In its central use “phenomenology” names a movement in twentieth century philosophy. A second use of “phenomenology” common in contemporary philosophy names a property of some mental states, the property they have if and only if there is something it is like to be in them. Thus, it is sometimes said that emotional states have a phenomenology while belief states do not. For example, while there is something it is like to be angry, there is nothing it is like to believe that Paris is in France. Although the two uses of “phenomenology” are related, it is the first which is the current topic. Accordingly, “phenomenological” refers to a way of doing philosophy that is more or less closely related to the corresponding movement. Phenomenology utilizes a distinctive method to study the structural features of experience and of things as experienced. It is primarily a descriptive discipline and is undertaken in a way that is largely independent of scientific, including causal, explanations and accounts of the nature of experience. Topics discussed within the phenomenological tradition include the nature of intentionality, perception, time-consciousness, self-consciousness, awareness of the body and consciousness of others. Phenomenology is to be distinguished from phenomenalism, a position in epistemology which implies that all statements about physical objects are synonymous with statements about persons having certain sensations or sense-data. George Berkeley was a phenomenalist but not a phenomenologist.
Although elements of the twentieth century phenomenological movement can be found in earlier philosophers—such as David Hume, Immanuel Kant and Franz Brentano—phenomenology as a philosophical movement really began with the work of Edmund Husserl. Following Husserl, phenomenology was adapted, broadened and extended by, amongst others, Martin Heidegger, Jean-Paul Sartre, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Emmanuel Levinas and Jacques Derrida. Phenomenology has, at one time or another, been aligned with Kantian and post-Kantian transcendental philosophy, existentialism and the philosophy of mind and psychology.
This article introduces some of the central aspects of the phenomenological method and also concrete phenomenological analyses of some of the topics that have greatly exercised phenomenologists.
The work often considered to constitute the birth of phenomenology is Husserl’s Logical Investigations (Husserl 2001). It contains Husserl’s celebrated attack on psychologism, the view that logic can be reduced to psychology; an account of phenomenology as the descriptive study of the structural features of the varieties of experience; and a number of concrete phenomenological analyses, including those of meaning, part-whole relations and intentionality.
Logical Investigations seemed to pursue its agenda against a backdrop of metaphysical realism. In Ideas I (Husserl 1982), however, Husserl presented phenomenology as a form of transcendental idealism. This apparent move was greeted with hostility from some early admirers of Logical Investigations, such as Adolph Reinach. However, Husserl later claimed that he had always intended to be a transcendental idealist. In Ideas I Husserl offered a more nuanced account of the intentionality of consciousness, of the distinction between fact and essence and of the phenomenological as opposed to the natural attitude.
Heidegger was an assistant to Husserl who took phenomenology in a rather new direction. He married Husserl’s concern for legitimating concepts through phenomenological description with an overriding interest in the question of the meaning of being, referring to his own phenomenological investigations as “fundamental ontology.” His Being and Time (Heidegger 1962) is one of the most influential texts on the development of European philosophy in the Twentieth Century. Relations between Husserl and Heidegger became strained, partly due to the divisive issue of National Socialism, but also due to significant philosophical differences. Thus, unlike his early works, Heidegger’s later philosophy bears little relation to classical Husserlian phenomenology.
Although he published relatively little in his lifetime, Husserl was a prolific writer leaving a large number of manuscripts. Alongside Heidegger’s interpretation of phenomenology, this unpublished work had a decisive influence on the development of French existentialist phenomenology. Taking its lead from Heidegger’s account of authentic existence, Sartre’s Being and Nothingness (Sartre 1969) developed a phenomenological account of consciousness, freedom and concrete human relations that perhaps defines the term “existentialism.” Merleau-Ponty’s Phenomenology of Perception (Merleau-Ponty 1962) is distinctive both in the central role it accords to the body and in the attention paid to the relations between phenomenology and empirical psychology.
Although none of the philosophers mentioned above can be thought of straightforwardly as classical Husserlian phenomenologists, in each case Husserl sets the phenomenological agenda. This remains the case, with a great deal of the contemporary interest in both phenomenological methodology and phenomenological topics drawing inspiration from Husserl’s work. Accordingly, Husserl’s views are the touchstone in the following discussion of the topics, methods and significance of phenomenology.
Husserlian phenomenology is a discipline to be undertaken according to a strict method. This method incorporates both the phenomenological and eidetic reductions.
Phenomenology is, as the word suggests, the science of phenomena. But this just raises the questions: “What are phenomena?” and “In what sense is phenomenology a science?”.
In answering the first question, it is useful to briefly turn to Kant. Kant endorsed “transcendental idealism,” distinguishing between phenomena (things as they appear) and noumena (things as they are in themselves), claiming that we can only know about the former (Kant 1929, A30/B45). On one reading of Kant, appearances are in the mind, mental states of subjects. On another reading, appearances are things as they appear, worldly objects considered in a certain way.
Both of these understandings of the nature of phenomena can be found in the phenomenological literature. However, the most common view is that all of the major phenomenologists construe phenomena in the latter way: phenomena are things as they appear. They are not mental states but worldly things considered in a certain way. The Phenomenologists tend, however, to reject Kantian noumena. Also, importantly, it is not to be assumed that the relevant notion of appearing is limited to sensory experience. Experience (or intuition) can indeed be sensory but can, at least by Husserl’s lights, be understood to encompass a much broader range of phenomena (Husserl 2001, sec. 52). Thus, for example, although not objects of sensory experience, phenomenology can offer an account of how the number series is given to intuition.
Phenomenology, then, is the study of things as they appear (phenomena). It is also often said to be descriptive rather than explanatory: a central task of phenomenology is to provide a clear, undistorted description of the ways things appear (Husserl 1982, sec. 75). This can be distinguished from the project of giving, for example, causal or evolutionary explanations, which would be the job of the natural sciences.
In ordinary waking experience we take it for granted that the world around us exists independently of both us and our consciousness of it. This might be put by saying that we share an implicit belief in the independent existence of the world, and that this belief permeates and informs our everyday experience. Husserl refers to this positing of the world and entities within it as things which transcend our experience of them as “the natural attitude” (Husserl 1982, sec. 30). In The Idea of Phenomenology, Husserl introduces what he there refers to as “the epistemological reduction,” according to which we are asked to supply this positing of a transcendent world with “an index of indifference” (Husserl 1999, 30). In Ideas I, this becomes the “phenomenological epoché,” according to which, “We put out of action the general positing which belongs to the essence of the natural attitude; we parenthesize everything which that positing encompasses with respect to being” (Husserl 1982, sec. 32). This means that all judgements that posit the independent existence of the world or worldly entities, and all judgements that presuppose such judgements, are to be bracketed and no use is to be made of them in the course of engaging in phenomenological analysis. Importantly, Husserl claims that all of the empirical sciences posit the independent existence of the world, and so the claims of the sciences must be “put out of play” with no use being made of them by the phenomenologist.
This epoché is the most important part of the phenomenological reduction, the purpose of which is to open us up to the world of phenomena, how it is that the world and the entities within it are given. The reduction, then, is that which reveals to us the primary subject matter of phenomenology—the world as given and the givenness of the world; both objects and acts of consciousness.
There are a number of motivations for the view that phenomenology must operate within the confines of the phenomenological reduction. One is epistemological modesty. The subject matter of phenomenology is not held hostage to skepticism about the reality of the “external” world. Another is that the reduction allows the phenomenologist to offer a phenomenological analysis of the natural attitude itself. This is especially important if, as Husserl claims, the natural attitude is one of the presuppositions of scientific enquiry. Finally, there is the question of the purity of phenomenological description. It is possible that the implicit belief in the independent existence of the world will affect what we are likely to accept as an accurate description of the ways in which worldly things are given in experience. We may find ourselves describing things as “we know they must be” rather than how they are actually given.
The reduction, in part, enables the phenomenologist to go “back to the ‘things themselves’”(Husserl 2001, 168), meaning back to the ways that things are actually given in experience. Indeed, it is precisely here, in the realm of phenomena, that Husserl believes we will find that indubitable evidence that will ultimately serve as the foundation for every scientific discipline. As such, it is vital that we are able to look beyond the prejudices of common sense realism, and accept things as actually given. It is in this context that Husserl presents his Principle of All Principles which states that, “every originary presentive intuition is a legitimizing source of cognition, that everything originally (so to speak, in its ‘personal’ actuality) offered to us in ‘intuition’ is to be accepted simply as what it is presented as being, but also only within the limits in which it is presented there” (Husserl 1982, sec. 24).
The results of phenomenology are not intended to be a collection of particular facts about consciousness, but are rather supposed to be facts about the essential natures of phenomena and their modes of givenness. Phenomenologists do not merely aspire to offer accounts of what their own experiences of, say, material objects are like, but rather accounts of the essential features of material object perception as such. But how is this aspiration to be realized given that the method of phenomenology is descriptive, consisting in the careful description of experience? Doesn’t this, necessarily, limit phenomenological results to facts about particular indviduals’ experience, excluding the possibility of phenomenologically grounded general facts about experience as such?
The Husserlian answer to this difficulty is that the phenomenologist must perform a second reduction called “eidetic” reduction (because it involves a kind of vivid, imagistic intuition). The purpose of the eidetic reduction in Husserl’s writings is to bracket any considerations concerning the contingent and accidental, and concentrate on (intuit) the essential natures or essences of the objects and acts of consciousness (Husserl 1982, sec. 2). This intuition of essences proceeds via what Husserl calls “free variation in imagination.” We imagine variations on an object and ask, “What holds up amid such free variations of an original […] as the invariant, the necessary, universal form, the essential form, without which something of that kind […] would be altogether inconceivable?” (Husserl 1977, sec. 9a). We will eventually come up against something that cannot be varied without destroying that object as an instance of its kind. The implicit claim here is that if it is inconceivable that an object of kind K might lack feature F, then F is a part of the essence of K.
Eidetic intuition is, in short, an a priori method of gaining knowledge of necessities. However, the result of the eidetic reduction is not just that we come to knowledge of essences, but that we come to intuitive knowledge of essences. Essences show themselves to us (Wesensschau), although not to sensory intuition, but to categorial or eidetic intuition (Husserl 2001, 292-4). It might be argued that Husserl’s methods here are not so different from the standard methods of conceptual analysis: imaginative thought experiments (Zahavi 2003, 38-39).
It is widely accepted that few of the most significant post-Husserlian phenomenologists accepted Husserl’s prescribed methodology in full. Although there are numerous important differences between the later phenomenologists, the influence of Heidegger runs deep.
On the nature of phenomena, Heidegger remarks that “the term ‘phenomenon’…signifies ‘to show itself’” (Heidegger 1962, sec. 7). Phenomena are things that show themselves and the phenomenologist describes them as they show themselves. So, at least on this score there would appear to be some affinity between Husserl and Heidegger. However, this is somewhat controversial, with some interpreters understanding Husserlian phenomena not as things as given, but as states of the experiencing subject (Carman 2006).
It is commonly held that Heidegger reject’s the epoché: “Heidegger came to the conclusion that any bracketing of the factual world in phenomenology must be a crucial mistake” (Frede 2006, 56). What Heidegger says in his early work, however, is that, for him, the phenomenological reduction has a different sense than it does for Husserl:
For Husserl, phenomenological reduction… is the method of leading phenomenological vision from the natural attitude of the human being whose life is involved in the world of things and persons back to the transcendental life of consciousness…. For us phenomenological reduction means leading phenomenological vision back from the apprehension of a being…to the understanding of the being of this being.
(Heidegger 1982, 21)
Certainly, Heidegger thinks of the reduction as revealing something different—the Being of beings. But this is not yet to say that his philosophy does not engage in bracketing,for we can distinguish between the reduction itself and its claimed consequences. There is, however, some reason to think that Heidegger’s position is incompatible with Husserl’s account of the phenomenological reduction. For, on Husserl’s account, the reduction is to be applied to the “general positing” of the natural attitude, that is to a belief. But, according to Heidegger and those phenomenologists influenced by him (including both Sartre and Merleau-Ponty), our most fundamental relation to the world is not cognitive but practical (Heidegger 1962, sec. 15).
Heidegger’s positive account of the methods of phenomenology is explicit in its ontological agenda. A single question dominates the whole of Heidegger’s philosophy: What is the meaning of being? To understand this, we can distinguish between beings (entities) and Being. Heidegger calls this “the ontological difference.” According to Heidegger, “ontology is the science of Being. But Being is always the being of a being. Being is essentially different from a being, from beings…We call it the ontological difference—the differentiation between Being and beings” (Heidegger 1982, 17). Tables, chairs, people, theories, numbers and universals are all beings. But they all have being, they all are. An understanding at the level of beings is “ontical,” an understanding at the level of being is “ontological”. Every being has being, but what does it mean to say of some being that it is? Might it be that what it means to say that something is differs depending on what sort of thing we are talking about? Do tables, people, numbers have being in the same way? Is there such a thing as the meaning of being in general? The task is, for each sort of being, to give an account of the structural features of its way of Being, “Philosophy is the theoretical conceptual interpretation of being, of being’s structure and its possibilities” (Heidegger 1982, 11).
According to Heidegger, we have a “pre-ontological” understanding of being: “We are able to grasp beings as such, as beings, only if we understand something like being. If we did not understand, even though at first roughly and without conceptual comprehension, what actuality signifies, then the actual would remain hidden from us…We must understand being so that we may be able to be given over to a world that is” (Heidegger 1982, 10-11). Our understanding of being is manifested in our “comportment towards beings” (Heidegger 1982, 16). Comportment is activity, action or behaviour. Thus, the understanding that we have of the Being of beings can be manifested in our acting with them. One’s understanding of the being of toothbrushes, for example, is manifested in one’s capacity for utilizing toothbrushes. Understanding need not be explicit, nor able to be articulated conceptually. It is often embodied in “know-how.” This is the sense, on Heidegger’s account, that our most fundamental relation to the world is practical rather than cognitive. It is this that poses a challenge to the phenomenological reduction.
Heidegger’s relation to the eidetic reduction is complex. The purpose of the eidetic reduction in Husserl’s writings is to bracket any considerations concerning the contingent and accidental, and concentrate on (intuit) the essential natures of the objects and acts of consciousness. Heidegger’s concentration on the meaning of the Being of entities appears similar in aim. However, insofar as the Being of entities relies on the notion of essence, Heidegger’s project calls it into question. The idea that there are different “ways of being” looks as though it does not abide by the traditional distinction between existence and essence. So, on Heidegger’s account, what it takes for something to have being is different for different sorts of thing.
How is it that subjective mental processes (perceptions, thoughts, etc.) are able to reach beyond the subject and open us up to an objective world of both worldly entities and meanings? This question is one that occupied Husserl perhaps more than any other, and his account of the intentionality of consciousness is central to his attempted answer.
Intentionality is one of the central concepts of Phenomenology from Husserl onwards. As a first approximation, intentionality is aboutness or directedness as exemplified by mental states. For example, the belief that The Smiths were from Manchester is about both Manchester and The Smiths. One can also hope, desire, fear, remember, etc. that the Smiths were from Manchester.
Intentionality is, say many, the way that subjects are “in touch with” the world. Two points of terminology are worth noting. First, in contemporary non-phenomenological debates, “intentional” and its cognates is often used interchangeably with “representational” and its cognates. Second, although they are related, “intentionality” (with a “t”) is not to be confused with “intensionality” (with an “s”). The former refers to aboutness (which is the current topic), the latter refers to failure of truth-preservation after substitution of co-referring terms.
Franz Brentano, Husserl’s one time teacher, is the origin of the contemporary debate about intentionality. He famously, and influentially claimed:
Every mental phenomenon is characterised by what the Scholastics of the Middle Ages called the intentional (or mental) inexistence of an object, and what we might call, though not wholly unambiguously, reference to a content, direction towards an object (which is not to be understood here as meaning a thing) or immanent objectivity. Every mental phenomenon includes something as object within itself, although they do not all do so in the same way. In presentation, something is presented, in judgement something is affirmed or denied, in love loved, in hate hated, in desire desired and so on.
(Brentano 1995, 88)
Brentano thought that all and only psychological states exhibit intentionality, and that in this way the subject matter of psychology could be demarcated. His, early and notorious, doctrine of intentional inexistence maintains that the object of an intentional state is literally a part of the state itself, and is, therefore, an “immanent” psychological entity. This position is based on Brentano’s adherence to (something like) the first interpretation of the Kantian notion of phenomena mentioned above (Crane 2006).
Since phenomenology is descriptive, Husserl’s aim is to describe (rather than explain or reduce) intentionality. Husserl differs from Brentano in that he thinks that, apart from some special cases, the object of an intentional act is a transcendent object. That is, the object of an intentional act is external to the act itself (Husserl 2001, 126-7) (Husserl’s “acts” are not to be thought of as actions, or even as active. For example, on Husserl’s view, a visual experience is a conscious act (Husserl 2001, 102)). The object of the belief that Paris is the capital of France is Paris (and France). This is in keeping with the suggestion above that when phenomenologists describe phenomena, they describe worldly things as they are presented in conscious acts, not mental entities.
Intentionality is not a relation, but rather an intrinsic feature of intentional acts. Relations require the existence of their relata (the things related to one another), but this is not true of intentionality (conceived as directedness towards a transcendent object). The object of my belief can fail to exist (if my belief is, for example, about Father Christmas). On Husserl’s picture, every intentional act has an intentional object, an object that the act is about, but they certainly needn’t all have a real object (Husserl 2001, 127).
Husserl distinguishes between the intentional matter (meaning) of a conscious act and its intentional quality, which is something akin to its type (Husserl 2001, 119-22). Something’s being a belief, desire, perception, memory, etc. is its intentional quality. A conscious act’s being about a particular object, taken in a particular way, is its intentional matter. An individual act has a meaning that specifies an object. It is important to keep these three distinct. To see that the latter two are different, note that two intentional matters (meanings) can say the same thing of the same object, if they do it in a different way. Compare: Morrissey wrote “I know it’s Over,” and The lead singer of the Smiths wrote the second track on The Queen is Dead. To see that the first two (act and meaning) are distinct, on Husserl’s view, meanings are ideal (that is, not spatio-temporal), and therefore transcend the acts that have them (Husserl 2001, 120). However, intentional acts concretely instantiate them. In this way, psychological subjects come into contact with both ideal meaning and the worldly entities meant.
In his Ideas I, Husserl introduced a new terminology to describe the structure of intentionality. He distinguished between the noesis and the noema, and he claimed that phenomenology involved both noetic and noematic analysis (Husserl 1982, pt. 3, ch.6). The noesis is the act of consciousness; this notion roughly corresponds to what Husserl previously referred to as the “intentional quality.” Thus, noetic analysis looks at the structure of conscious acts and the ways in which things are consciously intended. The noema is variously interpreted as either the intentional object as it is intended or the ideal content of the intentional act. Thus, noematic analysis looks at the structure of meaning or objects as they are given to consciousness. Exactly how to interpret Husserl’s notions of the noema and noematic analysis are much debated (Smith 2007, 304-11), and this debate goes right to the heart of Husserlian phenomenology.
On Husserl’s view, intentionality is aboutness or directedness as exemplified by conscious mental acts. Heidegger and, following him, Merleau-Ponty broaden the notion of intentionality, arguing that it fails to describe what is in fact the most fundamental form of intentionality. Heidegger argues:
The usual conception of intentionality…misconstrues the structure of the self-directedness-toward…. An ego or subject is supposed, to whose so-called sphere intentional experiences are then supposed to belong…. [T]he mode of being of our own self, the Dasein, is essentially such that this being, so far as it is, is always already dwelling with the extant. The idea of a subject which has intentional experiences merely inside its own sphere and is not yet outside it but encapsulated within itself is an absurdity.
(Heidegger 1982, 63-4)
Heidegger introduces the notion of comportment as a meaningful directedness towards the world that is, nevertheless, more primitive than the conceptually structured intentionality of conscious acts, described by Husserl (Heidegger 1982, 64). Comportment is an implicit openness to the world that continually operates in our habitual dealings with the world. As Heidegger puts it, we are “always already dwelling with the extant”.
Heidegger’s account of comportment is related to his distinction, in Being and Time, between the present-at-hand and the ready-to-hand. These describe two ways of being of worldly entities. We are aware of things as present-at-hand, or occurrent, through what we can call the “theoretical attitude.” Presence-at-hand is the way of being of things—entities with determinate properties.
Thus, a hammer, seen through the detached contemplation of the theoretical attitude, is a material thing with the property of hardness, woodenness etc. This is to be contrasted with the ready-to-hand. In our average day-to-day comportments, Dasein encounters equipment as ready-to-hand,
“The kind of Being which equipment possesses – in which it manifests itself in its own right – we call ‘readiness-to-hand‘” (Heidegger 1962, sec. 15). Equipment shows itself as that which is in-order-to, that is, as that which is for something. A pen is equipment for writing, a fork is equipment for eating, the wind is equipment for sailing, etc. Equipment is ready-to-hand, and this means that it is ready to use, handy, or available. The readiness-to-hand of equipment is its manipulability in our dealings with it.
A ready-to-hand hammer has various properties, including Being-the-perfect-size-for-the-job-at-hand. Heidegger claims that these “dealings” with “equipment” have their own particular kind of “sight”: “[W]hen we deal with them [equipment] by using them and manipulating them, this activity is not a blind one; it has its own kind of sight, by which our manipulation is guided… the sight with which they thus accommodate themselves is circumspection” (Heidegger 1962, sec. 15). Circumspection is the way in which we are aware of the ready-to-hand. It is the kind of awareness that we have of “equipment” when we are using it but are not explicitly concentrating on it or contemplating it, when it recedes. For example, in driving, one is not explicitly aware of the wheel. Rather, one knowledgeably use it; one has “know how.” Thus, circumspection is the name of our mode of awareness of the ready-to-hand entities with which Dasein comports in what, on Heidegger’s view, is the most fundamental mode of intentionality.
Merleau-Ponty’s account of intentionality introduces, more explicitly than does Heidegger’s, the role of the body in intentionality. His account of “motor intentionality” treats bodily activities, and not just conscious acts in the Husserlian sense, as themselves intentional. Much like Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty describes habitual, bodily activity as a directedness towards worldly entities that are for something, what he calls “a set of manipulanda” (Merleau-Ponty 1962, 105). Again, like Heidegger, he argues that motor intentionality is a basic phenomenon, not to be understood in terms of the conceptually articulated intentionality of conscious acts, as described by Husserl. As Merleau-Ponty says, “it is the body which ‘catches’ and ‘comprehends movement’. The acquisition of a habit is indeed the grasping of a significance, but it is the motor grasping or a motor significance” (Merleau-Ponty 1962, 142-3). And again, “it is the body which ‘understands’” (Merleau-Ponty 1962, 144).
Perceptual experience is one of the perennial topics of phenomenological research. Husserl devotes a great deal of attention to perception, and his views have been very influential. We will concentrate, as does Husserl, on the visual perception of three dimensional spatial objects. To understand Husserl’s view, some background will be helpful.
We ordinarily think of perception as a relation between ourselves and things in the world. We think of perceptual experience as involving the presentation of three dimensional spatio-temporal objects and their properties. But this view, sometimes known as naïve realism, has not been the dominant view within the history of modern philosophy. Various arguments have been put forward in an attempt to show that it cannot be correct. The following is just one such:
The conclusion of this argument is incompatible with naïve realism. Once naïve realism is rejected, and it is accepted that perception is a relation, not to an ordinary worldly object, but to a private mental object, something must be said about the relation between these two types of object. An indirect realist view holds that there really are both kinds of object. Worldly objects both cause and are represented by sense data. However, this has often been thought to lead to a troubling skepticism regarding ordinary physical objects: one could be experiencing exactly the same sense data, even if there were no ordinary physical objects causing one to experience them. That is, as far as one’s perceptual experience goes, one could be undergoing one prolonged hallucination. So, for all one knows, there are no ordinary physical objects.
Some versions of a view known as phenomenalism answer this skeptical worry by maintaining that ordinary physical objects are nothing more than logical constructions out of (collections of) actual and possible sense data. The standard phenomenalist claim is that statements about ordinary physical objects can be translated into statements that refer only to experiences (Ayer 1946). A phenomenalist might claim that the physical object statement “there is a white sheep in the kitchen” could be analysed as “if one were to currently be experiencing sense-data as of the inside of the kitchen, then one would experience a white, sheep-shaped sense-datum.” Of course, the above example is certainly not adequate. First, it includes the unanalysed physical object term “kitchen.” Second, one might see the kitchen but not the sheep. Nevertheless, the phenomenalist is committed to the claim that there is some adequate translation into statements that refer only to experiences.
However, another route out of the argument from hallucination is possible. This involves the denial that when one suffers a hallucination there is some object of which one is aware. That is, one denies premise 1 of the argument. Intentional theories of perception deny that perceptual experience is a relation to an object. Rather, perception is characterised by intentionality. The possibility of hallucinations is accounted for by the fact that my perceptual intentions can be inaccurate or “non-veridical.” When one hallucinates a red tomato, one “perceptually intends” a red tomato, but there is none. One’s conscious experience has an intentional object, but not a real one.
This, of course, is the fundamental orientation of Husserl‘s view. In sensory perception we are intentionally directed toward a transcendent object. We enjoy, “concrete intentive mental processes called perceivings of physical things” (Husserl 1982, sec. 41). Further, Husserl takes this view to be consistent with the intuition that in part drives naïve realism, that in perception we are aware of three-dimensional physical things, not subjective mental representations of them. As Husserl writes, “The spatial physical thing which we see is, with all its transcendence, still something perceived, given ‘in person’ in the manner peculiar to consciousness” (Husserl 1982, sec. 43). If the intentional account of perceptual experience is correct, we can agree that naïve realism is false while avoiding the postulation of private sense data.
But if perceiving is characterised by intentionality, what distinguishes it from other intentional phenomena, such as believing? What is the difference between seeing that there is a cat on the mat and believing that there is a cat on the mat? Part of Husserl’s answer to this is that perception has a sensory character. As one commentary puts it, “The authentic appearance of an object of perception is the intentional act inasmuch and to the extent that this act is interwoven with corresponding sensational data” (Bernet, Kern, and Marbach 1993, 118). The “sensational data” (also called hyle) are non-intentional, purely sensory aspects of experience. Sensory data are, on Husserl’s account, “animated” by intentions, which “interpret” them (Husserl 1982, 85). Thus, although perception is an intentional phenomenon, it is not purely intentional; it also has non-intentional, sensory qualities. In contemporary debates over intentionality and consciousness, those who believe that experiences have such non-intentional qualities are sometimes said to believe in qualia.
When we visually perceive a three-dimensional, spatial object, we see it from one particular perspective. This means that we see one of its sides at the expense of the others (and its insides). We see a profile, aspect or, as Husserl puts it, “adumbration.” Should we conclude from this that the other sides of the object are not visually present? Husserl thinks not, claiming that a more phenomenologically adequate description of the experience would maintain that, “Of necessity a physical thing can be given only ‘one-sidedly;’… A physical thing is necessarily given in mere ‘modes of appearance’ in which necessarily a core of ‘what is actually presented‘ is apprehended as being surrounded by a horizon of ‘co-givenness‘” (Husserl 1982, sec. 44).
Husserl refers to that which is co-given as a “horizon,” distinguishing between the internal and external horizons of a perceived object (Husserl 1973, sec. 8). The internal horizon of an experience includes those aspects of the object (rear aspect and insides) that are co-given. The external horizon includes those objects other than those presented that are co-given as part of the surrounding environment. In visual experience we are intentionally directed towards the object as a whole, but its different aspects are given in different ways.
Husserl often uses the term “anticipation” to describe the way in which the merely co-presented is present in perceptual experience. As he says, “there belongs to every external perception its reference from the ‘genuinely perceived’ sides of the object of perception to the sides ‘also meant’—not yet perceived, but only anticipated and, at first, with a non-intuitional emptiness… the perception has horizons made up of other possibilities of perception, as perceptions that we could have, if we actively directed the course of perception otherwise” (Husserl 1960, sec. 19). In these terms, only the front aspect of an object is “genuinely perceived.” Its other features (rear aspect and insides) are also visually present, but by way of being anticipated. This anticipation consists, in part, in expectations of how the object will appear in subsequent experiences. These anticipations count as genuinely perceptual, but they lack the “intuitional fullness” of the fully presented. The non-intuitional emptiness of the merely co-given can be brought into intuitional fullness precisely by making the previously co-given rear aspect fully present, say, by moving around the object. Perceptual anticipations have an “if…then…” structure, that is, a perceptual experience of an object is partly constituted by expectations of how it would look were one to see it from another vantage point.
Above, phenomenalism was characterised in two ways. On one, the view is that ordinary physical objects are nothing more than logical constructions out of (collections of) actual and possible sense data. One the other, the view is that statements about ordinary physical objects can be translated into statements that refer only to experiences. But, in fact, these views are not equivalent. The first, but not the second, is committed to the existence of sense data.
Husserl’s intentional account of perception does not postulate sense data, so he is not a phenomenalist of the first sort. However, there is some reason to believe that he may be a phenomenalist of the second sort. Concerning unperceived objects, Husserl writes:
That the unperceived physical thing “is there” means rather that, from my actually present perceptions, with the actually appearing background field, possible and, moreover, continuously-harmoniously motivated perception-sequences, with ever new fields of physical things (as unheeded backgrounds) lead to those concatenations of perceptions in which the physical thing in question would make its appearance and become seized upon.
(Husserl 1982, sec. 46)
Here Husserl seems to be claiming that what it is for there to be a currently unperceived object is for one to have various things given, various things co-given and various possibilities of givenness. That is, he appears to endorse something that looks rather like the second form of phenomenalism—the view that statements about physical objects can be translated into statements that only make reference to actual and possible appearances. Thus, there is some reason to think that Husserl may be a phenomenalist, even though he rejects the view that perceptual experience is a relation to a private, subjective sense datum.
Sartre accepts, at least in broad outline, Husserl’s view of intentionality (although he steers clear of Husserl’s intricate detail). Intentionality, which Sartre agrees is characteristic of consciousness, is directedness toward worldly objects and, importantly for Sartre, it is nothing more than this. He writes, “All at once consciousness is purified, it is clear as a strong wind. There is nothing in it but a movement of fleeing itself, a sliding beyond itself” (Sartre 1970, 4). Consciousness is nothing but a directedness elsewhere, towards the world. Sartre’s claim that consciousness is empty means that there are no objects or qualities in consciousness. So, worldly objects are not in consciousness; sense data are not in consciousness; qualia are not in consciousness; the ego is not in consciousness. In so far as these things exist, they are presented to consciousness. Consciousness is nothing more than directedness toward the world. Thus, Sartre rejects Husserl’s non-intentional, purely sensory qualities.
A test case for Sartre’s view concerning the emptiness of consciousness is that of bodily sensation (for example, pain). A long tradition has held that bodily sensations, such as pain, are non-intentional, purely subjective qualities (Jackson 1977, chap. 3). Sartre is committed to rejecting this view. However, the most obvious thing with which to replace it is the view according to which bodily sensations are perceptions of the body as painful, or ticklish, etc. On such a perceptual view, pains are experienced as located properties of an object—one’s body. However, Sartre also rejects the idea that when one is aware of one’s body as subject (and being aware of something as having pains is a good candidate for this), one is not aware of it as an object (Sartre 1969, 327). Thus, Sartre is committed to rejecting the perceptual view of bodily sensations.
In place of either of these views, Sartre proposes an account of pains according to which they are perceptions of the world. He offers the following example:
My eyes are hurting but I should finish reading a philosophical work this evening…how is the pain given as pain in the eyes? Is there not here an intentional reference to a transcendent object, to my body precisely in so far as it exists outside in the world? [...] [P]ain is totally void of intentionality…. Pain is precisely the eyes in so far as consciousness “exists them”…. It is the-eyes-as-pain or vision-as-pain; it is not distinguished from my way of apprehending transcendent words.
(Sartre 1969, 356)
Bodily sensations are not given to unreflective consciousness as located in the body. They are indicated by the way objects appear. Having a pain in the eyes amounts to the fact that, when reading, “It is with more difficulty that the words are detached from the undifferentiated ground” (Sartre 1969, 356). What we might intuitively think of as an awareness of a pain in a particular part of the body is nothing more than an awareness of the world as presenting some characteristic difficulty. A pain in the eyes becomes an experience of the words one is reading becoming indistinct, a pain in the foot might become an experience of one’s shoes as uncomfortable.
There are a number of philosophical views concerning both the nature of the self and any distinctive awareness we may have of it. Husserl’s views on the self, or ego, are best understood in relation to well known discussions by Hume and Kant. Phenomenological discussions of the self and self-awareness cannot be divorced from issues concerning the unity of consciousness.
Hume’s account of the self and self-awareness includes one of the most famous quotations in the history of philosophy. He wrote:
There are some philosophers, who imagine we are every moment intimately conscious of what we call our SELF; that we feel its existence and its continuance in existence…. For my part, when I enter most intimately into what I call myself, I always stumble on some particular perception or other, or heat or cold, light or shade, love or hatred, pain or pleasure. I never can catch myself at any time without a perception, and never can observe anything but the perception.
(Hume 1978, 251-2)
Hume claims that reflection does not reveal a continuously existing self. Rather, all that reflection reveals is a constantly changing stream of mental states. In Humean terms, there is no impression of self and, as a consequence of his empiricism, the idea that we have of ourselves is rendered problematic. The concept self is not one which can be uncritically appealed to.
However, as Hume recognized, this appears to leave him with a problem, a problem to which he could not see the answer: “…all my hopes vanish when I come to explain the principles, that unite our successive perceptions in our thought or consciousness” (Hume 1978, 635-6). This problem concerns the unity of consciousness. In fact there are at least two problems of conscious unity.
The first problem concerns the synchronic unity of consciousness and the distinction between subjects of experience. Consider four simultaneous experiences: e1, e2, e3 and e4. What makes it the case that, say, e1 and e2 are experiences had by one subject, A, while e3 and e4 are experiences had by another subject, B? One simple answer is that there is a relation that we could call ownership such that A bears ownership to both e1 and e2, and B bears ownership to both e3 and e4. However if, with Hume, we find the idea of the self problematic, we are bound to find the idea of ownership problematic. For what but the self could it be that owns the various experiences?
The second problem concerns diachronic unity. Consider four successive conscious experiences, e1, e2, e3 and e4, putatively had by one subject, A. What makes it the case that there is just one subject successively enjoying these experiences? That is, what makes the difference between a temporally extended stream of conscious experience and merely a succession of experiences lacking any experienced unity? An answer to this must provide a relation that somehow accounts for the experienced unity of conscious experience through time.
So, what is it for two experiences, e1 and e2, to belong to the same continuous stream of consciousness? One thought is that e1 and e2 must be united, or synthesised, by the self. On this view, the self must be aware of both e1 and e2 and must bring them together in one broader experience that encompasses them. If this is right then, without the self to unify my various experiences, there would be no continuous stream of conscious experience, just one experience after another lacking experiential unity. But our experience is evidently not like this. If the unity of consciousness requires the unifying power of the self, then Hume’s denial of self-awareness, and any consequent doubts concerning the legitimacy of the idea of the self, are deeply problematic.
Kant’s view of these matters is complex. However, at one level, he can be seen to agree with Hume on the question of self-awareness while disagreeing with him concerning the legitimacy of the concept of the self. His solution to the two problems of the unity of concious is, as above, that diverse experiences are unified by me. He writes:
The thought that these representations given in intuition all together belong to me means, accordingly, the same as that I unite them in a self-consciousness, or at least can unite them therein…for otherwise I would have as multicoloured, diverse a self as I have representations of which I am conscious.
(Kant 1929, sec. B143)
Thus, Kant requires that the notion of the self as unifier of experience be legitimate. Nevertheless, he denies that reflection reveals this self to direct intuition:
…this identity of the subject, of which I can be conscious in all my representations, does not concern any intuition of the subject, whereby it is given as an object, and cannot therefore signify the identity of the person, if by that is understood the consciousness of the identity of one’s own substance, as a thinking being, in all change of its states.
(Kant 1929, sec. B408)
The reason that Kant can allow the self as a legitimate concept despite the lack of an intuitive awareness of the self is that he does not accept the empiricism that drove Hume’s account. On the Kantian view, it is legitimate to appeal to an I that unifies experience since such a thing is precisely a condition of the possibility of experience. Without such a unifying self, experience would not be possible, therefore the concept is legitimate. The I, on this account, is transcendental—it is brought into the account as a condition of the possibility of experience (this move is one of the distinctive features of Kantian transcendental philosophy).
Husserl‘s views on the self evolved over his philosophical career. In Logical Investigations, he accepted something like the Humean view (Husserl 2001, 91-3), and did not appear to find overly problematic the resulting questions concerning the unity of consciousness. However, by the time of Ideas I, he had altered his view. There he wrote that, “all mental processes…as belonging to the one stream of mental processes which is mine, must admit of becoming converted into actional cogitationes…In Kant’s words, ‘The ‘I think’ must be capable to accompanying all my presentations.’” (Husserl 1982, sec. 57). Thus, Husserl offers an account of unity that appeals to the self functioning transcendentally, as a condition of the possibility of experience.
However, Husserl departs from Kant, and before him Hume, in claiming that this self is experienced in direct intuition. He claims that, “I exist for myself and am constantly given to myself, by experiential evidence, as ‘I myself.’ This is true of the transcendental ego and, correspondingly, of the psychologically pure ego; it is true, moreover, with respect to any sense of the word ego.” (Husserl 1960, sec. 33).
On Kant’s view, the I is purely formal, playing a role in structuring experience but not itself given in experience. On Husserl’s view, the I plays this structuring role, but is also given in inner experience. The ego appears but not as (part of) a mental process. It’s presence is continual and unchanging. Husserl says that it is, “a transcendency within immanency” (Husserl 1982, sec. 57). It is immanent in that it is on the subject side of experience; It is transcendent in that it is not an experience (or part of one). What Husserl has in mind here is somewhat unclear, but one might liken it to the way that the object as a whole is given through an aspect—except that the ego is at “the other end” of intentional experience.
Sartre’s view that consciousness is empty involves the denial not only of sensory qualities but also of the view that we are experientially aware of an ego within consciousness. Sartre denies that the ego is given in pre-reflective experience, either in the content of experience (as an object) or as a structural feature of the experience itself (as a subject). As he puts it, “while I was reading, there was consciousness of the book, of the heroes of the novel, but the I was not inhabiting this consciousness. It was only consciousness of the object and non-positional consciousness of itself” (Sartre 1960, 46-7). Again, “When I run after a streetcar, when I look at the time, when I am absorbed in contemplating a portrait, there is no I.” (Sartre 1960, 48-9).
Here Sartre appears to be siding with Hume and Kant on the question of the givenness of the self with respect to everyday, pre-reflective consciousness. However, Sartre departs from the Humean view, in that he allows that the ego is given in reflective consciousness:
…the I never appears except on the occasion of a reflexive act. In this case, the complex structure of consciousness is as follows: there is an unreflected act of reflection, without an I, which is directed on a reflected consciousness. The latter becomes the object of the reflecting consciousness without ceasing to affirm its own object (a chair, a mathematical truth, etc.). At the same time, a new object appears which is the occasion of an affirmation by reflective consciousness…This transcendent object of the reflective act is the I.
(Sartre 1960, 53)
On this view, the self can appear to consciousness, but it is paradoxically experienced as something outside of, transcendent to, consciousness. Hence the transcendence of the ego, Sartre’s title.
With respect to unreflective consciousness, however, Sartre denies self-awareness. Sartre also denies that the ego is required to synthesise, or unite, one’s various experiences. Rather, as he sees it, the unity of consciousness is achieved via the objects of experience, and via the temporal structure of experience. Although his explanation is somewhat sketchy, his intent is clear:
…it is certain that phenomenology does not need to appeal to any such unifying and individualizing I…The object is transcendent to the consciousness which grasps it, and it is in the object that the unity of the consciousness is found…It is consciousness which unifies itself, concretely, by a play of “transversal” intentionalities which are concrete and real retentions of past consciousnesses. Thus consciousness refers perpetually to itself.
(Sartre 1960, 38-9)
Various questions have occupied phenomenologists concerning time-consciousness—how our conscious lives take place over time. What exactly does this amount to? This question can be seen as asking for more detail concerning the synthesising activity of the self with respect to the diachronic unity of consciousness. Related to this, temporal objects (such as melodies or events) have temporal parts or phases. How is it that the temporal parts of a melody are experienced as parts of one and the same thing? How is it that we have an experience of succession, rather than simply a succession of experiences? This seems an especially hard question to answer if we endorse the claim that we can only be experientially aware of the present instant. For if, at time t1 we enjoy experience e1 of object (or event) o1, and at t2 we enjoy experience e2 of object (or event) o2, then it seems that we are always experientially confined to the present. An account is needed of how is it that our experience appears to stream through time.
When faced with this problem, a popular view has been that we are simultaneously aware of more than an instant. According to William James, “the practically cognized present is no knife-edge, but a saddle-back, with a certain breadth of its own on which we sit perched, and from which we look in two directions into time. The unit of composition of our perception of time is a duration” (James 1981, 609).The doctrine of the specious present holds that we are experientially aware of a span of time that includes the present and past (and perhaps even the future). So, at t2 we are aware of the events that occur at both t2 and t1 (and perhaps also t3).
The specious present is present in the sense that the phases of the temporal object are experienced as present. The specious present is specious in that those phases of the temporal object that occur at times other than the present instant are not really present. But this would seem to have the bizarre consequence that we experience the successive phases of a temporal object as simultaneous. That is, a moving object is simultaneously experienced as being at more than one place. It goes without saying that this is not phenomenologically accurate.
Also, given that our experience at each instant would span a duration longer than that instant, it seems that we would experience everything more than once. In a sequence of notes c, d, e we would experience c at the time at which c occurs, and then again at the time at which d occurs. But, of course, we only experience each note once.
Husserl’s position is not entirely unlike the specious present view. He maintains that, at any one instant, one has experience of the phase occurring at that instant, the phase(s) that has just occurred, and that phase that is just about to occur. His labels for these three aspects of experience are “primal impression,” “retention” and “protention.” All three must be in place for the proper experience of a temporal object, or of the duration of a non-temporal object.
The primal impression is an intentional awareness of the present event as present. Retention is an intentional awareness of the past event as past. Protention is an intentional awareness of the future event as about to happen. Each is an intentional directedness towards a present, past and future event respectively. As Husserl puts matters, “In each primal phase that originally constitutes the immanent content we have retentions of the preceding phases and protentions of the coming phases of precisely this content” (Husserl 1991, sec. 40). The movement from something’s being protended, to its being experienced as a primal impression, to its being retained, is what accounts for the continuous stream of experience. Retention and protention form the temporal horizon against which the present phase is perceived. That is, the present is perceived as that which follows a past present and anticipates a future present.
Not only does the present experience include a retention of past worldly events, it also includes a retention of the past experiences of those past events. The same can be said with regard to protention. The fact that past and future experiences are retained and protended respectively, points towards this question: What accounts for the fact that mental acts themselves are experienced as enduring, or as having temporal parts? Do we need to postulate a second level of conscious acts (call it “consciousness*”) that explains the experienced temporality of immanent objects? But this suggestion looks as though it would involve us in an infinite regress, since the temporality of the stream of experiences constituting consciousness* would need to be accounted for.
Husserl’s proposed solution to this puzzle involves his late notion of “absolute constituting consciousness.” The temporality of experiences is constituted by a consciousness that is not itself temporal. He writes: “Subjective time becomes constituted in the absolute timeless consciousness, which is not an object” (Husserl 1991, 117). Further, “The flow of modes of consciousness is not a process; the consciousness of the now is not itself now…therefore sensation…and likewise retention, recollection, perception, etc. are nontemporal; that is to say, nothing in immanent time.” (Husserl 1991, 345-6).
The interpretation of Husserl’s notion of absolute constituting consciousness is not helped by the fact that, despite the non-temporal nature of absolute consciousness, Husserl describes it in temporal terms, such as “flow.” Indeed, Husserl seems to have thought that here we have come up against a phenomenon intrinsically problematic to describe:
Now if we consider the constituting appearances of the consciousness of internal time we find the following: they form a flow…. But is not the flow a succession? Does it not have a now, an actually present phase, and a continuity of pasts which I am now conscious in retentions? We have no alternative here but to say: the flow is something we speak of in conformity with what is constituted, but it is not “something in objective time.” It…has the absolute properties of something to be designated metaphorically as “flow”…. For all of this we have no names. (Husserl 1991, 381-2)
Husserlian and post-Husserlian phenomenology stands in complex relations to a number of different philosophical traditions, most notably British empiricism, Kantian and post-Kantian transcendental philosophy, and French existentialism. One of the most important philosophical movements of the Twentieth Century, phenomenology has been influential, not only on so-called “Continental” philosophy (Embree 2003), but also on so-called “analytic” philosophy (Smith and Thomasson 2005). There continues to be a great deal of interest in the history of phenomenology and in the topics discussed by Twentieth Century phenomenologists, topics such as intentionality, perception, the self and time-consciousness.
University of Manchester
Last updated: March 27, 2009 | Originally published: