Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Phenomenology and Natural Science

Phenomenology provides an excellent framework for a comprehensive understanding of the natural sciences. It treats inquiry first and foremost as a process of looking and discovering rather than assuming and deducing. In looking and discovering, an object always appears to a someone, either an individual or community; and the ways an object appears and the state of the individual or community to which it appears are correlated.

To use the simplest of examples involving ordinary perception, when I see a cup, I see it only through a single profile. Yet to perceive it as real rather than a hallucination or prop is to apprehend it as having other profiles that will show themselves as I walk around it, pick it up, and so forth. No act of perception – not even a God’s – can grasp all of a thing’s profiles at once. The real is always more than what we can perceive.

Phenomenology of science treats discovery as an instrumentally mediated form of perception. When researchers detect the existence of a new particle or asteroid, it assumes these will appear in other ways in other circumstances – and this can be confirmed or disconfirmed only by looking, in some suitably broad sense. It is obvious to scientists that electrons appear differently when addressed by different instrumentation (for example, wave-particle duality), and therefore that any conceptual grasp of the phenomenon involves instrumental mediation and anticipation. Not only is there no “view from nowhere” on such phenomena, but there is also no position from which we can zoom in on every available profile. There is no one privileged perception and the instrumentally mediated “positions” from which we perceive constantly change.

Phenomenology looks at science from various “focal lengths.” Close up, it looks at laboratory life; at attitudes, practices, and objects in the laboratory. It also pulls back the focus and looks at forms of mediation – how things like instruments, theories, laboratories, and various other practices mediate scientific perception. It can pull the focus back still further and look at how scientific research itself is contextualized, in an environment full of ethical and political motivations and power relations. Phenomenology has also made specific contributions to understanding relativity, quantum mechanics, and evolution.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Historical Overview
  3. Science and Perception
  4. General Implications
    1. The Priority of Meaning over Technique
    2. The Priority of the Practical over the Theoretical
    3. The priority of situation over abstract formalization
  5. Layers of Experience
    1. First Phase: Laboratory Life
    2. Second Phase: Forms of Mediation
    3. Third Phase: Contextualization of Research
  6. Phenomenology and Specific Sciences
    1. Relativity
    2. Quantum Mechanics
    3. Evolution
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Phenomenology provides an excellent starting point, perhaps the only adequate starting point, for a comprehensive understanding of the natural sciences: their existence, practices, methods, products, and cultural niches. The reason is that, for a phenomenologist, inquiry is first and foremost a question of looking and discovering rather than assuming and deducing. In looking and discovering, an object is always given to a someone – be it an individual or community – and the object and its manners of givenness are correlated. In the special terminology of phenomenology, this is the doctrine of intentionality (for example, see Cairns 1999). This doctrine has nothing to do with the distinction between “inner” and “outer” experiences, but is a simple fact of perception. To use the time-honored phenomenological example, even when I see an ordinary object such as a cup, I apprehend it only through a single appearance or profile. Yet for me to perceive it as a real object – rather than a hallucination or prop – I apprehend it as having other profiles that will show themselves as I walk around it, pick it up, and so forth, each profile flowing into the next in an orderly, systematic way. I do more than expect or deduce these profiles; the act of perceiving a cup contains anticipations of other acts in which the same object will be experienced in other ways. That’s what gives my experience of the world its depth and density. Perhaps I will discover that my original perception was misled, and my anticipations were mere assumptions; still, I discover this only through looking and discovering – through sampling other profiles. In science, too, when researchers propose the existence of a new particle or asteroid, such a proposal involves anticipations of that entity appearing in other ways in other circumstances, anticipations that can be confirmed or disconfirmed only by looking, in some suitably broad sense (Crease 1993). In ordinary perception, each appearance and profile (noema) is correlated with a particular position of the one who apprehends it (noesis); a change in either one (the cup turning, the person moving) affects the profile apprehended. This is called the noetic-noematic correlation. In science, the positioning of the observer is technologically mediated; what a particle or cell looks like depends in part on the state of instrumentation that mediates the observation.

