-consciousness. For example, when I am writing this entry, I am conscious of the computer on which I am typing, as well as myself as the one typing. To explain, philosophically, however, how I apprehend myself as the one typing, the dyadic object-intentionality model of awareness will not suffice. The issue, of course, concerns self-awareness and thus philosophy’s standard understanding of self-identity over time.
In the classic treatment of self-consciousness, John Locke in his Essay Concerning Human Understanding accounts for self-identity over time thanks to consciousness’ reflective grasp on its past states. Locke establishes this account by distinguishing (i) simple ideas of sense directed toward (iia) objects from (i) simple ideas of reflection directed toward (iib) the self. In both cases, (i) knows (iia) and (iib) in the same manner insofar as (i) takes (iia) and (iib) as objects while (i) itself goes unnoticed or unaccounted for. Locke’s account thus turns the self or subject into an object without ever really presenting the self. Even if a simple idea of reflection directs itself toward the self, one self (the reflecting self) remains subject while the other self (the reflected self) becomes the object. In self-awareness, however, no difference, distance or separation exists between the knower and the known. Forced to apprehend itself as an object in an exercise of simple sense reflection, the Lockean subject never coincides with itself, caught as it is in a sequence of epistemic tail chasing (Locke, 1959 I; Zahavi, 1999). Such tail chasing, moreover, entails an infinite regress of selves themselves never self-aware. Locke’s failure stems from his restriction of intentionality to the model of object-awareness, the dyadic model of awareness, where all awareness requires a subject knowing an object.
Husserl’s account of the unity of (1) this dynamic, shimmering living-present makes possible the consciousness of (2) psychological or subjective time and (3) worldly or objective time provides an alternative to the traditional account of awareness as merely an objectivating relation of a subject to object (Brough, 1991; Sokolowski, 1973; Zahavi, 1999). By retaining the elapsed phase of consciousness and thereby the past of the object, retention unifies consciousness’ flow and the time-span of the perceived temporal object, thus providing at once a non-objective self-awareness and an objective awareness of spatio-temporal entities.
Despite the heady accomplishments of Husserl’s theory of time-consciousness as founded in the living-present’s double-intentionality, contemporary phenomenologists still disagree about Husserl’s discovery. Some commentators, under the influence of Derrida’s critique of Husserl’s theory of the living-present (Derrida 1973), express reservations over the legitimacy of the status of the living-present as an absolute, non-temporal temporalizing, arguing that it amounts to a mythical construct (Evans, 1990). Yet decisive refutations of these criticisms, based on their insensitivity to the nuances of Husserl’s theory, are plenty (Brough, 1993; Zahavi, 1999). Still, even those who accept its legitimacy disagree about how best to explain the relation between levels (1) and (2) of time-consciousness (see Zahavi, 1999; Brough 2002). Interestingly, the very complexities and details of Husserl’s theory of internal time-consciousness, which remain a central point of debate for contemporary phenomenologists, proved germane to phenomenology’s development and alteration throughout the Twentieth Century.
If the double-intentionality of Husserl’s theory of consciousness proves fruitful, it is because it allows us to given an account of the temporality of individual experiences (e.g., listening to a sentence) as well as the temporal ordering of a multiplicity of experience (e.g., recognizing the classroom to which I return each week as the same room differentiated over a span of time) and all of these experiences as mine, as belonging to me. Husserl’s first follower, Martin Heidegger, took up the benefits of Husserl’s theory and developed them into his own unique brand of phenomenology. In fact, Heidegger developed his brand of phenomenology precisely in light of Husserl’s reflections on the intentionality unique to absolute time-constituting consciousness. As we shall see, Heidegger might put the point more forcefully, claiming that he developed his phenomenology in opposition to Husserl’s theory of absolute time-constituting consciousness. In any event, we can begin by identifying a fundamental difference between Husserl and Heidegger: Husserl emphasized the retentional side of the life of consciousness because he was interested in cognition, which builds up over time, while Heidegger emphasized the protentional or futural side of the subject because he is more interested in practical activity (the “in order to” or “for the sake of”).
According to Heidegger, the essence of absolute time-constituting consciousness amounted to a subject divorced and isolated from the world because Husserl construed absolute consciousness as a theory only about the a priori, presuppositionless and essential structures of consciousness that made possible the unified perception of an object occurring in successive moments. As an alternative to what he considered Husserl’s abstracted view of the human being, Heidegger suggests that philosophy cannot advance a proper understanding of the being of the human being by bracketing its and the world’s existence. Instead, we must understand the human being as being-in-the-world, Dasein, literally there-being; we only can understand what the world contributes to us and what we contribute to the world if we consider each as co-dependent without reducing one to the other. To put it differently, Husserl’s transcendental phenomenology provides an “upward” oriented approach while Heidegger’s ontological phenomenology provides a “downward” oriented approach, and their approaches stem from their different views of time (Macann 1991).
Heidegger maintains that Husserl’s phenomenology proves inadequate to the task of understanding Dasein’s relation to the world because Husserl fails to articulate adequately the relation between consciousness, or being, and time. Specifically, Husserl’s construction of the fundamental form of intentionality as absolute time-constituting consciousness remains, according to Heidegger, prisoner to the bias of pure presence. As Heidegger puts it, the bias of pure presence entails the reduction of “being” to the moment that “is” fully articulated in the conscious now at the expense of absence, i.e., what falls outside the conscious now, i.e., the moments of past and future. Such a view of consciousness, Heidegger insists, capitulates to the prejudice of presence because it implies that something can appear to consciousness only in the form of an object now given or before one in person and unified by consciousness across its manifold moments (BT, § 67c). At a general level of intentionality, Heidegger wants to correct Husserl’s overly cognitive assessment of the subject. For Heidegger, an intention or intentio literally conveys a sense of “stretching out” or “straining” (Heidegger 1925). For Heidegger, Dasein is being in the world, a being with goals and projects toward which it comports itself or toward which it stretches out. The projects toward which it stretches itself makes Dasein fundamentally futural in its intentional directedness toward the world.
Having failed to investigate the practical comportment of the subject, Heidegger argues, Husserl’s view of consciousness seems to reduce all awareness to awareness of an object in the present, thus reducing the past to the present and consciousness’ self-awareness to an object among objects (Dahlstron 1999). Together, these related consequences motivate Heidegger’s conclusion that Husserl fails to perform the phenomenological reduction completely. Or, better, Heidegger concluded that the performance of the reduction adulterates the view of the subject and thus should be abandoned. Heidegger’s version of phenomenology thus does not begin from a phenomenological reduction although competing views of this matter exist (Crowell 1990; Blattner 1999).
As mentioned already, Heidegger’s very conception of Dasein as co-dependent with the world displays, he believes, his difference from Husserl’s view of the human being as absolute time-constituting consciousness. Put negatively and in terms of his History of the Concept of Time (1925), Heidegger criticizes Husserl for not considering fully the existence of the human being, bracketing its existence in favor of an analysis of the essential features of consciousness’ intentional structures (Heidegger 1925). Put positively and in terms of his Being and Time (1927), Heidegger claims that Dasein’s essence is its existence (BT § 9). Hence, one might claim, Heidegger introduces the movement of existential phenomenology, a development in phenomenology concerned with the very existence of the human being, which we have seen is termed Dasein by Heidegger.
Concern with Dasein’s existence as its essence does necessarily reduce to the assumption that Heidegger takes existence in the sense of biological or genetic determinants. Though such factors may condition Dasein’s manner of existing, they do not determine it, according to Heidegger. Dasein is neither fully determined nor uninhibitedly free (BT 144). She exists in the mode of her possibilities and her possibilities are motivated by environmental influences, her skills and interests, etc. (Blattner, 1999). Dasein, for Heidegger, is thus a being concerned about her being, reckoning with the world through her activities and commitments. Centering his existential phenomenology on how the world appears to a being concerned about its being, Heidegger’s inquiry starts from how Dasein comports herself as manifest in the everyday activities of her life, activities to which she commits herself or about which she cares (BT § 7). Heideggerian phenomenology thus begins from an interest in how the world appears to a being that cares about its existence, an intentional being but one who, in intending the world, is primarily practical and secondarily contemplative. Less concerned with the Husserlian search for presuppositionless certainty and essential structures, Heidegger’s existential phenomenology amounts to an interpretive description or hermeneutics that attempts to express the unexpressed (or articulate the pre-predicative) mode of Dasein’s engagement with the world (BT § 7). And this manner of engagement finds its fullest expression in Heidegger’s account of Dasein’s temporality.
The notion of Dasein’s projects proves crucial to understanding Heidegger’s analysis of Dasein’s temporality and its difference from Husserl’s phenomenology. In discussing Dasein’s projects, Heidegger takes the term etymologically; to pro-ject means to put out there or to put forward. That Dasein projects itself in the world implies something fundamental about it. Dasein finds itself thrown into a world historical circumstance and projects itself in that world. Born (thrown) into a time and culture not of one’s choosing, Dasein always already exists in the world and suffers some limitations from which she nevertheless may wiggle free thanks to her interests and concerns about the world and her existence therein. The way things matter to Dasein—how she finds herself affected, in Heidegger’s language—and her skills and interest constitute different possibilities for her, different ways of being-in-the-world. These possibilities, in turn, manifest themselves in Dasein’s projects, i.e., in how she puts herself forward or projects or comports herself. These conditions suggest to Heidegger that the essential mode of being in the world for Dasein is a temporal one. Of the three temporal dimensions characterizing Dasein, we may say: First, the fact that Dasein finds herself thrown into a world and characterized by certain dispositions, etc. implies a “pastness” to her being. Second, the fact she projects herself implies a “futurity” to her being. And, third, the fact that she finds herself busied with the world as she projects herself in an effort to fulfill the present tasks required by the goal that is her project implies a “presentness” to her being (Blattner 1999).
The fundamental characteristic of the being that cares about its being, Dasein, then, is temporality. But things are not as simple (or common-sense) as they seem thus far. Time resembles Dasein insofar as time projects itself or stands outside itself in its future and past without losing itself—time and Dasein thus appear ontologically similar, or similar in their ontological structure. Since the question concerns the being for whom its being is a concern, and since the fundamental structure of this being is its temporality, philosophy’s very attempt to understand Dasein fundamentally concerns the relation between being and time at a pre-predicative level of worldly-engagement, a level prior to articulated judgment, prior to the conscious conceptualizations of traditional metaphysics or Husserlian phenomenology; hence, the title of Heidegger’s famous work, Being and Time (Richardson 1967). In Heidegger’s terms, an “authentic” understanding of the being concerned about its being rests upon a proper understanding of that being’s temporality.
To understand Dasein, then, Heidegger first distinguishes originary or authentic time understood as Dasein’s way of being in the world from worldly- and ordinary-time understood inauthentically or uncritically by the common-sense, pre-philosophical mind (BT § 80). As the labels imply, Heidegger articulates a hierarchical structure between these levels of time, much like Husserl’s levels of time (Sokolowski 1974). The hierarchical structure envisioned by Heidegger looks like this: World-time grounds ordinary-time, and both in turn are grounded by originary-time.
To establish the fundamental feature of Dasein as originary temporality, Heidegger distances his view of Dasein’s temporality from all common sense understandings of time as a series of nows, thereby deferring the common sense understanding of past as no-longer-now and future as not-yet-now. His position depends on a distinction between how time shows itself to Dasein as world-time and ordinary-time, the latter being derivative of the former. World-time denotes the manner in which the world appears as significant to Dasein in its everyday reckoning with the world at a practical level through its projects. For example, the world appears to an academic with certain significances or importance. Objects like chalk, books, computers, and libraries all manifest themselves with a particular value, and time does, as well (just consider the fact that the new year begins in late August rather than the first day of January). When I sit in my office, the approaching time of three in the afternoon does not appear merely as an indifferent hour on the clock. Rather, it appears to me as the time when, according to my project, I must head to class—just as it may appear to a postal work as the time when she should return to the station from her route. For me, the time-span of my class does not merely appear as seventy-five successive minutes. Rather, the classroom time of my project appears to me as the time when I project myself toward my students, the material for the day’s discussion and the material equipment in the class that facilitates my teaching well. If my class begins to go poorly, however, I may become self-conscious about how well I meet the demands of my project as a teacher. When the focus of my attention shifts from my project to my failures, the time of my project ceases to be my primary focus. Perhaps in this case I shift my focus to the passing nows or seconds of each increasingly long minute. If such a shift occurs, Heidegger might claim that I shift from the mode of world-time to the mode of ordinary-time, the time understood as a measurable succession of nows, seconds, minutes, etc.
This time that measures successive nows, Heidegger deems ordinary-time, which depends upon world-time. Heidegger distinguishes the two by pointing out that the significance which colors world-time goes missing in the view of ordinary time and time appears no longer as the span of my project but the mere succession of punctual, atomistic nows (the Newtonian scientific view of time as an empty container or place holder). When the time-span of practical reckoning with the world ceases for Dasein, ordinary-time emerges (BT§ 80; Blattner 1999). The above example does not quite get Heidegger exactly right, however, for in it I remain interested in human concerns (except that now I am worried about them). What the example does convey is the shift in understanding time from a mode of time as an extended reckoning with the world laden with significance to a mode of time considered as a purely abstract marching of moments, a view of time most accurately associated with the mathematical and scientific view of time (but not to the mathematician or scientist working with this view of time).
All of these distinctions between world- and ordinary-time are meant to elaborate Heidegger’s view that as a series of projects Dasein is no mere entity in the world but a temporal structure peculiar to its kind of being-in-the-world that makes manifest world- and ordinary-time. For Heidegger, the now denotes a mode of Dasein’s manner of being that discloses the appearance of the world to us, i.e., Dasein’s way of being-in-the-world. As a series of projects, Dasein in its originary temporality is characterized by a tripartite mode of transcendence or process (albeit a non-sequential process, since Heidegger has distanced himself from the ordinary view of time). First, as transcendence, as that which goes from itself and to which the world comes, Dasein has a futural moment. Second, as transcendence, as that which manifests itself non-objectively while reckoning with that which stands before it, Dasein has a present moment as the place wherein the world appears to, or manifests itself to, that which cares about it. And, third, as transcendence, as that to which the world comes, Dasein has a past moment because that which comes and manifests itself comes and manifests itself to one who always already is there (Heidegger 1927; Richardson 1967). As transcendence, as temporality, Heidegger describes Dasein as “ecstatic,” where ecstatic means to stand out (Sokolowski 2000). As the kind of being that is always outside itself without leaving itself behind, Dasein is a process of separating and consolidating itself (Sokolowski 1974). Outside of itself in the future, Dasein projects itself and reckons with that about which it cares; outside of itself in the present, Dasein makes manifest or present the appearance of that to which it goes out in its interest and according to its projects; outside of itself in the past, Dasein drags along that which it has been, its life, which, in turn, colors its present experiences and future projects.
This union of past, present and future as modes of originary-time in Dasein’s being-in-the-world renders Dasein authentic—one with itself or its own—because the projection into the future makes the present and the past part of Dasein’s project—its essence is its existence. However, insofar as I assume a project or life-orientation passively and without realizing myself as responsible for that project, argues Heidegger, I live inauthentically. And this is because I am engaged in the world without a full understanding of myself within the world. Put differently, rather than consciously make myself who I am through my choices, I passively assume a role within society—hence the temptation to label Heidegger an existentialist, a label the he himself rejected.
Many rhetorical differences exist between how Husserl and Heidegger execute the phenomenological method, particularly the phenomenology of temporality. Despite these differences, Heidegger begins his inquiry into Dasein’s temporality much like Husserl began his consideration of absolute, time-constituting consciousness. Just as Husserl established that neither the now nor the consciousness of the now is itself a part of time, Heidegger begins his account of Dasein’s originary temporality with the observation that neither the now nor Dasein is itself a part of time (BT § 62). As Heidegger puts it, as always already being-in-the-world, Dasein’s temporality is neither before nor after nor already in terms of the way common sense understands time as a sequence of discrete, empty nows (BT § 65). Hence, Heidegger translates Husserl’s account of the levels of time into an account of Dasein’s originary temporality. Moreover, Heidegger and Husserl seemingly end on the same note, for Husserl describes the living-present as a non-objectivating transcendence, an intentional being that transcends itself toward the world, and this description equally characterizes Heidegger’s more practically oriented discussion of Dasein’s originary-temporality. Like Husserl’s notion of the living-present, Heidegger’s theory of Dasein’s structure as originary temporality considers Dasein a mode of objectivating not itself objectified, the condition for the possibility of all awareness of objects at the levels of worldly- and ordinary-time (BT § 70).
Still, an important difference exists with respect to their phenomenologies of time and time-consciousness. First, despite the implicit levels of time, Heidegger employs the phenomenological reduction quite ambivalently and ambiguously. Second, Heidegger explicitly rejects the outcome of the phenomenological reduction as a privileged access to absolute time-constituting consciousness. Third, Heidegger quite unequivocally privileges the moment of the future in his account of Dasein’s originary temporality. By emphasizing Dasein’s being-in-the-world as manifest through its throwness in the world, and its care for the world as manifest through its projects, Heidegger’s focuses on Dasein’s futural character distinguishes his account from Husserl’s, for Husserl emphasized the moment of retention in the living-present almost to the exclusion of any remarks on protention, the anticipatory moment of the living-present. For these reasons, Heidegger considered his phenomenology radically different from Husserl’s. In particular, Heidegger thought Husserl’s overly cognitive account of how consciousness constitutes a unified temporal object across a succession of moments articulated only one of the many issues surrounding the temporality of Dasein, a merely scientific or cognitive account of how consciousness presents an object in the world to itself. Husserl’s restrictive phenomenology of time, Heidegger argues, overlooks the existential dimension of Dasein’s temporality, how Dasein reckons with the world at a tacit level rather than how it cognizes the world. And in particular, Heidegger thought philosophy could assess Dasein’s manner of reckoning with the world only by examining its futural moment as manifest in the projects that characterize Dasein’s mode of existence as the ongoing realization of its possibilities or construction of its essence.
Heidegger’s innovative contributions to the phenomenology of time did not go unnoticed by later phenomenologists. Both Sartre and Merelau-Ponty adopted Heidegger’s view of Dasein as being-in-the-world, an entity whose essence is its existence. The originality of Sartre’s phenomenology of time lies not in his reflections on time, which, as we shall see, return to some rather pedestrian claims. Rather, Sartre’s unique contribution to the phenomenology of time lies in his understanding of how consciousness, the “for-itself,” relates to the world, the “in-itself.” What in their discussions of this fundamental mode of transcendence Husserl labeled absolute time-constituting consciousness, and Heidegger Dasein, Sartre termed the “for-itself.” Given Husserl and Heidegger’s differing views of consciousness’ mode of intentionality and its fundamental self-transcending nature in its mode of temporality, Sartre’s theory presents an unlikely marriage of the two.
Fusing Heidegger’s view of being-in-the-world with what he considered was a greater fidelity to Husserl’s notion of intentionality, Sartre considered the being of the “for-itself” an ecstatic temporal structure characterized by a sheer transcendence or intentionality. In his earliest work, Transcendence of the Ego (1939), Sartre defines the “for-itself” by intentionality, i.e., the Husserlian claim that consciousness transcends itself (Sartre 1936). As self-transcending, Sartre further delimits the “for-itself” as a being-in-itself-in-the-world. The “for-itself” is a field of being always already engaged with the world, as Heidegger expressed Dasein as intentional and thrown. For Sartre, however, in its activity of engaging the world the “for-itself” reveals itself as nothing, a “no-thing,” or not-the-being-of-which-it-is-conscious. Sartre further qualifies the being of the “for-itself” that always already is engaged with the world as a non-positional consciousness (Sartre 1936). A non-positional consciousness always already engaged the world, Sartre contends, consciousness does not take a position on itself but on the world; hence, consciousness is non-positional. To evidence his point, Sartre maintains that I, when late for a meeting and running to catch the subway, do not primarily concern myself with myself but only have a consciousness of the subway to be caught (Sartre 1936). Rather than taking a position on myself as I pursue the subway, I implicitly carry myself along as I tarry explicitly with the world. For this reason, Sartre argues that absolute consciousness in Husserl’s sense of the living-present does not unify a temporal experience because the unity of consciousness itself is found in the object (Sartre 1936).
This Sartrean view that the experience unifies itself not only recalls Heidegger’s insistence that Dasein is a self-consolidating process, but also renders the notion of an absolute time-constituting consciousness superfluous, according to Sartre. Indeed, Sartre believed that a deep fidelity to Husserl’s theory of intentionality necessitated the abandonment of Husserl’s notion of absolute consciousness; hence, he dramatically declared that the Husserlian notion of an absolute consciousness would mean the death of consciousness (Sartre 1936). If one assumes, with Husserl, the notion of a living-present characterized by the moments of retention, primal impression and protention, Sartre argues, consciousness dies of asphyxiation, so to speak. A consciousness divided in this way, according to Sartre, amounts to a series of instantaneous and discrete moments that themselves require connection. Such an instantaneous series of consciousness amounts to a caricature of intentionality, in Sartre’s view, because this kind of consciousness cannot transcend itself; as Sartre expresses it, an internally divided consciousness will suffocate itself as it batters in vain against the window-pains of the present without shattering them (Sartre 1943).
Sartre’s critique of the living-present or absolute time-constituting consciousness seems rather questionable. Indeed, this image leaves one wondering whether or not Sartre derives this caricatured view of time-consciousness from a caricature of Husserl’s view of intentionality. Nevertheless, Sartre abandons Husserl’s notion of the tripartite structure of absolute time-constituting consciousness in favor of something like Heidegger’s notion of Dasein’s ecstatic temporality and its projects and possibilities. And yet Sartres’ adaptation of Heidegger’s notion of Dasein’s possibilities seems questionable as well. Recall that Dasein’s possibilities were not purely uninhibited, that Dasein did not simply choose its projects and possibilities from a position of total freedom because of its thrown condition and affective dispositions. Sartre’s theory of the “for-itself” seems to reject the kinds of limiting conditions entailed by Heidegger’s notion of thrownness. Indeed, Sartre’s melodramatic image of a consciousness with cabin fever implies that he cannot fully embrace any limiting factors on how the “for-itself” fashions its essence through its existence. For Sartre, the “for-itself” is radically free (Blattner 1999), and the result of Sartre’s reflections on the temporality of the “for-itself” is a rather pedestrian view of temporality.
Like Husserl and Heidegger, Sartre does not consider the past, present and future as moments of time considered as contents or containers for contents. Rather, each marks a mode in which the “for-itself” makes manifest itself and the world. But Sartre’s account neither surpasses nor achieves either the rigor of Husserl’s analyses or the descriptive quality of Heidegger’s. For Sartre, the past of the “for-itself” amounts to that which was but is no longer—similar to the view of the past itself, which Augustine rejected, as that which was but is no-longer. By mirror opposite, the future of the “for-itself” amounts to which it intends to be but is not yet—similar to the view of the future itself, which Augustine rejected, as that which will be but is not yet. And between the two, the present of the “for-itself” is that which it is not, for its being is characterized as being-not-the-thing-of-which-it-is-conscious—similar to the view of the present, which Augustine rejected, as the thin, ephemeral slice of the now.
Whether Husserl’s, Heidegger’s or Sartre’s account, for phenomenology we cannot separate the issue of time from the issue of subjectivity’s structure. And Merleau-Ponty’s discussion of temporality in Phenomenology of Perception (1945) is no exception. It is, however, the most exceptional case of the intertwining of these issues. Developing Heidegger’s notion of Dasein as being-in-the-world, Merleau-Ponty emphasizes the being of Dasein as its bodily comportment and declares the body an essentially intentional part of the subject. Since Merleau-Ponty wants to make the body itself intentional, it is no surprise that he intertwines time and the subject, (in)famously remarking that “we must understand time as the subject and the subject as time” (Merleau-Ponty 1945).
To situate Merleau-Ponty’s account in this trajectory of phenomenological theories of time, it is useful to bear in mind that his account amounts to an innovative synthesis of Husserl and Heidegger’s understandings of time. Though the same can and has been said of Sartre’s account, Merleau-Ponty’s synthesis of Husserl and Heidegger differs from Sartre’s on three important scores. First, Merleau-Ponty rejects the dualistic ontology of the “for-itself” and the “in-itself” that led Sartre to rashly criticize Husserl’s notion of absolute consciousness and superficially adopt Heidegger’s phenomenological account of Dasein’s temporality as manifest in its projects and possibilities.” Second, Merleau-Ponty will not adopt Heidegger’s notion of Dasein’s temporality as an alternative to some purported shortcoming of Husserl’s account of the mode of intentionality unique to absolute time-constituting consciousness. Rather, third, more sensitive to the subtleties of Husserl’s theory of absolute time-constituting consciousness in the living-present than even Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty proposes to think the “unthought” of Husserl’s account of time through an intensified version of Heidegger’s account of the self’s inseparability from time.
From the outset, the “Temporality” chapter of his Phenomenology of Perception explicitly links time to the problem of subjectivity, noting that the analysis of time cannot follow a “pre-established conception of subjectivity” (Merleau-Ponty 1945). On the one hand, Merleau-Ponty rejects the traditional idealist conception of subjectivity in favor of an account of subjectivity in “its concrete structure;” on the other hand, since we must seek subjectivity “at the intersections of its dimensions,” which intersections concern “time itself and … its internal dialectic,” Merleau-Ponty rejects the realistic conception of subjectivity’s states as Nacheinander, i.e., successive, punctual, atomistic instants that lack intersection (Merleau-Ponty 1945). Hence, our understanding of Merleau-Ponty’s account of temporality and subjectivity’s temporality should follow the “triadic” structure of the Phenomenology: reject realism and idealism to demonstrate the merits of phenomenology (Sallis 1971).
The intellectualist account of time as (in) the subject fails because it extracts the subject from time and reduces time to consciousness’ quasi-eternity. The realist account of the subject as (in) time fails because it reduces the subject to a perpetually new present without unity to its flow. Both failures force upon the philosopher the realization that she can resolve the problem of time and subjectivity only by forfeiting the commitment to a “notion of time … as an object of our knowledge.” If we no longer can consider time “an object of our knowledge,” we must consider it a “dimension of our being” (Merleau-Ponty 1945). Hence, an account of subjectivity’s temporality—of time as a dimension of our being—necessarily entails the development of a model of bodily consciousness’ pre-reflective, non-objectifying awareness beyond the “pre-established conception of subjectivity” that takes time as an object of our knowledge.
This means not that (1) “time is for someone” but that (2) “time is someone” (Merleau-Ponty 1945). Phenomenologists and commentators alike often attribute (1) to Husserl and (2) to Heidegger. This should not surprise us given that Heidegger himself seemed to ascribe (2) to himself and his examination of Dasein’s lived-temporality in opposition to (1) Husserl’s account of how consciousness synthesizes an object across time. Often one of Husserl’s most sympathetic and accurate commentators (in Phenomenology of Perception, at least) Merleau-Ponty suggests that Husserl’s theory of absolute time-constituting consciousness in the living-present with its tripartite intentional structure provided an account of how (2) made time appear for reflection as (1). In short, Merleau-Ponty understood better than Heidegger that Husserl’s theory of the living-present articulated a theory of lived-time. What remained unthought by Husserl according to Merleau-Ponty was the inseparability of time and the subject in the theory of the living-present. Hence, an ambiguity intentionally pervades the account of time provided in Phenomenology of Perception.
This ambiguity at hand in Phenomenology of Perception stems from Merleau-Ponty’s honest admission that one never can fully execute the phenomenological reduction: “the most important lesson the reduction teaches us is the impossibility of a complete reduction” (Merleau-Ponty 1945). Merleau-Ponty does not advocate discarding the reduction, however, as Heidegger somewhat equivocally did. Rather, he aims to explain that Husserl merely meant the reduction as a critical device that ensured phenomenologists would retain the stance of presuppositionlessness, the stance of a perpetual beginner. The motivation for Merleau-Ponty’s reading of Husserl’s phenomenological reduction is the fact that philosophical reflection always depends upon a pre-reflective lived experience, a lived experience that always occurs in the temporal flux of bodily consciousness. Under the influence of Heidegger’s theory of Dasein’s being-in-the-world, Merleau-Ponty fashions his starting point in the exploration of time as an attempt to provide an account of the structures of pre-reflective consciousness that make reflection possible. And much like Heidegger, who sought to articulate the pre-predicative element of lived experience, Merleau-Ponty believed that these structures of pre-reflective consciousness reveal themselves as primarily temporal. (For his part, Merleau-Ponty will refer to this pre-reflective consciousness as the “tacit cogito,” his expression for the non-objectivating, pre-reflective consciousness articulated throughout the phenomenologists we have considered in this entry.) Hence, one could argue, despite the watershed reflections Merleau-Ponty provides on embodiment, time proves the most fundamental investigation of Phenomenology of Perception (Sallis 1971).
Since phenomenology’s task includes providing an account of the pre-reflective’, lived experience that makes possible reflection, Merleau-Ponty turns to the structure of time as an exemplar of that which makes explicit the implicit. For Merleau-Ponty, time provides a model that sheds light on the structure of subjectivity because “temporal dimensions … bear each other out and ever confine themselves to making explicit what was implied in each, being collectively expressive of that one single explosion or thrust that is subjectivity itself” (Merleau-Ponty 1945). Since to make explicit that which is implied in each moment means to transcend, to go beyond, one could say that Merleau-Ponty’s paradoxical expression means that time and the subject share the same structure of transcendence. That time is the subject and the subject is time means that the subject exists in a world that always outstrips her yet remains a world lived through by the subject (Sallis 1971). To clarify this structure, Merleau-Ponty invokes “with Husserl the ‘passive synthesis’ of time,” for the passive and non-objectivating characteristic of time’s structure in (what Husserl called) the living-present marks the archetype of the self’s structure, its transcendence that makes possible self- and object-manifestation. The Husserlian notion of double-intentionality thus pervades Merleau-Ponty’s account (Merleau-Ponty 1945).
That the matter of a passive and non-objectivating synthesis takes Merleau-Ponty to a consideration of the structure of absolute time-constituting consciousness’ double-intentionality—its transcendence and self-manifestation—as the structure of time we know to be the case for two reasons. First, Merleau-Ponty tells us, “in order to become explicitly what it is implicitly, that is, consciousness, [the self] needs to unfold itself into multiplicity;” second, in addition to the distinction just implied between non-objectivating and objectivating awareness, i.e., pre-reflective’ and reflective consciousness, Merleau-Ponty elaborates this manner of unfolding by claiming that “what we [mean] by passive synthesis [is] that we make our way into multiplicity, but that we do not synthesize it” as intellectualist accounts of time such as Augustine’s suggest. A synthesis of the multiplicity of time’s moments and the moments of the self must be avoided because it would require a constituting consciousness that stands outside time, and “we shall never manage to understand how a … constituting subject is able to posit or become aware of itself in time.” To avoid this error of separating consciousness from that of which it is aware, Merleau-Ponty appeals to Husserl’s theory of the living-present’s absolute flow, a “[consciousness that] is the very action of temporalization—of flux, as Husserl has it—a self anticipatory … flow which never leaves itself” (Merleau-Ponty 1945).
Merleau-Ponty seemingly provides an existential-phenomenological account of Husserl’s theory of absolute time-constituting consciousness’ double-intentionality. Nevertheless, he adopts Husserl’s theory according to his characteristic philosophy of ambiguity. Indeed, Merleau-Ponty insists that “it is of the essence of time to be not only actual time, or time which flows, but also time which is aware of itself … the archetype of the relationship of self to self” (Merleau-Ponty 1945). Ultimately with such remarks Merleau-Ponty was on the verge of bringing phenomenology toward a theory of ontology, which theory emerged in earnest in his later work, The Visible and the Invisible (1961). In that work, Merleau-Ponty expressly rejects his Phenomenology of Perception for having retained the Husserlian philosophy of consciousness. And this move from phenomenology to ontology manifests itself in some of his most provocative observations about time. To say that he moves from phenomenology to ontology is to say that he rejects any privileging of the subject or consciousness as constituting time either as a perceptual object or through a lived experience. As he puts it in the working notes of his The Visible and the Invisible, “it is indeed the past that adheres to the present and not the consciousness of the past that adheres to the consciousness of the present” (Merleau-Ponty 1961). Time now is characterized as an ontologically independent entity and not a construct disclosed by consciousness. It is the essence of time to be time that is aware of itself, to be sure. But this time is no longer an archetype of the self’s non-objectivating self-awareness. Rather, time constitutes the subject according to Merleau-Ponty, who puts to rest the phenomenological notion of absolute time-constituting consciousness, arguably Husserl’s most important discovery.
Michael R. Kelly
Last updated: August 5, 2008 | Originally published: