The Phenomenological Reduction

There is an experience in which it is possible for us to come to the world with no knowledge or preconceptions in hand; it is the experience of astonishment. The “knowing” we have in this experience stands in stark contrast to the “knowing” we have in our everyday lives, where we come to the world with theory and “knowledge” in hand, our minds already made up before we ever engage the world. However, in the experience of astonishment, our everyday “knowing,” when compared to the “knowing” that we experience in astonishment, is shown up as a pale epistemological imposter and is reduced to mere opinion by comparison.

The phenomenological reduction is at once a description and prescription of a technique that allows one to voluntarily sustain the awakening force of astonishment so that conceptual cognition can be carried throughout intentional analysis, thus bringing the “knowing” of astonishment into our everyday experience. It is by virtue of the “knowing” perspective generated by the proper performance of the phenomenological reduction that phenomenology claims to offer such a radical standpoint on the world phenomenon; indeed, it claims to offer a perspective that is so radical, it becomes the standard of rigor whereby every other perspective is judged and by which they are grounded. In what follows there will be close attention paid to correctly understanding the rigorous nature of the phenomenological reduction, the epistemological problem that spawned it, how that problem is solved by the phenomenological reduction, and the truly radical nature of the technique itself.

In other words, the phenomenological reduction is properly understood as a regimen designed to transform a philosopher into a phenomenologist by virtue of the attainment of a certain perspective on the world phenomenon. The path to the attainment of this perspective is a species of meditation, requiring rigorous, persistent effort and is no mere mental exercise. It is a species of meditation because, unlike ordinary meditation, which involves only the mind, this more radical form requires the participation of the entire individual and initially brings about a radical transformation of the individual performing it similar to a religious conversion. Husserl discovered the need for such a regimen once it became clear to him that the foundation upon which scientific inquiry rested was compromised by the very framework of science itself and the psychological assumptions of the scientist; the phenomenological reduction is the technique whereby the phenomenologist puts him or herself in a position to provide adequately rigorous grounds for scientific or any other kind of inquiry.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Historical Background of the Phenomenological Reduction
    1. Husserl’s Early Works
    2. Husserl’s Later Works
  3. The Epistemological Problem the Phenomenological Reduction Aims to Solve
  4. The Analysis That Disclosed the Need for the Reduction
    1. The Self-Refutation of the Sciences
    2. The Reduction Prefigured
  5. The Structure, Nature and Performance of the Phenomenological Reduction
    1. The Structure of the Phenomenological Reduction
      1. The Two Moments of the Phenomenological Reduction
        1. The Epoché
        2. The Reduction Proper
    2. The Nature of the Phenomenological Reduction
      1. Self-Meditation Radicalized
      2. Radical, Rigorous, and Transformative
    3. The Performance of the Phenomenological Reduction
      1. Self-Meditation
  6. How the Reduction Solves the Epistemological Problem
    1. The Problem of Constitution
    2. The Reduction and the Theme of Philosophy
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The phenomenological reduction is the meditative practice described by Edmund Husserl, the founder of phenomenology, whereby one, as a phenomenologist, is able to liberate oneself from the captivation in which one is held by all that one accepts as being the case. According to Husserl, once one is liberated from this captivation-in-an-acceptedness, one is able to view the world as a world of essences, free from any contamination that presuppositions of conceptual framework or psyche might contribute. Many have variously misunderstood the practice of the phenomenological reduction, not in the sense that what they are doing is wrong, but in the sense that they do not take what they do far enough; this article will acquaint the reader with the extent to which Husserl and Fink’s original account intended the performance of the reduction to be taken.

The procedure of the phenomenological reduction emerges in Husserl’s thought as a necessary requirement of the solution he proposed to a problem that he, himself, had raised with respect to the adequacy of the foundation upon which scientific inquiry rests. Thus, if we are ever to achieve an appropriate level of appreciation for the procedure of the phenomenological reduction, we must begin by acquainting ourselves with the role that Husserl sees it playing in his overall project of giving the sciences an adequate epistemological foundation. This problem of the foundation of scientific inquiry spans Husserl’s entire career from his early to later work; we see its beginning arguments in Logical Investigations, one of his earlier works, and we also see it playing a prominent role later in his career as it dominates one of his latest works, The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology. Accordingly, this article will take as themes for its major divisions: 1) the historical background of the phenomenological reduction, 2) Husserl’s analysis of the foundation of scientific inquiry that demonstrates a need for the phenomenological reduction, and 3) The Structure, Nature, and Performance of the Phenomenological Reduction.

The section on the historical background of the phenomenological reduction will serve to show that this procedure does not arrive as “a bolt out of the blue,” as it were; rather, it appears as the logically required solution to a specific problem. The problem that it addresses is the problem of the adequacy of the foundations of scientific inquiry. To illustrate Husserl’s misgivings with the foundations of scientific inquiry, consider the logical relationship between the axioms of geometry and its theorems and proofs. The point of doing proofs in geometry is to show that each theorem of geometry is adequately grounded in the axioms, that which is taken as being “given” in geometry. In scientific inquiry, what scientists take as being given is the natural world and the things in that world; consequently, those things and the world itself are never questioned but taken to be the logical bedrock upon which the subsequent scientific investigations are based. In other words, scientists take the world to be their axioms; and it is this axiomatic status that Husserl throws into question when he shows that the results of scientific investigation are a function of both the architectonics of scientific hypotheses and the psychological coloring of the investigating scientist. For this reason, Husserl says that if we are ever to be able to access the pure world so that it can act as a proper foundation, we must strip away both of these qualifications and return to the “things themselves” [die Sache selbst]. That is, we must return to the world as it is before it is contaminated by either the categories of scientific inquiry or the psychological assumptions of the scientist. The phenomenological reduction is the technique whereby this stripping away occurs; and the technique itself has two moments: the first Husserl names epoché, using the Greek term for abstention, and the second is referred to as the reduction proper, an inquiring back into consciousness.

2. Historical Background of the Phenomenological Reduction

a. Husserl’s Early Works

Since the main burden of this article lies in the specific area of the phenomenological reduction, it is not necessary to go into great detail regarding Husserl’s early work beyond noting that it dealt almost exclusively with mathematics and logic; and that it is the ground out of which his later thought grew. In his Philosophy of Arithmetic (1891), Husserl questions the psychological origin of basic arithmetical concepts such as unity, multiplicity, and number; a project that he pursues later into the Prolegomena to the Logical Investigations. In the former work, Husserl gives us an analysis of the origin of the authentic concept of number, i.e., number to be conceived intuitionally. It is here that Husserl pays special attention to the question of the foundation of abstraction for the basic arithmetical concepts. Thus, we find that Husserl’s early efforts at providing a subjective complement to objective logic led him to investigate the general a priori of correlation of cognition, of the sense of cognition and the object of cognition, and led him also to conceive an absolute science designed as a universal analysis of constitution in which the origins of objectivity in transcendental subjectivity are elucidated.

A crucial element of Husserl’s early work in the Philosophy of Arithmetic is his critique of psychologism; it is this critique that is continued in his Logical Investigations and which sets the stage for the emancipation of the formal-logical objects and laws from psychological determinations, as was the then-current view. However, this liberation was not Husserl’s ultimate goal, but merely the preparatory work for understanding the connection between pure logic and concrete (psychical, or rather phenomenological) processes of thinking, between ideal conditions of cognition and temporally individuated acts of thinking.

b. Husserl’s Later Works

It is owing to this goal that Husserl’s later work moves quickly away from the strictly logical and mathematical character of his early work and takes on the more transcendental character of his later work. Thus, the trend of Husserl’s thought moves from his critique of the psychologistic account of mathematical and logical objects to transcendental subjectivity by means of his persistent questioning of the foundation of knowledge. It is important to note that his questioning of the foundation of knowledge is not the same as the quest for certainty that characterizes much of modernist thought—to which some philosophers believe Husserl’s American contemporary, John Dewey in his The Quest for Certainty, presented successful objections. Rather, Husserl’s quest was not for certainty but for the founding of the conditions for the possibility of knowledge. That is, he was not searching for an answer to the question: How do we know the tree is in the quad? He was seeking an answer to the question: How does it come about that consciousness can make contact with the tree in the quad? This is what was meant above when mention was made that Husserl’s ultimate goal was to understand the connection between pure logic and concrete processes of thinking.

In his dogged pursuit of an answer to this question, Husserl is pushed from the then current psychological theory to the object; from the object back to consciousness, and finally all the way back to transcendental consciousness and the emergence of the “ultimate question of phenomenology” regarding the phenomenology of phenomenology. It is this question of the phenomenology of phenomenology that dominates the inquiry into the nature of the phenomenological reduction that we find in Sixth Cartesian Mediation and in the articles that Eugen Fink wrote around 1933 and 1934 in his attempt to further explain the phenomenological philosophy of Edmund Husserl. However, what we need is a more finely tuned elucidation of the epistemological problem that was the initial impetus driving Husserl’s early efforts.

3. The Epistemological Problem the Phenomenological Reduction Aims to Solve

The prevailing epistemology in Husserl’s time was a neo-Kantian position; indeed, it was owing to the criticism brought against phenomenology by this cadre of philosophers that Eugen Fink was constrained to publish his very important article, “The Phenomenological Philosophy of Edmund Husserl and Contemporary Criticism” in the journal, Kant-Studien; Fink uses the locution “contemporary criticism” in his title as a euphemism for “neo-Kantians.” Roughly put, the Kantian epistemological model is one that strives to ameliorate the stark contrast between the position Descartes put forward and the one brought about by the criticism of his position in the writings of Locke, Berkeley, and Hume, to name a few; that is, Kant’s position is one that seeks an irenic modulation between the rationalists and the empiricists. Kant’s epistemology, however conciliatory toward each camp, still leaned heavily on certain aspects of Descartes’ thought; notably, the distinction between consciousness and object (mind and body), albeit in Kant’s terms this distinction was taken up as a distinction between a noumenal world and a phenomenal world—a difference that Kant bridged by means of the categories. The categories themselves were arrived at by asking the question: what would have to be the case in order for our experience of the world to be as it is? This question is commonly referred to as the question determining the conditions for the possibility of experience and more specifically as the Transcendental Deduction.

Husserl’s epistemological insight is that there is no such distinction between consciousness and object, as had been assumed by Descartes and subsequently taken up in a slightly different form by Kant. In Husserl’s thought, the terms “noesis” and “noema” do not so much identify distinct items set over against each other (e.g. consciousness and object) as much as they provide a linguistic vehicle to speak about the interpenetration of each by the other as aspects of a more inclusive whole, the Life-world—understood in its broadest sense. A key point made by Fink in his article for the neo-Kantians is that when we think of the world, it is always a world already containing us thinking it; this fact is overlooked by the Kantian picture of the world; a picture which assumes a perspective that is neither consciousness nor world but which sets each over against the other. For Kant, this imagined perspective is what gives us access to the distinction between the noumenal and phenomenal worlds; ironically, it is also this perspective that makes the transcendental deduction necessary, since the distinction between noumenal and phenomenal is a state of affairs to which we do not have direct access and must, of necessity, deduce it.

Husserl constructs his epistemological position by first noticing the very obvious fact that all consciousness is consciousness of something; and it is this insight that establishes the relationship between the noesis and noema. If knowledge is ever to be established at all, it must be established in consciousness; the epistemological problem, then, for Husserl is to describe consciousness, since without consciousness, no knowledge is possible. Or, to put a more Kantian spin on it, consciousness itself is the condition for the possibility of knowledge. Furthermore, since we are always already in a world, the first task of epistemology is to properly and accurately describe what is already the case; and we can do this only if we begin with a thorough examination of consciousness itself and carry that examination all the way back to the “I” in the “I Am.” Husserl speaks of going “back” [ruckfrage] because we must begin where we are; and where we are includes a sense of self whose identity is temporarily seated in the sedimented layers of consciousness built up through our temporal experiences. Hence, if we are to encounter the “I” we must dig back down through those layers or we must continually present ourselves with the question: who is “I”? as we consider the great variety of things with which we have identified. This questioning back is the method of the phenomenological reduction and aims to lay bare the “I”—the condition for the possibility of knowledge.

It is important to keep in mind that Husserl’s phenomenology did not arise out of the questioning of an assumption in the same way that much of the history of thought has progressed; rather, it was developed, as so many discoveries are, pursuant to a particular experience, namely, the experience of the world and self that one has if one determinedly seeks to experience the “I”; and, Hume notwithstanding, such an experience is possible.

4. The Analysis That Disclosed the Need for the Reduction

Although it is generally conceded that Husserl’s thought underwent a significant transformation from his early interests in logic and mathematics, as indicated in his “On the Concept of Number” and his Philosophy of Arithmetic, to his later transcendental interests, as indicated by The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology, the actual “turning point” is not so generally accepted. This is due, in part, to the fact that Husserl’s work can be viewed developmentally both according to the chronological appearance of his work and according to its systematic connections. Thus, the “development” of his thought can be seen either in terms of his published work, i.e., chronologically, or in terms of key systematic methodological concepts. Viewed chronologically, Bernet, Kern, and Marbach (Bernet, 1989) put the beginning of the split around 1915-1917, the last years Husserl spent at Göttingen, but is only clearly seen in the early years of Husserl’s teaching at Freiburg (around 1917-1921) (p.1); but considered systematically, they say that the partition relates to the consistent extension of the research program of phenomenological philosophy towards a genetic-explanatory phenomenology as a supplement to the hitherto carried-out static-descriptive phenomenology (p.1). The terms “static,” “genetic,” and “generative” phenomenology refer to aspects of phenomenology that come into play after the reduction has been performed; however, they articulate distinctions that must be kept clearly in mind when evaluating phenomenological analyses.

In the early phases of his thinking, Husserl was concerned chiefly with the phenomenological-descriptive analysis of specific types of experiences and their correlates as well as with describing general structures of consciousness; he also aimed at the foundation and elaboration of the corresponding methodology (phenomenological reflection, reduction, and eidetics) (p.1). Similarly in the later phases of his thought, there is the attempt by means of genetic phenomenology to elucidate the concrete unification of experiencing in the personal ego and in the transcendental community of egos, or monads, as well as in the constitution of the correlative surrounding worlds and of the one world common to all (p.2).

For the purposes of tracing the development of the phenomenological reduction, I take the relevant period of the transformation of Husserl’s thought from early to late to be between 1900 and 1913; the two volumes of Logical Investigations were published in 1900 and 1901 but it wasn’t until the appearance of The Idea of Phenomenology in 1907 that many of the characteristic themes of phenomenology were explicitly articulated. This little volume was soon followed by the publication of “Philosophy as Rigorous Science” in 1911; and that by the publication of Ideas I in 1913, where the most explicit treatment, up to that time, of the main phenomenological themes is given.

a. The Self-Refutation of the Sciences

In order to grasp the full import of the move that Husserl makes to phenomenology, we must understand the arguments that motivate that move; and we get a glimpse of those arguments in his “Philosophy as Rigorous Science” published in 1911. In that article, Husserl’s chief aim is epistemological and expresses itself first as a critique of the natural sciences and psychology and then as an adumbration of a technique that later, in 1913 with the publication of Ideen I, would be termed the “epoché ” or the “reduction.”

Husserl begins his critique of the natural sciences by noting certain absurdities that become evident when such naturalism is adopted in an effort to “naturalize” consciousness and reason; these absurdities are both theoretical and practical. Husserl says that when “the formal-logical principles, the so-called ‘laws of thought,’ are interpreted by naturalism as natural laws of thinking,” there occurs a kind of “inevitable” absurdity owing to an inherent inconsistency involved in the naturalist position. His claim in this article alludes to the more fully formed argument from volume 1 of his Logical Investigations (Husserl, 1970), which will be summarized here.

The natural sciences are empirical sciences and, as such, deal only with empirical facts. Thus, when the formal-logical principles are subsumed under the “laws of Nature” as “laws of thought,” this makes the “law of thought” just one among many of the empirical laws of nature. However, Husserl notes that “the only way in which a natural law can be established and justified, is by induction from the singular facts of experience” (p.99). Furthermore, induction does not establish the holding of the law, “only the greater or lesser probability of its holding; the probability, and not the law, is justified by insight” (p.99). This means that logical laws must, without exception, rank as mere probabilities; yet, as he then notes, “nothing, however, seems plainer than that the laws of ‘pure logic’ all have a priori validity” (p.99). That is to say, the laws of ‘pure logic’ are established and justified, not by induction, but by apodictic inner evidence; insight justifies their truth itself. Thus, as Husserl remarks in “Philosophy as a Rigorous Science” (1965) that “naturalism refutes itself” (p.80). It is this theoretical absurdity that leads to a similar absurdity in practice.

The absurdity in practice, says Husserl, becomes apparent when we notice that the naturalist is “dominated by the purpose of making scientifically known whatever is genuine truth, the genuinely beautiful and good; he wants to know how to determine what is its universal essence and the method by which it is to be obtained in the particular case” (pp.80-81). Thus, the naturalist believes that through natural science and through a philosophy based on the same science the goal has been attained; but, says Husserl, the naturalist is going on presuppositions; indeed, to the extent that he theorizes at all, it is just to that extent “that he objectively sets up values to which value judgments are to correspond, and likewise in setting up any practical rules according to which each one is to be guided in his willing and in his conduct” (p.81). It is this state of affairs that drives Husserl to the observation that the naturalist is “idealist and objectivist in the way he acts”; since both of these cannot be true at the same time, the naturalist is involved in an absurdity (p.80).

Husserl claims that the natural scientist is not outwardly aware of these absurdities owing to the fact that he “naturalizes reason” and, on this account, is blinded by prejudice. He adds, “One who sees only empirical science will not be particularly disturbed by absurd consequences that cannot be proved empirically to contradict facts of nature” (pp.81-82). This is not to say that Husserl is arguing against science as such, to the contrary, he says that there is “in all modern life no more powerfully, more irresistibly progressing idea than that of science” and that “with regard to its legitimate aims, it is all-embracing. Looked upon in its ideal perfection, it would be reason itself, which could have no other authority equal or superior to itself” (p.82). The problem is that naturalism, which wanted to establish philosophy both on a basis of strict science and as a strict science, appears completely discredited along with its method. To this point in the argument, Husserl has simply shown that the foundation upon which scientific inquiry rests is self-contradictory and fails to offer adequate grounding. So, if the natural scientist cannot provide us with a “rigorous science” then what is needed and to whom can we look?

b. The Reduction Prefigured

Husserl’s idea is that the problems belonging to the domain of a “strict science,” namely, theoretical, axiological, and practical problems, give us a clue themselves as to the method required for their solution. He says, “through a clarification of the problems and through penetration into their pure sense, the methods adequate to these problems, because demanded by their very essence, must impose themselves on us” (p.83). It is for this reason that the refutation of naturalism based on its consequences that he just finished accomplishes very little for him, what is important is the principiant critique of the foundations of naturalism; and by this he means that he wants to direct a critical analysis at the philosophy that believes “it has definitely attained the rank of an exact science” (p.84). So what Husserl will be putting to the test is the relative strength of the term “exact” when it is used in this context. It is not the case that Husserl thinks that a science of nature does not produce important results; he thinks it does. The problem, as Husserl sees it, is that a science of nature is inadequate if it is not ultimately grounded in a strictly scientific philosophy. Husserl is not criticizing the results of science (the structural design and dignity of the house that science built) but only the foundation upon which those results rest.

With respect to the foundation, Husserl says that all natural science is naïve in regard to its point of departure because the nature that it investigates “is for it simply there.” In other words, the things that natural science investigates are its foundation because they mark the point of departure for natural science. These things are simply taken for granted uncritically as being there and “it is the aim of natural science to know these unquestioned data in an objectively valid, strictly scientific manner” (p.85). The same holds true for psychology in its domain of consciousness. It is the task of psychology “to explore this psychic element scientifically within the psychophysical nexus of nature, to determine it in an objectively valid way, to discover the laws according to which it develops and changes, comes into being and disappears” (p.86). Even where psychology, as an empirical science, concerns itself with determinations of bare events of consciousness and not with dependencies that are psychophysical, “those events are thought of, nevertheless, as belonging to nature, that is, as belonging to human or brute consciousnesses that for their part have an unquestioned and co-apprehended connection with human and brute organisms” (p.86). Thus, he states that “every psychological judgment involves the existential positing of physical nature, whether expressly or not” (p.86).

This uncritical acceptance is also reflected in the naïveté that characterizes natural science since at every place in its procedure it accepts nature as given and relies upon it when it performs experiments. Thus, ultimately, every method of experiential science leads back precisely to experience. But isolated experience is of no worth to science; rather, “it is in the methodical disposition and connection of experiences, in the interplay of experience and thought which has its rigid logical laws, that valid experience is distinguished from invalid, that each experience is accorded its level of validity, and that objectively valid knowledge as such, knowledge of nature, is worked out” (p.87). Although this critique of experience is satisfactory, says Husserl, as long as we remain within natural science and think according to its point of view, a completely different critique of experience is still possible and indispensable. It is a critique that places in question all experience as such as well as the sort of thinking proper to empirical science (p.87).

For Husserl, this is a critique that raises questions such as: “how can experience as consciousness give or contact an object? How can experiences be mutually legitimated or corrected by means of each other, and not merely replace each other or confirm each other subjectively? How can the play of a consciousness whose logic is empirical make objectively valid statements, valid for things that are in and for themselves? Why are the playing rules, so to speak, of consciousness not irrelevant for things?” It is by means of these questions that Husserl hopes to highlight his major concern of how it is that natural science can be comprehensible in every case, “to the extent that it pretends at every step to posit and to know a nature that is in itself—in itself in opposition to the subjective flow of consciousness” (p.88). He says that these questions become riddles as soon as reflection upon them becomes serious and that epistemology has been the traditional discipline to which these questions were referred, but epistemology has not answered the call in a manner “scientifically clear, unanimous, and decisive.”

To Husserl, this all points to the absurdity of a theory of knowledge that is based on any psychological theory of knowledge. He punctuates this claim by noting that if certain riddles are inherent, in principle, to natural science, then “it is self-evident that the solution of these riddles according to premises and conclusions in principle transcends natural science.” He adds that “to expect from natural science itself the solution of any one of the problems inherent in it as such—thus inhering through and through, from beginning to end—or even merely to suppose that it could contribute to the solution of such a problem any premises whatsoever, is to be involved in a vicious circle” (pp.88-89).

With this being the case, it becomes clear to Husserl that every scientific, as well as every pre-scientific, application of nature “must in principle remain excluded in a theory of knowledge that is to retain its univocal sense. So, too, must all expressions that imply thetic existential positings of things in the framework of space, time, causality, etc. This obviously applies also to all existential positings with regard to the empirical being of the investigator, of his psychical faculties, and the like” (p.89). It is here, in this passage, that we see the formal beginnings of what will later be termed the “epoché ” and “reduction” in Ideen I.

Husserl is advocating a theory of knowledge that will investigate the problems of the relationship between consciousness and being in a way that excludes, not only the “thetic existential positings of things in the framework of space, time, causality, etc.,” but also the “existential positings” and “psychical faculties” of the investigator. In other words, he wants to separate the subject matter he is investigating from both the theoretical framework of science and the coloring with which any investigator might qualify it. But to do so, knowledge theory can have before its eyes “only being as the correlate of consciousness: as perceived, remembered, expected, represented pictorially, imagined, identified, distinguished, believed, opined, evaluated, etc.” And for Husserl, this means that the investigation must be directed “toward a scientific essential knowledge of consciousness, toward that which consciousness itself ‘is’ according to its essence in all its distinguishable forms” (p.89). Husserl also notes that the investigation must also be directed toward “what consciousness ‘means,’ as well as toward the different ways in which—in accord with the essence of the aforementioned forms—it intends the objective, now clearly, now obscurely, now by presenting or by presentifying, now symbolically or pictorially, now simply, now mediated in thought, now in this or that mode of attention, and so in countless other forms, and how ultimately it ‘demonstrates’ the objective as that which is ‘validly,’ ‘really’” (p.89).

To summarize, what Husserl wants to do is to provide an unshakable ground for science, so as to make it “rigorous” and “exact.” He dismisses the efforts of both science and psychology to provide such a ground owing to the fact that the “riddles” inherent in each necessarily put the solution outside of their reach. He also notes that the traditional discipline of epistemology has failed to do this and suggests that what is needed is an investigation that is directed toward “a scientific essential knowledge of consciousness, toward that which consciousness itself ‘is’ according to its essence in all its distinguishable forms.” Furthermore, this can only be done if we separate the matter in question from the qualifications imposed on it by either the theoretical framework of science or the existential “positings” of the investigator. In other words, we must return to the matters in question, as they are themselves; and the procedure whereby this is accomplished is phenomenology, specifically, the phenomenological reduction.

5. The Structure, Nature and Performance of the Phenomenological Reduction

a. The Structure of the Phenomenological Reduction

i. The Two Moments of the Phenomenological Reduction

What actually occurs when one undertakes to perform the reduction can be discerned by giving careful attention to the things Husserl and Fink have said about it; but let me first address some terminological concerns regarding two key concepts. In Sixth Cartesian Meditation (Fink, 1995), Fink tells us “epoché and the action of the reduction proper are the two internal basic moments of the phenomenological reduction, mutually required and mutually conditioned” (p.41). This passage alerts us to the fact that the locution, phenomenological reduction, denotes two separate “moments,” each of which requires and conditions the other. Thus, in speaking of “the reduction” one needs to be careful to specify whether it is the reduction proper, which is only one of the two moments, that is meant, or whether one means the entire operation of the phenomenological reduction.

Let me also draw attention to the term “moments” here because, in order to get an accurate conception and understanding of the phenomenological reduction, we must see that it is not done it two “steps.” The moments are internal logical moments and do not refer to two “steps” that one might take to conclude the procedure as one might do, for example, in waxing a floor: where the first step is to strip off the old wax and the second step is to apply the new wax; steps imply a temporal individuation that is not true of the moments of the phenomenological reduction. Husserl’s term, epoché, the negative move whereby we bracket the world, is not a “step” that we do “first” in an effort to prepare ourselves for the later “step,” reduction proper; rather, the bracketing and the move whereby we drive the self back upon itself, the reduction proper, occur together.

There were many during his day who misunderstood what Husserl and Fink were trying to communicate; and I think part of what might have contributed to this misunderstanding is that Husserl’s readers thought that the reduction was a “two-step” process conducted wholly within the realm of the mind or imagination, not requiring any other kind of bodily participation.

1) The Epoché

Husserl’s insight is that we live our lives in what he terms a “captivation-in-an-acceptedness;” that is to say, we live our lives in an unquestioning sort of way by being wholly taken up in the unbroken belief-performance of our customary life in the world. We take for granted our bodies, the culture, gravity, our everyday language, logic and a myriad other facets of our existence. All of this together is present to every individual in every moment and makes up what Fink terms “human immanence”; everyone accepts it and this acceptance is what keeps us in captivity. The epoché is a procedure whereby we no longer accept it. Hence, Fink notes in Sixth Cartesian Meditation: “This self consciousness develops in that the onlooker that comes to himself in the epoché reduces ‘bracketed’ human immanence by explicit inquiry back behind the acceptednesses in self-apperception that hold regarding humanness, that is, regarding one’s belonging to the world; and thus he lays bare transcendental experiential life and the transcendental having of the world” (p.40). Husserl has referred to this variously as “bracketing” or “putting out of action” but it boils down to the same thing, we must somehow come to see ourselves as no longer of this world, where “this world” means to capture all that we currently accept.

At this point it may prove prudent to head off some possible misunderstandings with respect to the epoché. Perhaps the most frequent error made with respect to the epoché is made in regards to its role in the abstention of belief in the world. Here it is important to realize two things: the first is that withdrawal of belief in the world is not a denial of the world. It should not be considered that the abstention of belief in the world’s existence is the same as the denial of its existence; indeed, the whole point of the epoché is that it is neither an affirmation nor a denial in the existence of the world. In fact, says Fink, “the misunderstanding that takes the phenomenological epoché to be a straightforwardly thematic abstention from belief (instead of understanding it as transcendentally reflective!) not only has the consequence that we believe we have to fear the loss of the thematic field, but is also intimately connected with a misunderstanding of the reductive return to constituting consciousness” (p.43). The second thing has to do with who it is that is doing the abstaining and this directly concerns the moment of the reduction proper.

2) The Reduction Proper

The second moment of the phenomenological reduction is what Fink terms the “reduction proper;” he says, “under the concept of ‘action of reduction proper’ we can understand all the transcendental insights in which we blast open captivation-in-an-acceptedness and first recognize the acceptedness as an acceptedness in the first place” (p.41). If the epoché is the name for whatever method we use to free ourselves from the captivity of the unquestioned acceptance of the everyday world, then the reduction is the recognition of that acceptance as an acceptance. Fink adds, “abstention from belief can only be radical and universal when that which falls under disconnection by the epoché comes to be clearly seen precisely as a belief-construct, as an acceptedness.” It is the seeing of the acceptance as an acceptance that is the indication of having achieved a transcendental insight; it is transcendental precisely because it is an insight from outside the acceptedness that is holding us captive. It should be kept in mind that the “seeing” to which Fink refers is not a “knowing that” we live in captivation-in-an-acceptedness, since this can be achieved in the here and now by simply believing that Fink is telling the truth; the kind of “seeing” to which Fink refers is rather more like the kind of seeing that occurs when one discovers that the mud on the carpet was put there by oneself and not by another, as was first suspected.

Thus, as Fink points out, it is through the reductive insight into the transcendental being-sense of the world as “acceptedness” that “the radicality of the phenomenological epoché first becomes possible;” but “on the other hand, the reduction consistently performed and maintained, first gives methodic certainty to the reductive regress” (p.41). Taken together, the epoché and the reduction proper comprise the technique referred to as the phenomenological reduction; since these two moments cannot occur independently, it is easy to see how the single term, “reduction,” can come to be the term of preference to denote the whole of the phenomenological reduction.

Fink also brings out a misunderstanding relating to the reduction proper, which is that it is taken as a species of speculation: “hand in hand with this misunderstanding of the epoché goes a falsification of the sense of the action of reduction proper (the move back behind the self-objectivation of transcendental subjectivity). The latter is rejected as speculative construction, for instance when one says: in actuality the phenomenologist has no other theme than human inwardness” (p.47). To think that there is such reinterpretation or speculation is to miss the point of the reduction proper, that is, it is to miss the fact that what it does is interrogate man and the world and makes them the theme of a transcendental clarification—it is precisely the world phenomenon, or “being”, which is bracketed.

According to Fink and Husserl, the phenomenological reduction consists in these two “moments” of epoché and reduction proper; epoché is the “moment” in which we abandon the acceptedness of the world that holds us captive and the reduction proper indicates the “moment” in which we come to the transcendental insight that the acceptedness of the world is an acceptedness and not an absolute. The structure of the phenomenological reduction has belonging to it the human I standing in the natural attitude, the transcendental constituting I, and the transcendental phenomenologizing I, also called the onlooker or spectator. Fink says that “the reducing I is the phenomenological onlooker. This means he is, first, the one practicing the epoché and then the one who reduces, in the strict sense” (p.39).

Thus, it is by means of the epoché and reduction proper that the human I becomes distinguished from the constituting I; it is by abandoning our acceptance of the world that we are enabled to see it as captivating and hold it as a theme. It is from this perspective that the phenomenologist is able to see the world without the framework of science or the psychological assumptions of the individual.

b. The Nature of the Phenomenological Reduction

The phenomenological reduction is a radical, rigorous, and transformative meditative technique. To illustrate this, let me turn to comments that Fink makes in his “What Does the Phenomenology of Edmund Husserl Want to Accomplish: The Phenomenological Idea of Laying a Ground” (Fink, 1966/1972; German/English).

i. Self-Meditation Radicalized

The most important point to be made in reference to the nature of the phenomenological reduction is that it is a meditative technique and not a mere mental or imaginative technique. Furthermore, it is a self-meditation that has been radicalized. Fink introduces this in his discussion of laying a ground. He says that “the laying-of-a-ground of a philosophy is the original beginning of the philosopher himself, not with and for others but for himself alone; it is the disclosing of the ground which is capable of bearing the totality of a philosophical interpretation of the world” (p.161/11). In this passage we can plainly see that the ground of which Fink is speaking is not considered to be propositions, ideas, or anything else of that sort; rather the ground is precisely the philosopher him or herself. Thus, Fink says, “it is a fateful error to suppose that the principles, in accordance with which a ground-laying of philosophy is to proceed, would be present—transported, as it were, from the conflict of philosophers—as a normative ideal prior to and outside of philosophy” (p.161/11). Hence, regardless of “how such a ground-laying is carried out—be it as a return to the concealed, a priori law-giving of reason, or be it as a progression towards essentials, and the like—the meditation [die Besinnung], in which such a ground-laying is carried out, is always the first, fundamental decision of a philosophizing” (p.161/11).

Unless the term “meditation,” as Fink uses it in this context, springs out at one when reading it, the heart of this passage is likely to be misunderstood. Here there is a clear connection being established between some meditative practice [Besinnung] and the laying of a ground for philosophy. It is important to draw attention to this feature since we typically think of axioms or assumptions when we assay to discern the foundation of a philosophy; but Fink is making a clear break with that practice, holding instead that the first, fundamental decision of a philosophizing is “the meditation, in which a ground-laying is carried out” [“immer ist die Besinnung, in der sich eine solche Grundlegung vollzieht, die erste grundsätzliche Entscheidung eines Philosophierens.”] (p.162/11).

Fink adds to this by noting that “the commencement of the idea of laying-a-ground, which determines a philosophy, is always already the implicit (and perhaps only obscurely conscious) fore-grasp upon the system. Thus in embryonic form, the idea of the system is sketched out in the idea of laying-a-ground” (p.162/11). In other words, the idea of the ground-laying works itself out in whatever philosophy it grounds; the philosophy is itself pre-figured in the ground-laying and reflects it.

He explains this pre-figuring further by saying that, in the case of the philosophy of Husserl, the idea of the ground-laying working itself out “can, at first, be made understandable from the pathos of phenomenology, that is, from the deportment of the human existence lying at its ground” (p.162/11). Fink allows that this pathos is “in no way a specifically ‘phenomenological’ one, but is, rather, the constant pathos of every philosophy which, when taken seriously in a particular, inexorable way, must lead to phenomenology itself” (p.162/11). Indeed, this pathos is “nothing other than the world-wide storm of the passion of thinking which, extending out into the totality of entities and grasping it, subjects it to the spirit” (p.163/11). Fink is saying here that the will, as the pathos of philosophy, is “resolved to understand the world out of the spirit [die Welt aus dem Geist zu verstehen],” which does not mean the “naïve belief in a pre-given and present-at-hand ‘spiritual sense’ of the world, but solely the willingness to bring the spirit first to its realization precisely through the knowledge of the All of entities” (p.163/12).

Although this passage would seem to indicate the crassest “intellectualism,” since it seems to be saying that knowledge is the main operative process, Fink is insistent that neither the “‘rationalistically’ claimed self-certainty of the spirit” (here read Descartes), nor “the fascination with chaos” (read Nietzsche) that “all too easily is transformed into a defeatism of reason,” captures what he means. Rather, he says, “precisely in the face of chaos, standing fast against it, the philosopher ventures the spiritual conquering of the entity; he raises the claim of a radical and universal knowledge of the world” (p.164/12). If we inquire as to how it is possible that spirit can maintain itself and its claim, or whether it has itself already become a “ground experience”; whether we “Know what authentically is ‘spirit’” or what the true power of philosophizing existence is, Fink tells us: “Understanding itself in the passion of thinking, the pathos of the one who is philosophizing is cast back upon itself: it radicalizes itself into self-meditation [Selbstbesinnung], as into the way in which the spirit [der Geist] experiences itself. The phenomenological philosophy of Husserl lives in the pathos of that self-realization of the spirit [der Geist] which takes place in self-meditation” (p.164/13). Indeed, “the idea of the ground-laying of philosophy peculiar to phenomenology is the idea of the pure and persistent self meditation [der reinen und konsequenten Selbstbesinnung]” (p.164/13).

Although, as Fink notes, in the subjective mode of self-meditation, every philosophy carries out the business of laying a ground; “phenomenology is also materially grounded exclusively on self-meditation [gründet auch sachlich ausschließlich auf Selbstbesinnung]” (p.164/13). What Fink means here by using the term “exclusively” is that “from the very beginning phenomenology foregoes ever abandoning the deportment of pure self-meditation in favor of an objective deportment. It wants to be grounded solely upon the results of a radical and persistent self-meditation and to establish upon them the entirety of its philosophical system” (p. 164/13). Hence, for phenomenology, self-meditation is not a “mere subjective method for disclosing, as the ground and basis of the philosophical interpretation of the world, an objectivity sketched out in our spirit, for example, the objective essence of reason; rather it re-delineates the sole fundamental realm in which the philosophical problem of the world can arise” (p.164/13). Thus, in phenomenology “the concept of ‘ground,’ in return to which the philosophical grasping of the world realizes itself, has lost its usual ‘objective’ sense precisely through the persistent adherence to self-meditation, carried out with a certain radicalism of ‘purity,’ as the exclusive thematic source of philosophy” (p.165/13). Fink adds: “The ground, posited in the phenomenological idea of laying-a-ground, is the ‘self’ which uncovers itself only in pure self-meditation” (p.165/13-14).

The general logical form of this argument will reappear in 1954 with the publishing of The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology. There the argument is made that the sciences not only take the everyday life-world for granted, the everyday life-world is actually the ground for all that the sciences do because it is from there that they take their starting point. In a similar move of reasoning, the argument in this article is aimed at drawing attention to the obvious fact that the philosopher is always the real ground for any philosophy; and that if we wish, as it were, to ground that ground, we must embark on a procedure of self-meditation—indeed, if rigor is to be maintained, we are required to undertake such a course of action.

Of course, a number of questions immediately surround the suggestion of “self-meditation,” all of which derive from “the naïve and familiar, pre-given concept of ‘self-meditation’”; but it is precisely this concept that must be transformed, says Fink: “the dimension of philosophy can be attained only in the radical change of self-meditation from the indeterminateness of the preliminary, still unclarified concept into the determined phenomenological setting” (p.165/14). Thus, the former questions are now transformed into questions such as: How can this change be accomplished, and what must the nature of self-meditation be, such that, precisely in the thematization of the self, the question of the totality of entities is included and traced out in its fundamental solution? Fink’s response is that to this there is only one answer: “the transformation of the idea of the common self-meditation happens eo ipso in an extremely intensified taking of self-meditation seriously. The seriousness demanded here wants nothing less than to expose the spirit to a ground-experience which will bring it back into the power of the essence that is purely proper to it. In the self-meditation radicalized into the ‘phenomenological reduction,’ the spirit should accomplish a movement towards itself, should come unto itself” (p.165/14). But in what sense is this self-meditation radical?

ii. Radical, Rigorous, and Transformative

Some today have misunderstood the phenomenological reduction and it is probable that this failure to grasp what Husserl has discovered is partly owing to the radical nature of Husserl’s project being completely missed. Fink pieces together the very analysis of the reduction that is wanted here if we are ever to disabuse ourselves of the view that the reduction is nothing more than a mere incantation or formal condition—a mental exercise.

This type of misunderstanding of the nature of phenomenology is not something new; Fink himself made explicit reference to its breadth, even as late as 1934 when this article was originally published, saying: “The contemporary judgment of the phenomenological philosophy of Husserl fails, almost without exception, to recognize its true meaning” (Accomplish, p. 6). He then cites examples, noting that “Husserl is judged, admired and reproached sometimes as an eidetician and logician, at other times as a theoretician of knowledge, on the one hand, as an ontologist giving word to the ‘matters themselves,’ and, on the other hand, as an ‘Idealist.’ Thereby, every such Interpretation is capable, with moderate violence, of ‘proving’ itself from his writings. The authentic and central meaning of Edmund Husserl’s philosophy is today still unknown” (p. 6). Fink attributes this lack of authentic understanding, not to a lack of willingness to understand on the part of the community of readers, but, to the essence of phenomenology itself. So, the important question is: what is it about the essence of phenomenology that makes it so difficult for the devotee to come away with an authentic understanding of it?

According to Fink, we find the answer to this question by considering the fact that the appropriation of the true meaning of phenomenology “cannot at all come about within the horizon of our natural deportment of knowledge. Access to phenomenology demands a radical reversal of our total existence reaching into our depths, a change of every pre-scientifically-immediate comportment to world and things as well as of the disposition of our life lying at the basis of all scientific and traditionally-philosophical attitudes of knowledge” (p. 6).

Nearly everyone, who has had even a casual acquaintance with Husserl’s writings, has read something akin to this passage somewhere, claiming the radicality of what phenomenology attempts. Husserl is continually drawing our attention to the radical nature of phenomenology and how it affects all of our scientific knowledge and understanding; indeed, emphasizing how it grounds that very knowledge and understanding. The important thing to notice in regards to such passages, however, is that the misunderstanding of phenomenology arises precisely because the notions of the term “radical,” which are employed by the would-be readers as a hermeneutical guide in their efforts to come to an authentic appreciation of the practice of phenomenology, fail to capture all that Husserl intends by his use of it—and this in spite of the fact that he, time and again, tells us that his use of the term “radical” is new.

Consider, for instance, Husserl’s introduction to the Cartesian Meditations where he expounds on the need for a “radical new beginning” of philosophy saying, “to renew with greater intensity the radicalness of their spirit, the radicalness of self-responsibility, to make that radicalness true for the first time by enhancing it to the last degree…” (Cartesian Meditations, p. 6). Husserl’s emphatic demand that the radicalness become true “for the first time” indicates that his sense of “radical” is much more radical than might ordinarily be thought. Again, in Sixth Cartesian Meditation we read, “This is the problem of the proper methodological character of the phenomenological fore-knowledge that first makes it possible to pose the radical questions—in a new sense of ‘radical’—, to provide the motive for performing the phenomenological reduction” (Sixth, p. 36). Here we see an explicit mention of the fact that the term “radical” is being employed in a “new” sense.

Thus, when some of misunderstand the reduction, they, most probably, are not taking seriously Husserl’s claim of radicality, i.e., they have not understood exactly how extreme Husserl’s sense of the term is. If they, however, take a close look at Fink’s development and analysis of phenomenology in this article and by pay close attention to the intensity of the language he uses in relation to it, we can remedy this deficiency quite easily; but not without also considering the rigor required to perform the phenomenological reduction.

One important feature of the way Fink sets up his discussion of the ground and his illustration of the rigor required in the performance of the phenomenological reduction is his dramatic use of Plato’s allegory of the cave. He says, “the violence, tension and struggle of the accomplishment of philosophizing symbolized in this allegory also determines the phenomenological philosophy of Edmund Husserl” (Accomplish, p. 160/9). If there is any doubt as to how we should understand the terms “violence” and “struggle,” as he uses them in this context, Fink dispatches it immediately with the following: “The philosophical ‘unchaining,’ the tearing oneself free from the power of one’s naïve submission to the world, the stepping-forth from out of that familiarity with entities which always provides us with security, in one word, the phenomenological ‘epoché,’ is anything but a noncommittal, ‘merely’ theoretical, intellectual act; it is rather a spiritual movement of one’s self encompassing the entire man and, as an attack upon the ‘state-of-motionlessness’ supporting us in our depths, the pain of a fundamental transformation down to our roots” (p. 160-1/9). It should be clear that Fink’s use of terms such as “violence,” “struggle,” “unchaining,” “pain,” and “fundamental transformation” indicate a much more rigorous project than armchair philosophy has been wont to allow up to this point. But what is it that makes it so rigorous; what is it that we do when we perform the phenomenological reduction?

We get a preliminary description of what is required from Fink: “Our era can really attain to Husserl’s philosophy, which down to today is still unknown and ungrasped, only by ascending out of the cave of world-constraint, by passing through the pain of self-releasement—and not through ‘critiques’ that are thoroughly bound to the naïve understanding of the world, enslaved to the natural thought-habits and entangled in the pre-constituted word-meanings of the everyday and scientific language” (p. 161/10). Here, again, we find familiar language; language that might have been encountered in any number of Husserl’s other writings, but what is of interest to us in this passage is the picture of what it is we are “ascending out of.” In this regard, it is helpful to recall the phrase used in Sixth Cartesian Meditation to describe the same thing, namely, “captivation-in-an-acceptedness.” The situation Fink is describing is this: the lives that we live in our everyday world are lived in toto with that world, i.e., the world, as we understand it, is part of what makes us who we think we are; and, conversely, the world is only what it is (what we think it is) by virtue of having us in it, because when we think of the totality of the world, we must remember that it is a totality already containing us thinking it. Hence, we (the world and ourselves) hold each other mutually captive by virtue of what we accept—the acceptednesses—to be true. This reflexive containment is part of what Fink means when he says, “To know the world by returning to a ‘transcendence’ which once again contains the world within it signifies the realization of a transcendental knowledge of the world. This is the sole sense in which phenomenology is to be considered as a ‘transcendental philosophy’” (Criticism, p. 100).

With this statement we finally arrive at the core of what Fink means to communicate; the phenomenological reduction is self-meditation radicalized. On its face, his statement may seem to involve the presupposition that the self is already estranged from its own essence; however, as Fink points out, “phenomenology does not begin with a ‘presupposition’; rather, by an extreme enhancement and transformation of the natural self-meditation, it leads to the ground-experience which opens-up not only the concealed-authentic essence of the spirit, but also the authentic sense of the natural sphere from out of which self-meditation comes forth” (Accomplish, p. 166/14-15). The ground-experience, furthermore, can succeed “only when, with the most extreme sharpness and consequence, every naïve claiming of the mundane-ontological self-understanding is cut off, when the spirit is forced back upon itself to Interpret itself purely as that ‘self’ which is the bearer and accomplisher of the valuation of every natural ‘self-understanding’” (p. 169/17-18). This view is already made explicit in direct connection with the phenomenological onlooker in Fink’s discussion in Sixth Cartesian Meditation (pp. 39-40). The meditation does not bring the reducing “I” into being; the reducing “I” is disclosed once the shrouding cover of human being is removed. That is, by un-humanizing ourselves we discover the reducing “I”—the phenomenological onlooker who is the one practicing the epoché.

Now we can more clearly grasp the meaning of Fink’s statement; when he speaks of spirit being “forced back upon itself,” the “itself” is the phenomenological onlooker—spirit; and the radicalization of self-meditation is the procedure whereby we discover what Husserl earlier referred to as “I am, this life is.” This is “radicalization” precisely because it is to be done without any reference to the mundane. Let me explain, the world is familiarly and horizonally pre-given to us in its totality; furthermore, we are pre-given in it. So, the mundane-ontological self-interpretedness of the spirit is a moment in the totality of the pre-givenness of the world. Hence, if we use any element of the mundane-ontological interpretedness of the world, we have not exercised a “radical” shift. In order for the shift to be truly radical in Husserl’s sense, no element of the mundane can enter into either the motivation for self-meditation or into the ground of it—in the sense of an understanding of the essence of spirit prior to the ground-experience that brings spirit to itself. What we want to accomplish is a radical shift in which the spirit (phenomenological onlooker) is forced back upon itself to interpret itself purely as that “self” that is the bearer (as the human ego) and accomplisher (transcendental constituting ego) of the valuation of the entirety of the mundane-ontological self-interpretedness.

The radical nature of the phenomenological reduction seems to have been greatly underdetermined by some and that we can only get a truly accurate picture of what Husserl means by taking seriously his claim that, not only is the reduction radical, but it is radical in a “new” sense of that term; this “new” radicality is linked directly to self-meditation that has been radicalized—radicalized, that is, insofar as it is a self-meditation that is “forced back upon itself to Interpret itself purely as that ‘self’ which is the bearer and accomplisher of the valuation of every natural ‘self-understanding.’” One practical way to grasp what it means for the self to be “forced back upon itself to interpret itself purely as that ‘self’ which is the bearer and accomplisher of the valuation of every natural ‘self-understanding,’” is to understand this ‘self’ as the “I” in “I am.” Let us now take a closer look at exactly how this technique is performed.

c. The Performance of the Phenomenological Reduction

Husserl criticizes scientific inquiry on the grounds that it does not have a philosophically rigorous foundation. The reason it does not have a philosophically rigorous foundation is because it has failed to take into consideration the fact that both the framework of its own inquiry (that is, the assumptions of time, space, causality, etc.) and the psychological assumptions of the individual scientist act to color its findings. Since there has to be a way that consciousness can contact the objective world, then the rigorous philosophical grounding that is wanted must be disclosed in this relationship. Hence, what is needed is a way to examine consciousness as it is in itself, free from the scientific framework and psychological assumptions. This procedure is the phenomenological reduction and the term “reduction” is a term that Husserl uses to indicate a reflective inquiring back into consciousness; it is an interrogation conducted by consciousness into itself. In the idiom of our own everyday parlance, we might phrase this inquiry as an exercise in determining who the “I” is whenever we say “I AM.” Indeed, the path that we naturally follow in seeking an answer to this question leads precisely to the kind of interrogation of the self by the self that Husserl and Fink both claim to be ingredient in the performance of the reduction.

i. Self-Meditation

Phrases such as “resolved to understand the world out of the spirit,” “spiritual movement,” “religious conversion,” “fundamental transformation,” “ground experience,” “un-humanize,” and “meditation” are all leading clues as to how this technique should be understood and performed. We know that the technique is similar to the ordinary self-meditation, only radicalized; we know that it requires strenuous effort and, once completed, brings a transformation similar to a religious conversion. We also know that in the process we are “un-humanized” yet have the “entire man” encompassed. These leading clues not only direct our steps in the performance of the technique, but also give us criteria by which to judge our attempts. For instance, if we think we have performed the reduction, then we should feel as though we have experienced a religious transformation; if we do not feel that way, then chances are our technique was faulty and we did not perform it after all.

If we are to build up a picture of this technique we must begin by assuming that Husserl and Fink have an authentic discovery that they are trying to communicate and that their choice of terms to describe this experience is not careless. The title of Fink’s article gives us the framework we need to complete this task. He tells us right away that he is interested in the idea of laying a ground. Laying a ground is another way of saying that preparation is being made; indeed, the ground that is laid is preparing the way for the phenomenological philosophy of Edmund Husserl; and the ground in question is the philosopher. Fink is telling us that the philosopher is the ground for phenomenology and that the philosopher, as ground, needs preparation. What is it that prepares the philosopher to be the ground for phenomenology? It is the phenomenological reduction. The phenomenological reduction prepares the philosopher to be a phenomenologist in the same way that the experience associated with religious conversion prepares the devotee to live the religious life. Husserl says in the Crisis: “the total phenomenological attitude and the epoché belonging to it are destined in essence to effect…a complete personal transformation, comparable in the beginning to a religious conversion, which then, however, over and above this, bears within itself the significance of the greatest existential transformation which is assigned as a task to mankind as such” (p.137).

The phenomenological reduction is properly understood as a regimen designed to transform a philosopher into a phenomenologist by virtue of the attainment of a certain perspective on the world phenomenon. The path to the attainment of this perspective is a species of meditation, requiring rigorous and persistent effort. It is a species of meditation because, unlike ordinary meditation, which involves only the mind, this more radical form requires the participation of the entire individual, including, as Fink says, “the pathos of the one who is philosophizing.” However, because it is a species of meditation, one can assume the basic starting point of stilling the body, mind, and emotions while sitting in a comfortable position, having made provisions not to be disturbed. What is aimed at with these outward preparations is the goal of taking as much of the world “out of play” as possible, leaving only the meditative task to occupy one’s attention.

Once settled in this comfort, the “inquiring back” into consciousness may begin; it is the having of the self as the only object of meditation that makes this a self-meditation. Since what we are after is a self-meditation, the focus of attention is on the self and the radicalization of this meditation consists in one relentlessly pushing back and forcing the self onto itself. This can be done by repeatedly affirming, not merely saying, “I am” to oneself while trying to experience or “catch” the “I” in the present instead of remembering it. In the attempt to experience the “I” in the present, one will be forced to feel the I-ness of it; this is why Fink says the performance of the technique encompasses the “entire man” and speaks of the “pathos of the one who is philosophizing.”

In the course of this practice, one will become aware of the three “I”s: the human ego, the constituting ego, and the onlooker, or spectator. It is unlikely that much progress will be made on the first attempt; however, each try makes the return easier until there will come a day when you feel your consciousness rising (or yourself sinking) and the brightness of the world around you seems to be increasing. At that point you will know “I AM” and your perspective on the world will be the one that Husserl has promised—you will be a phenomenologist and will never be the same again. Indeed, Fink says that “the phenomenological ‘epoché,’ is anything but a noncommittal, ‘merely’ theoretical, intellectual act; it is rather a spiritual [geistig] movement of one’s self encompassing the entire man and, as an attack upon the ‘state-of-motionlessness’ supporting us in our depths, the pain of a fundamental transformation down to our roots” (Accomplish, p. 9). Adding that in the epoché “the transcendental tendency that awakens in man and drives him to inhibit all acceptednesses nullifies man himself; man un-humanizes [entmenscht] himself” (Sixth, 40). It should be clear from these passages that whatever is involved in the epoché, it is certainly no mere mental exercise; and if we take Fink and Husserl at their word, it is a “spiritual movement of one’s self encompassing the entire man,” which would indicate a far more radical effort than seems indicated by some who treat the phenomenological reduction as something no more strenuous than exercising the imagination or reciting an incantation.

6. How the Reduction Solves the Epistemological Problem

a. The Problem of Constitution

I have already noted that in his Philosophy of Arithmetic Husserl found serious fault with psychologism in his efforts to emancipate ideal objects from psychology and demonstrate their independence. With this critique, however, came the following question: How do the ideal objects come to be given? This is simply the question concerning the correlation of subject and object noted above with respect to the tree and the quad. In his “The Decisive Phases in the Development of Husserl’s Philosophy,” Walter Biemel addresses this very concern and brings his considerable familiarity with Husserl’s works to bear upon it. He offers the following quotation from the Nachlass (F I 36, B1.19a f.) for consideration: “When it is made evident that ideal objects, despite the fact that they are formed in consciousness, have their own being in themselves, there still remains an enormous task which has never been seriously viewed or taken up, namely, the task of making this unique correlation between the ideal objects which belong to the sphere of pure logic and the subjective psychical experience conceived as a formative activity a theme for investigation. When a psychical subject such as I, this thinking being, performs certain (and surely not arbitrary but quite specifically structured) psychical activities in my own psychical life, then a successive formation and production of meaning is enacted according to which the number-form in question, the truth in question, or the conclusion and proof in question…emerges as the successively developing product.”

Biemel uses this quotation to make the point that in it Husserl expresses his real concern and the real theme of his phenomenology; Biemel draws our attention to the parenthetical phrase concerning psychical activities, namely, “(and surely not arbitrary but quite specifically structured),” to make the point that “the subject cannot arbitrarily constitute (and surely the issue here is that of constitution) any meaning whatsoever; rather are the constitutive acts dependent upon the essence of the objects in question.” In other words, if we are to consider the essence of the number three, for example, it is not the case that the essence of that number, contra psychologism, is dependent upon what psychical activities are required in order to form the number; rather, in order to understand the meaning of the number three, “we must perform determinate acts of collective connecting, otherwise the meaning of 3 in general will remain entirely closed to us. There is something like the number three for us when we can perform the collecting-unifying activity in which three become capable of being presented.” This does not mean that the essence of the number three would be arbitrarily determined by this activity so that the number would in each case change according to the manner in which one constitutes it. “Either I perform the acts which disclose the essence of the number three, with the result that for me there is something like three, or I do not perform them and then there is no 3 except for those who have performed this activity.” This “collecting-unifying activity” is the activity of constitution.

Biemel reminds us that the problem of constitution is the source of many a misunderstanding and adds, “the ordinary use of ‘constitution’ equates it with any kind of production, but ‘constitution’ in the strong sense is more of a ‘restitution’ than a constitution insofar as the subject ‘restores’ what is already there, but this, however, requires the performance of certain activities.” Citing a letter from Husserl to Hocking dated January 25, 1903, Biemel drives his point home: “Regarding the meaning of the concept of constitution employed in the Logical Investigations Husserl states: ‘The recurring expression that ‘objects are constituted’ in an act always signifies the property of an act which makes the object present (vorstellig): not ‘constitution’ in the usual sense.’” Hence, the best way to discuss the concept of constitution, says Biemel, is to discuss it as the-becoming-present-of-an-object; and the acts which make this becoming-present possible, which set it in motion, are the constituting acts. Or, as Husserl would put it in his Formal and Transcendental Logic, “This manner of givenness—givenness as something coming from such original activity—is nothing other than the way of their being ‘perceived’ which uniquely belongs to them.

This problem of constitution first appears in the Logical Investigations and continues to be one of the basic problems of phenomenology; however, the interest in it here is that constitution figures prominently in the resolution of the epistemological problem.

b. The Reduction and the Theme of Philosophy

In his “The Problem of the Phenomenology of Edmund Husserl,” Fink allows that access to the fundamental problem of Husserl’s phenomenology is uncertain owing to the fact that the fundamental problem of any philosophy is often not identical with the particular questions with which its literature begins. Indeed, the fundamental problem may often even await a proper formulation; one that can emerge only after the philosopher’s later stages of the development of his or her own thought are reworked. And although Husserl’s thought started with the sense-formation of mathematics and logic, these interests do not comprise what Fink terms the genuine problem or theme of phenomenology.

This very zigzag process of moving back and forth from one stage to the whole and back again within which the formulation of the genuine problem occurs discloses a distinction between two types of knowing. The first type is one in which we are engaged in a developmental process that will answer certain formulatable questions; that is, it is an expecting-to-know that is characterized chiefly by the fact that it advances an already established body of knowledge—in short, it is a knowing about knowledge that is lacking. For instance, in archaeology we might plan digs in areas surrounding certain cities expecting to add to our stock of knowledge about the ancient life in that setting in order to fill in known gaps in our accounts. This is knowledge of what is lacking.

This type of knowing is not, however, the type of knowing that emerges in the zigzag process to which I just referred. The type of knowing prevalent in the zigzag process is one in which what is obvious becomes questionable; not in the sense of creating arbitrary doubts or from the mere mistrust of the human mind; rather, questionable because, as Fink says, “philosophy is an experience that man has of himself and the existent;” and it is owing to this that the origin of philosophical problems is wonder. This means that “problem” in the philosophical sense is not an expecting-to-know on the basis of a path to knowledge but rather the formation of an expecting-to-know. Philosophy is, therefore, the shaking of the ground which bears human familiarity with the existent; it is the shaking of the basis which forms the presupposition for the progressive augmentation of knowledge, i.e., the shaking of the basis of expecting-to-know of the first type. It is the very unsettling of the foundations of knowledge and the questioning of the existent qua existent as well as the questioning of the nature of truth.

The astonishment in question is just the very experience that man has of himself and the existent that is the foundation needed for epistemology; because it is in this wonder that the “unsettling idea of a genuine mode of knowing the existent suddenly emerges from beneath the ordered, familiar world in which we are at home and about which we have fixed meanings concerning things, man and God, meanings which make certainty in life possible.” It is a “genuine mode” precisely because it is not already decided what the nature of the existent and the nature of truth are; after all, it cannot be original if the original formation of the ideas of “existent” and “truth” has already occurred; whether it is decided through a lengthy effort belonging to the past of human spirit or through the inconspicuous obviousness of the natural world-view. In other words, the only “knowing” that is original is the “knowing” that properly belongs to astonishment; because it is only in astonishment that man experiences the complete collapse of his traditional knowledge and pre-acquaintance with the world and with things; a collapse that is due entirely to a new confronting of the existent and a new projection of the senses of “being” and “truth.” We should be sensitive to Fink’s use of the term “original” here because the way he uses it in this passage heralds the sense of “founding” invoked in the way phenomenology provides a ground for epistemology.

Fink has told us that the astonishment in which philosophy begins is in no way “merely a ‘disposition,’ a feeling.” Rather, “it is the fundamental disposition of pure thought; it is original theory.” What Fink means to communicate with this is that in astonishment a change and transformation of knowing occurs such that what we already know is reduced to mere opinion and that even the very nature of knowing is altered. In other words, Fink marks a distinction between the “knowing” that stands in need of a foundation and the “knowing” that does the founding. The knowing that does the founding is the original knowing of astonishment; it is original precisely because it does not come to the existent and truth with conceptions in hand, having already decided their nature; and the door to sustained astonishment is opened by the rigorous performance of the phenomenological reduction.

It should not be inferred from this passage that there is anything whimsical about the way astonishment proclaims the existent; as though, for example, that being and truth are presented as mere conventions. Rather, what is wanted is the ability to, as Fink says, sustain and develop astonishment “by the awakening force of conceptual cognition” because it is the extent of the creative force of wonder that ultimately determines the rank and achievement of a philosophy. It is precisely this burden that is borne by the phenomenological reduction, which aims at voluntarily awakening the force of conceptual cognition and sustaining it throughout intentional analysis. Thus, it is borne out as was noted above that philosophy does not begin with an assumption but an experience; namely, the experience of having performed the phenomenological reduction. This experience is the astonishment in which original knowing occurs; and it is upon original knowing that the “knowing” of the existent, or epistemology, is grounded.

This relation, in which a physical experience is the condition for the possibility of thought, is not new to philosophy; logical analysis crucially depends upon one having the ability (experience) to be aware of logical connections; absent this ability, as Wittgenstein has also noticed, there is nothing we can do to atone for it in the individual—the individual either sees the logical connections or does not. It is the experience of being aware of, and noticing, logical connections that really grounds logical analysis. So, too, with the phenomenological reduction; without the experience of astonishment granted by having successfully performed the phenomenological reduction, no epistemology can be truly grounded because every epistemological claim must sometime trace itself back to the original knowledge; and the original knowledge can be had only in astonishment, the very fruit of accurately performing the phenomenological reduction. In other words, the ground for epistemology is, in the final analysis, the philosopher’s own astonishment; if this astonishment is voluntarily taken up and sustained, as in the performance of the phenomenological reduction, then the report of what is disclosed in that experience can be entered into the stock of human knowledge as an epistemological datum. And, in the same way that the validity of any logical argument is verified by each individual at every step by seeing for him or herself whether each step follows logically from the previous step by invoking one’s own ability to recognize logical connections, every epistemological datum must be similarly verified by the phenomenologist returning to astonishment through the phenomenological reduction and comparing the results achieved with those at hand. What is needed to assure consistent results and the scientific rigor Husserl said properly belonged to phenomenology is a more careful adherence to the rigorous conditions of performing the phenomenological reduction by phenomenologists so that it does not deteriorate into the psychologistic practice of free association or mere mental exercise; it is, after all, a rigorous meditative exercise requiring the struggle of the whole person.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Berger, Gaston. The Cogito in Husserl's Philosophy. Translated by Kathleen McLaughlin. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1972.
  • Bernet, Rudolf. “Phenomenological Reduction and the Double Life of the Subject.” In Reading Heidegger from the Start: Essays in His Earliest Thought, eds. Theodore Kisiel and John van Buren, Albany: SUNY Press, 1994.
  • Bernet, Rudolf, Iso Kern, and Eduard Marbach. An Introduction to Husserlian Phenomenology. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1993.
  • Biemel, Walter. “Les Phases decisive dans le development de la philosophie de Husserl.” In Husserl: Cahiers de Royaumont, no III. Paris: Minuit, 1959.
  • Bochiniski, I.M. Contemporary European Philosophy. Translated by Donald Nicholl and Karl Aschenbrenner. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1966.
  • Boehm, Rudolf. “Basic Reflections on Husserl’s Phenomenological Reduction.” International Philosophical Quarterly 5 (1965): 183-202.
  • Boehm, Rudolf. “Les Ambiguités des Concepts Husserliens d’‘immanence’ et de ‘transcendence.’” Revue Philosophique de la France et de l’Etranger 149 (1959): 481-526.
  • Boehm, Rudolf. Vom Gesichtspunkt der Phänomenologie. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1968.
  • Boehm, Rudolf. Vom Gesichtspunkt der Phänomenologie II. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1981.
  • Bruzina, Ronald. “Construction in Phenomenology.” In The Reach of Reflection: Issues for Phenomenology’s Second Century, eds. Steven Crowell, Lester Embree, and Samuel J. Julian (Electron Press, October 2001), 46-71.
  • Bruzina, Ronald. Edmund Husserl and Eugen Fink: Beginnings and Ends in Phenomenology 1928-1938. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2004.
  • Carr, David. “The ‘Fifth Meditation’ and Husserl’s Cartesianism.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. 34:14-35, 1973.
  • Carr, David. The Paradox of Subjectivity: The Self in the Transcendental Tradition. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999.
  • Depraz, Natalie, and Marc Richir, eds. Eugen Fink: Actes Du Colloque de Cerisy-la-Salle 23-30 Juillet 1994. Atlanta: Rodopi, 1997.
  • Elveton, R. O., ed. The Phenomenology of Husserl: Selected Readings. Chicago:Quadrangle Books, 1970.
  • Farber, Marvin. The Aims of Phenomenology: The Motives, Methods, and Impact of Husserl's Thought. New York: Harper Torchbooks, 1966.
  • Farber, Marvin. The Foundation of Phenomenology: Edmund Husserl and the Quest for a Rigorous Science of Philosophy. Albany: SUNY Press, 1943.
  • Fink, Eugen. “L’Analyse intentionnelle et le probleme de la pensee speculative.” In Problemes actuels de la phenomenologie, 54-87. Brussels: Desclee de Brower, 1952.
  • Fink, Eugen. “The Phenomenological Philosophy of Edmund Husserl and Contemporary Criticism.” In The Phenomenology of Husserl, 73-147. Chicago: Quadrangle Books, 1970.
  • Fink, Eugen. Sixth Cartesian Meditation: The Idea of a Transcendental Theory of Method. Translated by Ronald Bruzina. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1995.
  • Fink, Eugen . “Was Will Die Phänomenologie Edmund Husserls,” in Studien zur Phänomenologie 1930-1939 (Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1966).
  • Fink, Eugen. “What Does the Phenomenology of Edmund Husserl Want to Accomplish?” Translated by Arthur Grugan. Research in Phenomenology 2, (1972): 5-27.
  • Hopkins, Burt C. “Husserl’s Account of Phenomenological Reflection and Four Paradoxes of Reflexivity.” Research in Phenomenology 19, (1989): 180-194.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Analyses Concerning Passive and Active Synthesis: Lectures on Transcendental Logic. Translated by Anthony J. Steinbock. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2001.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Cartesian Meditations. Translated by Dorion Cairns. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1977.
  • Husserl, Edmund. The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology. Translated by David Carr. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1970.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Husserliana Vol. VIII. Erste Philosophie (1923/24), II. Edited by Rudolf Boehm. Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1959.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Experience and Judgment. Translated by James S. Churchill and Karl Ameriks. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1973.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Formal and Transcendental Logic. Translated by Dorion Cairns. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1969.
  • Husserl, Edmund. The Idea of Phenomenology. Translated by William P. Alston and George Nakhnikian. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1973.
  • Husserl, Edmund. The Idea of Phenomenology. Translated by Lee Hardy. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1999.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy: First Book. Translated by F. Kersten. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1998.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy: Second Book. Translated by R. Rojcewicz and A. Schuwer. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1989.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Ideas: General Introduction to Pure Phenomenology. Translated by W. F. Boyce Gibson. New York: Collier Books, 1962.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Logical Investigations. Translated by J. N. Findlay. 2Vols. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1970.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Phenomenology and the Crisis of Philosophy. Translated by Quentin Lauer. New York: Harper Torchbooks, 1965.
  • Husserl, Edmund. The Phenomenology of Internal Time-consciousness. Translated by James S. Churchill. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1964.
  • Kearney, Richard and Mara Rainwater, eds. The Continental Philosophy Reader. London: Routledge, 1998.
  • Kersten, Fred. “Notes From Underground: Merleau-Ponty and Husserl’s Sixth Cartesian Meditation.” In The Prism of the Self, ed. Steven Crowell. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, no date.
  • Kockelmans, Joseph J, ed. Phenomenology: The Philosophy of Edmund Husserl and Its Interpretation. Garden City, New York: Doubleday, 1967.
  • Lauer, Quentin. Phenomenology: Its Genesis and Prospect. New York: Harper Torchbooks, 1965.
  • Lawlor, Leonard. Derrida and Husserl: The Basic Problem of Phenomenology. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2002.
  • McKenna, William, Robert M. Harlan and Laurence E. Winters, eds. Apriori and World: European Contributions to Husserlian Phenomenology. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1981.
  • Natanson, Maurice. Edmund Husserl: Philosopher of Infinite Tasks. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1973.
  • Ricoeur, Paul. “Husserl’s Fifth Cartesian Meditation.” In Husserl: An Analysis of His Phenomenology. Translated by Edward G. Ballard and Lester Embree. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1967.
  • Ricoeur, Paul. “A Study of Husserl's Cartesian Meditations I-IV.” In Husserl An Analysis of His Phenomenology. Translated by Edward G. Ballard and Lester Embree. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1967.
  • Sokolowski, Robert. Husserlian Meditations. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1974.
  • Souche-Daques, S. “La Lecture Husserlienne de Sein und Zeit.” Philosophie 21 (1989): 7-36.
  • Stapleton, Timothy J. “The ‘Logic’ of Husserl’s Transcendental Reduction.” Man and World 15 (1982): 369-382.
  • Welton, Donn, ed. The Essential Husserl: Basic Writings in Transcendental Phenomenology. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1999.
  • Welton, Donn, ed. The New Husserl: A Critical Reader. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2003.
  • Zahavi, Dan. Husserl and Transcendental Intersubjectivity. Translated by Elizabeth A. Behnke. Athens, Ohio: Ohio University Press, 2001.
  • Zahavi, Dan. Husserl’s Phenomenology. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2003.

Author Information

John Cogan
Email: jmcogan@siu.edu
St. Petersburg College