Another core doctrine of phenomenology is the lifeworld (Crease 2011). Human beings, that is, engage the world in different ways. For instance, they seek wealth, fame, pleasure, companionship, happiness, or “the good”. They do this as children, adolescents, parents, merchants, athletes, teachers, and administrators. All these ways of being are modifications of a matrix of practical attachments that human beings have to the world that precedes any cognitive understanding. The lifeworld is the technical term phenomenologists have for this matrix. The lifeworld is the soil out of which grow various ways of being, including science. Understanding photosynthesis or quantum field theory, for instance, is only one – and very rare – way that human beings interact with plants or matter, and not the default setting. Humans have to be trained to see the world that way; they have to pay a special kind of attention and pursue a special kind of inquiry. Thus the subject-inquirer (again, whether individual or community) is always bound up with what is being inquired into by practical engagements that precede the inquiry, engagements that can be altered by and in the wake of the inquiry. It is terribly tempting for metaphysicians to “kick away the ladder of lived experience” from scientific ontology as a means to gain some sort of privileged access to the world that bypasses lifeworld experience, but this condemns science to being “empty fictions” (Vallor 2009).

The aim of phenomenology is to unearth invariants in noetic-noematic correlations, to make forms or structures of experience appear that are hidden in ordinary, unreflective life, or the natural attitude. Again, the parallel with scientific methodology is uncanny; scientific inquiry aims to find hidden forms or structures of the world by varying, repeating, or otherwise changing interventions into nature to see what remains the same throughout. Phenomenologists seek invariant structures at several different phases or levels – including that of the investigator, the laboratory, and the lifeworld – and can examine not only each phase or level, but the relation of each to the others. Over the last hundred years, this has generated a vast and diverse body of literature (Ginev 2006; Kockelmans & Kisiel 1970; Chasan 1992; Hardy and Embree 1992; McGuire and Tuchanska 2001; Gutting 2005).

2. Historical Overview

Phenomenology started out, in Husserl’s hands, well-positioned to develop an account of science. After all, Husserl was at the University of Göttingen during the years when David Hilbert, Felix Klein, and Emmy Noether were developing and extending the notion of invariance and group theory. Husserl not only had a deep appreciation for mathematics and natural science, but his approach was allied in many key respects with theirs, for he extended the notion of invariance to perception by viewing the experience of an object as of something that remains the same in the flux of changing sensory conditions produced by changing physical conditions. This may seem far-removed from the domain of mathematics but it is not. Klein’s Erlanger program viewed mathematical objects as not representable geometrically all at once but rather in definite and particular ways, depending on the planes on which they were projected; the mathematical object remained the same throughout different projections. In an analogous way, Husserl’s phenomenological program viewed a sensuously apprehended object as not given to an experiencing subject all at once but rather via a series of adumbrations or profiles, one at a time, that depend on the respective positioning of subject and object. The “same” object – even light of a certain wavelength – can look very different to human observers in different conditions. What is different about Husserl’s program, and may make it seem removed from the mathematical context, is that these profiles are not mathematical projections but lifeworld experiences. What remained to be added to the phenomenological approach to create a fuller framework for a natural philosophy of science was a notion of perceptual fulfillment under laboratory conditions, and of the theoretical planning and instrumental mediation leading to the observing of a scientific object. The “same” structure – for example, a cell – will look very different using microscopes of different magnification and quality, and phenomenology easily provides an account for this (Crease 2009).

Despite this promising beginning, many phenomenologists after Husserl turned away from the sciences, sometimes even displaying a certain paternalistic and superior attitude towards them as impoverished forms of revealing. This is unwarranted. Husserl’s objection to rationalistic science in the Crisis of the European Sciences was after all not to science but to the Galilean assumption that the ontology of nature could be provided by mathematics alone, bypassing the lifeworld (Gurwitsch 1966, Heelan 1987). And Heidegger’s objection, in Being and Time, most charitably considered, was not to theoretical knowledge, but to the forgetting of the fact that it is a founded mode in the lifeworld, to be interpreted not merely as an aid to disclosure but as a special and specialized mode of access to the real itself. Others to follow, including Gadamer and  Merleau-Ponty, for various reasons did not pursue the significance of phenomenology for natural science.

Science also lagged behind other areas of phenomenological inquiry for historical reasons. The dramatic success of Einstein’s theory of general relativity, in 1919, brought “a watershed for subsequent philosophy of science” that proved to be detrimental to the prospects of phenomenology for science (Ryckman 2005). Kant’s puzzling and ambiguous doctrine of the schematism – according to which intuitions, which are a product of sensibility, and categories, which are a product of understanding, are synthesized by rules or schemata to produce experience – had nurtured two very different approaches to the philosophy of science. One, taken by logical empiricists, rejected the schematism and treated sensibility and the understanding as independent, and the line between the intuitive and the conceptual as that between experienced physical objects and abstract mathematical frameworks. The empiricists saw these two as linked by rules of coordination that applied the latter to the former. Such coordination – the subjective contribution of mind to knowledge – produced objective knowledge. The other, more phenomenological route was to pursue the insight that experience is possible only thanks to the simultaneous co-working of intuitions and concepts. While some forms and categories are subject to replacement, producing a “relativized a priori” (my conception of things like electrons, cells, and simultaneity may change) such forms and categories make experience possible. Objective knowledge arises not by an arbitrary application of concepts to intuitions – it is not just a decision of consciousness – but is a function of the fulfillment of physical conditions of possible conscious experience; scientists look at photographic plates or information collected by detectors in laboriously prepared conditions that assure them that such information is meaningful and not noise. Husserl’s phenomenological approach to transcendental structures, though, must be contrasted with Kant’s, for while Kant’s transcendental concepts are deduced, Husserl’s are reflectively observed and described. However, following the stunning announcement of the success of general relativity in 1919, which seemed to destroy transcendental assumptions about at least the Euclidean form of space and about absolute time, logical empiricists were quick to claim it vindicated their approach and refuted not only Kant but all transcendental philosophy. “Through Einstein … the Kantian position is untenable,” Schlick declared, “and empiricist philosophy has gained one of its most brilliant triumphs.”  But the alleged vanquishing of transcendental philosophy and triumph of logical empiricism’s claims to understand science was due to “rhetoric and successful propaganda” rather than argument (Ryckman 2005). For as other transcendental philosophers such as Ernst Cassirer, and philosophically sophisticated scientists such as Hermann Weyl, realized, in making claims about the forms of possible phenomena general relativity called for what amounted to a revision, rather than a refutation, of Kant’s doctrine; how we may experience spatiality in ordinary life remains unaffected by Einstein’s theory. But the careers of both Cassirer and Weyl took them away from such questions, and nobody else took their place.

3. Science and Perception

One way of exhibiting the deep link between phenomenology and science is to note that phenomenology is concerned with the difference between local effects and global structures in perception. To use the time-honored example of perceiving a cup through a profile again: Grasping it under that particular adumbration or profile is a local effect, though what I intend is a global structure – the phenomenon – with multiple horizons of profiles. Phenomenology aims to exhibit how the phenomenon is constituted in describing these horizons of profiles. But this of course is closely related to the aim of science, which seeks to describe how phenomena (for example, electrons) appear differently in different contexts – and even, in the case of general relativity, incorporates a notion of invariance into the very notion of objectivity itself (Ryckman 2005). An objective state of affairs, that is, is one that has the same description regardless of whether the frame of reference from which it is observed is accelerating or not.

In science, however, perceiving (observing) is mediated by theory and instruments. Thanks to theories, the lawlike behavior of scientific phenomena (for example, how electrons behave in different conditions) is represented or “programmed” and then correlated with instrumental techniques and practices so that a phenomenon appears. The theory (for example, electromagnetism) thus structures both the performance process thanks to which the phenomenon appears, and the phenomenon itself. Read noetically, with respect to production, the theory is something to be performed; read noematically, with respect to the product, it describes the object appearing in performance. A theory does not correspond to a scientific phenomenon; rather, the phenomenon fulfills or does not fulfill the expectations of its observation raised by the theory. Is this an electron beam or not?  To decide that, its behavior has to be evaluated. Theory provides a language that the experimenter can use for describing or recognizing or identifying the profiles. For the theorist, the semantics of the language is mathematical; for the experimenter, the semantics are descriptive and the objects described are not mathematical objects but phenomena – bodily presences in the world. Thus the dual semantics of science (Heelan 1988); a scientific word (such as ‘electron’) can refer to both an abstract term in a theory and to a physical phenomenon in a laboratory. The difference is akin to that between a ‘C’ in a musical score and a ‘C’ heard in a concert hall. Conflating these two usages has confused many a philosopher of science. But our perception of the physical phenomenon in the laboratory has been mediated by the instruments used to produce and measure it (Ihde 1990).

By adding theoretical and experimental mediation to Husserl’s account of what is “constitutive” of perceptual horizons (Husserl 2001, from where the following quotations are taken except where noted), one generates a framework for a phenomenological account of science. To grasp a scientific object, like a perceptual object, as a presence in the world, as “objective,” means, strangely enough, to grasp it as never totally given, but as having an unbounded number of profiles that are not simultaneously grasped. Such an object is embedded in a system of “referential implications” available to us to explore over time. And it is rarely grasped with Cartesian clarity the first time around, but “calls out to us” and “pushes us” towards appearances not simultaneously given. A new property, for example parity violation, is detected in one area of particle physics – but if it shows up here it should also show up there even more intensely and dramatically. Entities, that is, show themselves as having further sides to be explored, and as amenable to better and better instrumentation. Phenomena even as it were call attention to their special features – strangeness in elementary particles, DNA in cells, gamma ray bursters amongst astronomical bodies – and recommends these features to us for further exploration. “There is a constant process of anticipation, of preunderstanding.”  With sufficient apprehension of sampled profiles, “The unfamiliar object is … transformed …into a familiar object.”  This involves development both of an inner horizon of profiles already apprehended, already sampled, and an external of not-yet apprehended profiles. But the object is never fully grasped in its complete presence, horizons remain, and the most one can hope for is for a thing to be given optimally in terms of the interests for which it is approached. And because theory and instruments are always changing, the same object will always be grasped with new profiles. Thus, Husserl’s phenomenological account readily handles the often vexing question in traditional philosophy of science of how “the same” experiment can be “repeated.”  It equally readily handles the even more troublesome puzzle in traditional approaches of how successive theories or practices can refer to the same object. For just as the same object can be apprehended “horizontally” in different instrumental contexts at the same time, it can also be apprehended “vertically” by successively more developed instrumentation. Husserl, for instance, refers to the “open horizon of conceivable improvement to be further pursued” (Husserl Crisis #9a). Newer, more advanced instruments will pick out the same entity (for example, an electron), yield new values for measurements of the same quantities, and open up new domains in which new phenomena will appear amid the ones that now appear on the threshold. Today’s discovery is tomorrow’s background.

The basic account of perception given above has been further elaborated in the context of group theory by Ernst Cassirer in a remarkable article (Cassirer 1944). Cassirer extends the attempts of Helmholtz, Poincaré and others to apply the mathematical concept of group to perception in a way that makes it suitable to the philosophy of science. Group theory may seem far from the perceptual world, Cassirer says. But the perceptual world, like the mathematical world, is structured; it possesses perceptual constancy in a way that cannot be reduced to “a mere mosaic, an aggregate of scattered sensations” but involve a certain kind of invariance. Perception is integrated into a total experience in which keeping track of “dissimilarity rather than similarity” is a hallmark of the same object. The cup is going to look different as the light changes and as I move about it. “As the particular changes its position in the context, it changes its “aspect.”  Thus, Cassirer writes, “the ‘possibility of the object’ depends upon the formation of certain invariants in the flux of sense-impressions, no matter whether these be invariants of perception or of geometrical thought, or of physical theory. The positing of something endowed with objective existence and nature depends on the formation of constants of the kinds mentioned …. The truth is that the search for constancy, the tendency toward certain invariants, constitutes a characteristic feature and immanent function of perception. This function is as much a condition of perception of objective existence as it is a condition of objective knowledge.”  The constitutive factor of objective knowledge, Cassirer concludes, “manifests itself in the possibility of forming invariants.”  Again, one needs to flesh out such an approach with account of fulfillment as mediated both theoretically and practically.

4. General Implications

The above, it will be seen, has three general implications for philosophy of science:

a. The Priority of Meaning over Technique.

In contrast to positivist-inspired and much mainstream philosophy of science, a phenomenological approach does not view science as pieced together at the outset from praxes, techniques, and methods. Praxes, techniques, and methods – as well as data and results – come into being by interpretation. The generation of meaning does not move from part to whole, but via a back-and-forth (hermeneutical) process in which phenomena are projected upon an already-existing framework of meaning, the assumptions of which are at least partially brought into question, and by this action further reviewed and refined within the ongoing process of interpretation. This process is amply illustrated by episode after episode in the history of science. Relativity theory evolved as a response to problems and developments experienced by scientists working within Newtonian theory.

b. The Priority of the Practical over the Theoretical

The framework of meaning mentioned above in terms of which phenomena are interpreted is not comprised merely of tools, texts, and ideas, but involves a culturally and historically determined engagement with the world which is prior to the subject and object separation. On the one hand, this means that the meanings generated by science are not ahistorical forms or natural kinds that have a transcendent origin. On the other hand, it means that these meanings are also not arbitrary or mere artifacts of discourse; science has a “historical space” in which meanings are realized or not realized. Results are right or wrong; theories are adjudicated as true or false. Later, as the historical space changes, the “same” theory (or more fully developed versions thereof) may be confirmed by different results inconsistent with previous confirmations of the earlier version. What a “cell” is may look very different depending on the techniques and instruments used to apprehend it, but what is happening is not a wholesale replacement of one picture or theory by another, but expanding and evolving knowledge (Crease 2009).

c. The Priority of the Practical over the Theoretical

Truth always involves a disclosure of something to someone in a particular cultural and historical context. Even scientific knowledge can never completely transcend these culturally and historically determined involvements, leaving them behind as if scientific knowledge consisted in abstractions viewed from nowhere in particular. The particularity of the phenomena disclosed by science is often disguised by the fact that they can show themselves in many different cultural and historical contexts if the laboratory conditions are right, giving rise to the illusion of disembodied knowledge.

5. Layers of Experience

These three implications suggest a way of ordering the kinds of contributions that a phenomenology can make to the philosophy of science. For there are several different phases – focal lengths, one might say – at which to set one’s phenomenology, and it is important to distinguish between them. The focal length can be trained within the laboratory on laboratory life, and investigate the attitudes, practices, and objects encountered in the laboratory. These, however, are nested in the laboratory environment and in the structure of scientific knowledge, which is their exterior expression. Another phase concerns the forms of mediation, both theoretical and instrumental, and how these contextualize the phase just mentioned of attitudes, practices, and objects, and how these are related to their exterior. This phase is nested in turn in another kind of environment, the lifeworld itself, with its ethical and political motivations and power relations. The contributions of phenomenology to the philosophy of science is first of all to describe these phases and how they are nested in each other, and then to describe and characterize each. A philosophical account of science cannot begin, nor is it complete, without a description of these phases.

a. First Phase: Laboratory Life

One phase has to do with specific attitudes, practices, or objects encountered by a researcher doing research in the laboratory environment – with the phenomenology of laboratory perception. Inquiry is one issue here. Conventional textbooks often treat the history of science as a sequence of beliefs about the state of the world, as if it were like a series of snapshots. This creates problems having to do with accounting for how these beliefs change, how they connect up, and what such change implies about continuity of science. It also rings artificial from the standpoint of laboratory practice. A phenomenological approach, by contrast, considers the path of science as rather like an evolving perception, as a continual process that cannot be neatly dissected into what’s in question and what not, what you believe and what you do not. Affects of research is another issue. The moment of experience involves more than knowledge, global or local, more than iterations and reiterations. Affects like wonder, astonishment, surprise, incredulity, fascination, and puzzlement are important to inquiry, in mobilizing the transformation of the discourse and our basic way of being related to a field of inquiry. They indicate to us the presence of something more than what’s formulated, yet also not arbitrary. When something unexpected happens, it is not a matter of drawing a conceptual blank. When something unexpected and puzzling happens in the lab, it involves a discomfort from running into something that you think you should understand and you do not. Taking that discomfort with you is essential to what transformations ensue. Other key issues of the phenomenology of laboratory experience include trust, communication, data, measurement, and experiment (Crease 1993). Experiment is an especially important topic. For there is nothing automatic about experimentation; experiments are first and foremost material events in the world. Events to not produce numbers – they do not measure themselves – but do so only when an action is planned, prepared, and witnessed. An experiment, therefore, has the character of a performance, and like all performances is a historically and culturally situated hermeneutical process. Scientific objects that appear in laboratory performances may have to be brought into focus, somewhat like the ship that Merleau-Ponty describes that has run aground on the shore, whose pieces are at first mixed confusingly with the background, filling us with a vague tension and unease, until our sight is abruptly recast and we see a ship, accompanied by release of the tension and unease (Crease 1998). In the laboratory, however, what is at first latent in the background and then recognized as an entity belongs to an actively structured process. We are staging what we are trying to recognize, and the way we are staging it may interfere with our recognition and the experiment may have to be restaged to bring the object into better focus.

b. Second Phase: Forms of Mediation

Second order features have to do with understanding the contextualization of the laboratory itself. For the laboratory is a special kind of environment. The laboratory is like a garden, walled off to a large extent from the wider and wilder surrounding environment outside. Special things are grown in it that may not appear in the outside world, but yet are related to them, and which help us understand the outside world. To some extent, the laboratory can be examined as the product or embodiment of forms discursive formations imposing power and unconditioned knowledge claims (Rouse 1987). But only to a limited extent. For the laboratory is not like an institution in which all practices are supposed to work in the same way without changing. It thus cannot be understood by studying discursive formations of power and knowledge exclusively; it is unlike a prison or military camp. A laboratory is a place designed to make it possible to stage performances that show themselves at times as disruptive of discourse, to explore such performances and make sure there really is a disruption, and then to foster creation of a new discourse.

c. Third Phase: Contextualization of Research

A third phase has to do with the contextualization of research itself, with approaches to the whole of the world, and with understanding why human beings have come to privilege certain kinds of inquiry over others. The lifeworld – a kind of horizon or atmosphere in which we think, pre-loaded with powerful metaphors and images and deeply embedded habits of thought – has its own character and changes over time. This character affects everyone in it, scientists and philosophers who think about science. The conditions of the lifeworld can, for instance, seduce us into thinking that only the measurable is the real. This is the kind of layer addressed by Husserl’s Crisis (Husserl 1970), Heidegger’s “The Question Concerning Technology,” (Heidegger 1977) and so forth. The distinction between the second and third phases thus parallels the distinction in sociology of science between micro-sociology and macro-sociology.

6. Phenomenology and Specific Sciences

Phenomenology has also been shown to contribute to understanding certain features or developments in contemporary theories which seem of particular significance for science itself, including relativity, quantum mechanics, and evolution.

a. Relativity

Ryckman (2005) highlights the role of phenomenology in understanding the structure and implications of general relativity and of certain other developments in contemporary physics. The key has to do with the role of general covariance, or the requirement that objects must be specified without any reference to a dynamical background space-time setting. Fields, that is, are not properties of space-time points or regions, they are those points and regions. The result of the requirement of general covariance is thus to remove the physical objectivity of space and time as independent of the mass and energy distribution that shapes the geometry of physical space and time. This, Ryckman writes, is arguably its “most philosophically significant aspect,” for it specifies “what is a possible object of fundamental physical theory.”  The point was digested by transcendental philosophers who could understand relativity. One was Cassirer, who saw that covariance could not be treated as a principle of coordination between intuitions and formalisms, and thus was not part of the “subjective” contribution to science, as Schlick and his follower Hans Reichenbach were doing. Rather, it amounted to a restriction on what was allowed as a possible object of field theory to begin with. The requirement of general covariance meant that relativity was about a universe in which objects did not flit about on a space-time stage, but were that stage. Ryckman’s book also demonstrates the role of phenomenology in Weyl’s classic treatment of relativity, and in his formulation of the gauge principle governing the identity of units of measurement. Phenomenology thus played an important role in the articulation of general relativity, and certain concepts central to modern physics.

b. Quantum Mechanics

Phenomenology may also contribute to explaining the famous disparity between the clarity and correctness of the theory and the obscurity and inaccuracy of the language used to speak about its meaning. In Quantum Mechanics and Objectivity (Heelan 1965) and other writings (Heelan 1975), Heelan applies phenomenological tools to this issue. His approach is partly Heideggerian and partly Husserlian. What is Heideggerian is the insistence on the moment prior to object-constitution, the self-aware context or horizon or world or open space in which something appears. The actual appear­ing (or phenomenon) to the self is a second moment. This Heelan analyses in a Husserlian way by studying the intentionality structure of object constitution and insisting on the duality therein of its (embodied subjective) noetic and (embodied objective) noematic poles. “The noetic aspect is an open field of connected scientific questions addressed by a self-aware situated researcher to empirical experience; the noematic aspect is the response obtained from the situated scientific experiment by the experiencing researcher. The totality of actual and possible answers constitutes a horizon of actual and possible objects of human knowledge and this we call a World.”  (Heelan 1965, x; also 3-4). The world then becomes the source of meaning of the word “real,” which is defined as what can appear as an object in the world. The ever-changing and always historical laboratory environment with all its ever-to-be-updated instrumentation and technologies belongs to the noetic pole; it is what makes the objects of science real by bringing them into the world in the act of measurement. Measure­ment involves “an interaction with a measuring instrument capable of yielding macroscopic sensible data, and a theory capable of explaining what it is that is measured and why the sensible data are observable symbols of it” (Heelan 1965, 30-1). The difference between quantum and classical physics does not lie in the intervention of the observer’s subjectivity but in the nature of the quantum object: “[W]hile in classical physics this is an idealised normative (and hence abstract) object, in quantum physics the object is an individual instance of its idealised norm” (Heelan 1965, xii). For while in classical physics deviations of variables from their ideal norms are treated independently in a statistically based theory of errors, the variations (statistical distribution) of quantum measurements are systematically linked in one formalism. The apparent puzzle raised by the “reduction of the wave packet” is thus explained via an account of measurement. In the “orthodox” interpretation, the wave function is taken to be the “true” reality, and the act of measurement is seen as changing the incoming wave packet into one of its component eigen functions by an anonymous random choice. The sensible outcome of this change is the eigenvalue of the outgoing wave function which is read from the measuring instrument. (An eigen function, very simply, is a function which has the property that, when an operation is performed on it, the result is that function multiplied by a constant, which is called the eigenvalue.) The agent of this transformation is the human spirit or mind as a doer of mathematics. Heelan also sees this process as depending on the conscious choice and participation of the scientist-subject, but through a much different process. The formulae relate, not to the ideal object in an absolute sense, apart from all human history, culture, and language, but to the physical situation in which the real object is placed, yielding a particular instance of an ensemble or system that admits of numerous potential experimental realizations. The reduction of the wave packet then “is nothing more than the expression of the scientist’s choice and implementation of a measuring process; the post-measurement outcome is different from the means used to prepare the pure state” prior to the implementation of the measurement (Heelan 1965, 184). The wave function describes a situation which is imperfectly described as a fact of the real world; it describes a field of possibilities. That does not mean there is more-to-be-discovered (“hidden variables”) which will make it a part of the real world, nor that only human participation is able to bring it into the real world, but that what becomes a fact of the real world does so by being fleshed out by an instrumental environment to one or another complementary presentations. Heelan’s work therefore shows the value of Continental approaches to the philosophy of science, and exposes the shortcomings of approaches to the philosophy of science which relegate such themes to “somewhere between mysticism and crossword puzzles” (Heelan 1965, x).

c. Evolution

One of the ­most significant discover­ies of 20th century phe­nomenology was of what is variously called em­bodiment, lived body, flesh, or animate form, the experiences of which are that of a unified, self-aware being, and which cannot be understood apart from reflection on con­crete human experience. The body is not a bridge that connects subject and world, but rather a primordial and unsurpassab­le unity productive of there being persons and worlds at all. Husserl was aware even of the significance of evolution and move­ment. His use of the expression “animate organism” betrays a recognition that he was discussing “something not exclusive to humans, that is, something broader and more funda­mental than human animate organism” (Sheets-Johnstone 1999, 132); thus, a need to discuss matters across the evolutionary spec­trum. Failing to examine our evolutionary heritage, in fact, means misconceiving the wellsprin­gs of our humanity (Sheets-Johnstone 1999). Biologists who developed phenomenological treatments of animal behavior include von Uxhull, to whom Heidegger refers in the section on animals in Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics, and Adolph Portmann, both of whom discussed the animal’s umwelt. And Sheets-Johnstone has emphasized that phenome­nology needs to ­examine not only the ontogenet­ic dimension B infant behavior B but also the phylogenetic one. ­­­­­­If we treat human animate form as unique we shirk our phenomenologic­al duties and end up with incomplete and distorted accounts containing implicit and unexamined notions. “[G]enuine understandings of consciousness demand close and serious study of evolution as a history of animate form” (Sheets-Johnstone 1999, 42).

7. Conclusion

Developing a phenomenological account of science is important for the philosophy of science insofar as it has the potential to move us beyond a dead-end in which that discipline has entrapped itself. The dead-end involves having to choose between: on the one hand, assuming that a fixed, stable order pre-exists human beings that is uncovered or approximated in scientific activity; and on the other hand, assuming that the order is imposed by the outside. Each approach is threatened, though in different ways, by the prospect of having to incorporate a role for history and culture. Phenomenology is not as threatened, for its core doctrine of intentionality implies that parts are only understood against the background of wholes and objects against the background of their horizons, and that while we discover objects as invariants within horizons, we also discover ourselves as those worldly embodied presences to whom the objects appear. It thus provides an adequate philosophical foundation for reintroducing history and culture into the philosophy of the natural sciences.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Babich, Babette, 2010. “Early Continental Philosophy of Science,” in A. Schrift, ed., The History of Continental Philosophy, V. 3, Durham: Acumen, 263-286.
  • Cairns, Dorion, 1999. “The Theory of Intentionality in Husserl,” ed. by L. Embree, F. Kersten, and R. Zaner, Journal of the British Society for Phenomenology 32: 116-124.
  • Cassirer, E. 1944. “The Concept of Group and the Theory of Perception,” tr. A. Gurwitsch, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, pp. 1-35.
  • Chasan, S. 1992. “Bibliography of Phenomenological Philosophy of Natural Science,” in Hardy & Embree, 1992, pp. 265-290.
  • Crease, R. 1993. The Play of Nature. Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
  • Crease, R. ed. 1997. Hermeneutics and the Natural Sciences. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Crease, R. 1998. “What is an Artifact?”  Philosophy Today, SPEP Supplement, 160-168.
  • Crease, R. 2009. “Covariant Realism.”  Human Affairs 19, 223-232.
  • Crease, R. 2011. “Philosophy Rules.”  Physics World, August 2011.
  • Ginev, D. 2006. The Context of Constitution: Beyond the Edge of Epistemological Justification. Boston: Boston Studies in the Philosophy of Science.
  • Gurwitsch, A. 1966. “The Last Work of Husserl,” Studies in Phenomenology and Psychology, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1966, pp. 397-447.
  • Gutting, G. (ed.). 2005  Continental Philosophy of Science. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Hardy, L., and Embree, L., 1992. Phenomenology of Natural Science. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Heelan, P. 1965. Quantum Mechanics and Objectivity. The Hague: Nijhoff.
  • Heelan, P. 1967. Horizon, Objectivity and Reality in the Physical Sciences. International Philosophical Quarterly 7, 375-412.
  • Heelan, P. 1969. The Role of Subjectivity in Natural Science, Proc. Amer. Cath. Philos. Assoc. Washington, D.C.
  • Heelan, P. 1970a. Quantum Logic and Classical Logic: Their Respective Roles, Synthese 21: 2 – 33.
  • Heelan, P. 1970b. Complementarity, Context-Dependence and Quantum Logic. Foundations of Physics 1, 95-110.
  • Heelan, P. 1972. Toward a new analysis of the pictorial space of Vincent van Gogh. Art Bull. 54, 478-492.
  • Heelan, P. 1975. Heisenberg and Radical Theoretical Change. Zeitschrift für allgemeine Wissenchaftstheorie 6, 113-136, and following page 136.
  • Heelan, P. 1983. Space-Perception and the Philosophy of Science. Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Heelan, P. 1987. “Husserl’s Later Philosophy of Science,” Philosophy of Science 54: 368-90.
  • Heelan, P. 1988. “Experiment and Theory: Constitution and Reality,” Journal of Philosophy 85, 515-24.
  • Heelan, P. 1991. Hermeneutical Philosophy and the History of Science. In Nature and Scientific Method: William A. Wallace Festschrift, ed. Daniel O. Dahlstrom. Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 23-36.
  • Heelan, P. 1995 An Anti-epistemological or Ontological Interpretation of the Quantum Theory and Theories Like it, in Continental and Postmodern Perspectives in the Philosophy of Science, ed. by B. Babich, D. Bergoffen, and S. Glynn. Aldershot/Brookfield, VT: Avebury Press, 55-68.
  • Heelan, P. 1997. Why a hermeneutical philosophy of the natural sciences? In Crease 1997, 13-40.
  • Heidegger, M. 1977. The Question Concerning Technology, tr. W. Lovitt. New York: Garland.
  • Husserl, E. 1970. The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology, tr. D. Carr. Evanston: Northwestern University Press.
  • Husserl, E. 2001. Analyses Concerning Passive and Active Synthesis: Lectures on Transcendental Logic, tr. A. Steinbock. Boston: Springer.
  • Ihde, D. 1990. Technology and the Lifeworld. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Kockelmans, J. and Kisiel, T., 1970. Phenomenology and the Natural Sciences. Evanston: Northwestern University Press.
  • Mcguire, J. and Tuschanska, B. 2001. Science Unfettered: A Philosophical Study in Sociopolitical Ontology. Columbus: Ohio University Press.
  • Michl, Matthias, Towards a Critical Gadamerian Philosophy of Science, MA thesis, University of Auckland, 2005.
  • Rouse, J. 1987. Knowledge and Power: Toward a Political Philosophy of Science. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Ryckman, T. 2005. The Reign of Relativity: Philosophy in Physics 1915-1925. New York: Oxford.
  • Seebohm, T. 2004. Hermeneutics: Method and Methodology. Springer.
  • Sheets-Johnstone, M. 1999. The Primacy of Movement. Baltimore: Johns Benjamins.
  • Ströker, Elisabeth 1997. The Husserlian Foundations of Science. Boston: Kluwer.
  • Vallor, Shannon, 2009. “The fantasy of third-person science: Phenomenology, ontology, and evidence.”  Phenom. Cogn. Sci. 8: 1-15.

 

Author Information

Robert P. Crease
Email: rcrease@notes.cc.sunysb.edu
Stony Brook University
U. S. A.

Last updated: February 12, 2012 | Originally published: