Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Platonism and Theism

This article explores the compatibility of, and relationship between, the Platonic and Theistic metaphysical visions. According to Platonism, there is a realm of necessarily existing abstract objects comprising a framework of reality beyond the material world. Platonism argues these abstract objects do not originate with creative divine activity. Traditional Theism contends that God is primarily the creator and that God is the source of existence for all realities beyond himself, including the realm of abstract objects.

A primary obstacle between these two perspectives centers upon the origin, nature and existence of abstract objects.  The Platonist contends that these abstract objects exist as a part of the framework of reality and that abstract objects are, by nature, necessary, eternal and uncreated.  These qualities stand as challenges for the Traditional Theist, attempting to reconcile his or her metaphysic with that of Platonism since Traditional Theism contends that God is uniquely necessary, eternal, uncaused, and is the cause of everything that exists. The question, therefore, emerges as to whether these two metaphysical visions are reconcilable and, if not, then why not, and, if so, then how might this be accomplished?

Despite the differences, some Traditional Theists have found Platonism to be a helpful framework by which to convey their conclusions regarding the nature of God and of ultimate reality. Others pursue reconciliation between Theism and Platonism through the proposal of what has been defined as a modalized Platonism, which concludes that necessarily existing abstract objects, nevertheless, have origin in the creative activity of God.  Still others refuse any consideration of Theism in relationship to Platonism.

Table of Contents

  1. The Problem
  2. Platonism and Abstract Objects
    1. Abstract Objects and Necessary Existence
    2. Abstract Objects as Uncreated
    3. Abstract Objects as Eternal
  3. Traditional Theism
    1. God as Creator
    2. Creatio ex Nihilo
    3. Divine Freedom
  4. Emerging Tensions
    1. God as the Origin of Abstract Objects
    2. Abstract Objects as Uncreated
  5. Selected Proposals
    1. James Ross: A Critical Rejection of Platonism
    2. Nicholas Wolterstorff: A Restrictive Idea of Creation
    3. Morris and Menzel: Theistic Activism
    4. Bergman and Brower: Truthmaker Theory
    5. Plantinga: Christian Platonism
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Books
    2. Articles

1. The Problem

Is the platonic metaphysical vision compatible with that of Traditional Theism? Some would contend that the two are compatible, while others would argue to the contrary. Platonists argue that at least some, if not all, abstract objects are uncreated, and exist necessarily and eternally; whereas Traditional Theism asserts that God exists as the uncreated creator of all reality existing beyond himself.

But can this central conclusion of Traditional Theism be reconciled with the Platonic understanding of abstract objects as uncreated, necessarily extant, and eternal? Furthermore, if it is possible to reconcile these worldviews, how might one do so?  Put differently, is there anything, other than himself, that God has not created? Or are we to understand the conclusion that God has created everything in a qualified or restricted sense? Are there things which are not to be included in the Theistic tenet of faith that God is the creator of all things? If so, what things do not result from God’s creative activity?

2. Platonism and Abstract Objects

Contemporary Platonism argues the existence of abstract objects. Abstract objects do not exist in space or time and are entirely non-physical and non-mental. Contemporary Platonism, while deriving from the teachings of Plato, is not directly reflective of the teachings of Plato. Abstract objects are non-physical entities in that they do not exist in the physical world, and they are not compositionally material. Abstract objects are non-mental, meaning that they are not minds or ideas in minds, neither are they disembodied souls or gods. Further, abstract objects are said to be causally inert. In short, Platonism contends that abstract objects exist necessarily, are eternal, and cannot be involved in cause and effect relationships with other objects.

Platonists argue the existence of abstract objects since it makes sense to believe, for instance, that numbers exist and that the only legitimate view of these things is that they are abstract objects. For Platonists, however, there are several categories of things, including physical things, mental things, spiritual things, and the problematic fourth category that includes things such as universals (the wisdom of Socrates, the redness of an apple), relationships (for example, loving, betweenness), propositions (such as 7 + 5 = 12, God is just), and mathematical objects such as numbers and sets. (Menzel, 2001, 3)

As we shall see below, the existence of abstract objects represents a significant challenge for the Christian in particular and for Traditional Theists in general since it is central to these worldviews that God is the creator of everything other than God himself. Generally, however, abstract objects are considered to be like God in that they are said to have always existed, and to always exist in future. Consequently, there is no point at which God is considered to have brought them into being. (Menzel, 2001, 1-5).

But why would the Platonist conclude that God has not created all abstract objects, or has created selected abstract objects?  The response to this question moves us to a consideration of the nature of abstract objects as necessarily extant, uncreated, and eternal, and to briefly address why God’s creation of abstract objects is questionable.

a. Abstract Objects and Necessary Existence

What is meant by the phrase necessary existence? A thing is said to possess necessary existence if it would have existed no matter what or if it would have existed under any possible circumstances. A thing has necessary existence if its non-existence is impossible. For instance, if x is a necessary being, then the non-existence of x is as impossible as a round square or a liquid wine bottle. Human beings are said not to exist necessarily since we would never have existed if our parents had never met and this is a possible circumstance. (Van Inwagen, 1993, 118)

For the Platonist, God’s creation of abstract objects is questionable since they are understood to exist necessarily. As such, abstract objects cannot have not existed.  Consequently, consider whether God can create something existing necessarily? Put differently, does the assertion “x exists necessarily” entail that “x is uncreated”?  If this constitutes a valid assumption, the Platonic understanding of the nature of abstracts objects as necessarily extant excludes the creation of these objects by God or any other external source.

b. Abstract Objects as Uncreated

Second, for the Platonist, God’s creation of abstract objects is questionable since the creative event in Traditional Theism is understood to be a causal event and Platonism understands abstract objects as being uncreated and also as being incapable of entering into causal relations. If, therefore, abstract objects are uncreated, then it seems that God is just one more extant entity existing in the universe and God cannot be the maker of all things, both visible and invisible. (Menzel, 1986)

c. Abstract Objects as Eternal

Third, for the Platonist, God’s creation of abstract objects is questionable due to their being eternal. There is no point at which God could be said to have brought abstract objects into being and, therefore, it is difficult to think of them as creatures since they are not created. If an abstract object has no beginning in time there could not have been a time at which God first created it. (Menzel, 2001, 4-6) If abstract objects are eternal, then they possess a character which parallels God, since according to Traditional Theism God is considered to be eternal.

These platonic affirmations regarding the nature of abstract objects as eternal, necessary and uncreated pose significant challenges to any effort to merge the worldviews of Platonism and Traditional Theism. With this understanding of abstract objects, we now turn to a consideration of the definition of Traditional Theism.

3. Traditional Theism

What are the central tenets of Traditional Theism? First, Traditional Theism and Classical Theism (hereafter referred to as Traditional Theism) are regarded as synonymous. Traditional Theism is supported in the writings of authors such as Moses Maimonides (1135-1204), the Islamic author Avicenna (980-1037), and the Christian author Thomas Aquinas (1224-74). Traditional Theism constitutes what all Jews, Christians and Muslims officially endorsed for many centuries. In addition, Traditional Theists strongly endorse the aseity-sovereignty doctrine, according to which God is the uncreated Creator of all things and all things other than God depend upon God, while God depends on nothing whatsoever. (Davies, 2004, 1) Numerous philosophers have assumed that God is as defenders of Traditional Theism consider him to be, the source of all reality external to himself. From the period of St. Augustine of Hippo (354-430) to the time of G. W. Leibniz (1646-1716), philosophers carried on with the assumption that belief in God is belief in Traditional Theism. This understanding has been endorsed by many theologians, and is represented in the tenets of the Roman Catholic Church. These beliefs were also endorsed and propagated by many of the major Protestant reformers, such as the eighteenth century American Puritan, Jonathan Edwards.

It is to the definition of Traditional Theism that we turn since it is these tenets of faith that represent the primary obstacles in our effort to reconcile the Theistic and Platonic metaphysical perspectives. These include: God as creator, Creation as ex nihilo, and the assertion of divine freedom.

a. God as Creator

Traditional Theism understands God to be the creative source for his own existence, as well as for the existence of all reality existing outside of himself. First, as regards God’s being the creative source for his own existence, if something else created God, and then God created the universe, it would seem to most that this other thing was the real and ultimate source of the universe and that God is nothing more than an intermediary. (Leftow, 1990, 584) Therefore, according to Traditional Theism, there can be no regress of explanations for what exists past the explanations for God’s existence.

Second, Traditional Theism not only endorses the belief that God is responsible for his own existence, but also that God is the Creator of all extant reality beyond himself. Consequently, God is essentially what accounts for the existence of anything beyond God or God is responsible for the existence of something rather than nothing. For Traditional Theism, this notion entails not only that God is responsible for the fact that the universe began to exist, but that God’s work is also responsible for the continued existence of the cosmos. (Davies, 2004, 3)

b. Creatio ex Nihilo

Is there anything that can pre-exist the creative activity of God? Traditional Theists respond to this question with a resounding, “No.”  Aquinas writes,

We must consider not only the emanation of a particular being from a particular agent, but also the emanation of all being from the universal cause, which is God; and this emanation we designate by the name of creation. Now what proceeds by particular emanation is not presupposed to that emanation; as when a man is generated, he was not before, but man is made from not-man, and white from not-white. Hence, if the emanation of the whole universal being from the first principle be considered, it is impossible that any being should be presupposed before this emanation. For nothing is the same as no being. Therefore, as the generation of a man is from the not-being which is not-man, so creation, which is the emanation of all being, is from the not-being which is nothing. (Thomas Aquinas, 1948, Ia, 45, 1.)

Traditional Theism, therefore, understands God as the one who creates ex nihilo, or from nothing. The phrase denotes not that God, in the creative act, worked with something called “nothing” but that God creates that which is external to himself without there being anything prior to his creative act with the exception of himself. The challenging implication of this tenet of Traditional Theism for the Platonic notion of abstract objects is obvious. Traditional Theists counter the Platonic notion that abstract objects are uncreated, contending that if God did not create non-substance items, such as abstract objects, creation would not truly be ex nihilo, since these entities would have accompanied God from all eternity and become aspects of God’s creation, for example, by being unsubstantiated. (Leftow, 1990, 583-84).

c. Divine Freedom

Traditional Theists also argue that God’s choices to act are always carried out in the context of divine freedom, signifying that God is not constrained by anything beyond the laws of logic and His own nature. This is regarded as true by the Traditional Theist since God has established these laws and can alter them if he chooses to do so. Further, God cannot be compelled to choose. If God makes choices in response to human action, so says the Traditional Theist, it is always in his power to prevent actions by any method he chooses.

In short, God always responds to the actions he permits. Consequently, God is always ultimately in control, even in the context of actions that we have created. Therefore, if God carried out his creative activity in the context of complete divine freedom and if God is not and cannot be compelled to act creatively by any external source, then how can God’s freedom be reconciled with the Platonic notion of abstract objects as existing necessarily, since, if abstract objects exist necessarily by God’s creative act, then God was compelled to create them by forces beyond himself. Again, the tension between the two worldviews of Traditional Theism and Platonism becomes apparent.

As this examination of the central tenets of Traditional Theism demonstrates, a challenge exists in the effort to integrate the worldviews of Traditional Theism and Platonism. In summary, Platonists contend that abstract objects are uncreated, whereas Traditional Theists argue that God created all reality; Platonists believe that abstract objects exist necessarily, whereas Traditional Theists contend that God alone is necessarily extant; Platonists propose that abstract objects are eternal, whereas Traditional Theists believe that God alone is eternal. With these contrasts in mind, we turn now to consider specific problems said to emerge from them.

4. Emerging Tensions

As has been observed in this article, the apparent conflict between Platonism and Traditional Theism emerges from the central notion of Traditional Theism, that God is the absolute creator of everything existing distinct from himself; and the central claim of contemporary Platonism, that there exists a realm of necessarily existent abstract objects that could not fail to exist. In considering the tension between abstract objects and Traditional Theism, Gould writes,

To see what the problem is, consider the following three jointly inconsistent claims: (a) there is an infinite realm of abstract objects which are (i) necessary independent beings and are thus (ii) uncreated; (b) only God exists as a necessary independent being; (c) God creates all of reality distinct from him, i.e. only God is uncreated. Statement (a) represents a common understanding of Platonism. Statements (b) and (c) follow from the common theistic claim that to qualify for the title “God,” someone must exist entirely from himself (a se), whereas everything else must be somehow dependent upon him. (Gould, 2010, 2)

A contradiction emerges in consideration of the first and third claims. Proposal (a) posits the existence of abstract objects that are necessary, independent and uncreated. Proposal (c) posits that all reality existing separately from God has its origin in divine creative activity. These two proposals would appear to be mutually exclusive. As a result a rapprochement appears to exist between Platonism and Traditional Theism. Platonism asserts that the existence of all things outside of God is rooted in divine activity. Platonism further argues that there are strong reasons for recognizing in our ontology the existence of a realm of necessarily existent abstract objects. In contradistinction, the Traditional Theist claims that the realm of necessity as well as that of contingency is within the province of divine creation. For the Traditional Theist, therefore, God is, in some fashion, responsible for the existence of all necessarily existent entities, as well as for contingent objects such as stars, planets and electrons, and so forth. (Morris and Menzel, 1986, 153)

But what are the specific problems associated with the effort to merge Platonism and Traditional Theism? Menzel clarifies,

On the [P]latonist conception, most, if not all, abstract objects are thought to exist necessarily. One can either locate these entities outside the scope of God’s creative activity or not. If the former, then it seems the believer must compromise his view of God: rather than the sovereign creator and lord of all things visible and invisible, God turns out to be just one more entity among many in a vast constellation of necessary beings existing independently of his creative power. If the latter, the believer is faced with the problem of what it could possibly mean for God to create an object that is both necessary and abstract. (Menzel, 1987, 1)

Therefore, both horns of this dilemma lead to inevitable challenges. To contend that God created abstract objects has been said to lead to a problem of coherence and a questioning of divine freedom. To contend that God did not create abstract objects has been understood to lead to a problem regarding the sovereignty of God, as well as the uniqueness of God. It is to these matters that we now turn.

a. God as the Origin of Abstract Objects

Consider the conclusion that God created abstract objects. Two objections arise from this proposal.

First, the coherence problem contends that it makes no sense to discuss the origin of things considered to exist necessarily, or that could not have failed to exist, such as abstract objects. (Leftow, 1990, 584)  Supposing that at least some abstract objects exist necessarily, does the truth of this conclusion entail also that God has not created such abstract objects that exist of necessity?

Second, the freedom problem has its origin in the contention of Traditional Theism that God always acts in total freedom. However, if abstract objects exist necessarily, then God had no choice in the matter of their creation. Therefore, God is constrained by something other than himself, a conclusion leading to questions regarding the nature of God as omnipotent and possessing complete freedom. Traditional Theists are quick to affirm that God’s intentions or choices are not constrained by any entity other than God and no chain of true explanations goes beyond a divine intention or choice – or else beyond God’s having his nature and whatever beliefs he has logically before he creates, which may explain certain of God’s intentions and choices. For if nothing other than God forces God to act as he does, the real explanation of God’s actions always lies within God himself. (Leftow, 1990, 584-585)

b. Abstract Objects as Uncreated

Suppose, on the other hand, that God did not create abstract objects. Problems still emerge.  First, if God did not create abstract objects, and if abstract objects are eternal, necessary and uncreated, then these realities are sovereign, as is God who also is eternal, necessary and uncreated, according to the Traditional Theist. God therefore is merely one more object in the vast array of items in the universe, which also includes abstract objects. This dilemma has been designated as the sovereignty problem. (Leftow, 1990, 584)

Further, a necessary object is said to constitute its own reason for existence. It is said to exist of and from itself. Therefore there is no need for a further explanation of the reason for the existence of the necessary object, a belief known as the doctrine of aseity. Aseity, however, has been associated uniquely with God. Therefore, if abstract objects exist a se, then God is not unique, exists alongside abstract objects and, exists as one being among many others existing by their own nature. This problem has been designated as the uniqueness problem.

In consideration of the relationship of Platonism and Traditional Theism, these problems force the Theist to revise, in some fashion, his understanding of the nature of God, reject Platonism altogether, or to seek a manner in which to reconcile the two. We now turn to a consideration of certain of the efforts made by Traditional Theists to merge or reconcile these two major metaphysical perspectives.

5. Selected Proposals

Can the worldviews of Traditional Theism and Platonism be merged in a manner that does not compromise the core tenets of these seemingly divergent metaphysical perspectives? Proposals range from those which reject altogether the notion of compatibility to those that use the Augustinian notion of abstract ideas as products of the intellectual activity of God. The present section considers five prominent proposals.

a. James Ross: A Critical Rejection of Platonism

Ross’ approach represents a rejection of the integration of Platonic and Theistic metaphysical perspectives. Ross presents a highly critical analysis of Platonism. He denies the Platonic notion of the world of eternal forms, opting instead for a thorough-going Aristotelianism, positing the existence of inherent explanatory structures throughout reality, which he understands as “forms”.  According to Ross, if the independent necessary beings of Platonic Theism are other than God, both the simplicity and independence of God are compromised. Ross further posits that by attracting our attention to the Platonic abstractions, which all existing things are supposed to exemplify, we are consequently distracted from the things or objects themselves. (Ross, 1989, 3)

Ross presents a further set of objections to Platonic metaphysics. He points out that the whole set of abstract entities, which all physical objects are supposed to instantiate, are held to be eternal and changeless realities. Within a Theistic point of view, two options exist regarding these abstract entities according to Ross. First, some Theists propose that abstract entities are co-eternal with God because they are in fact one with God, and second, abstract objects are in some other sense ideas in the mind of God and therefore co-eternal with him.

Ross objects that the first possibility is incompatible with an attribute traditionally ascribed to God, that is, God’s simplicity. Ross further objects that the second contention compromises the Traditional Theists’ understanding of God as the source of all extant realities beyond himself.  Third, Ross counters that the divine creation seems not to involve much creativity or choice if it consists completely of God instantiating beings that had already existed for all of eternity, thereby compromising God’s freedom. Further, the whole sense of creatio ex nihilo is, therefore, eliminated if we are to conceive of God as not making things up but only granting physical existence to that which already shared abstract existence co-eternally with him. (Ross, 1989, 3-5)

Ross concludes that there is an inherent incompatibility of Platonism and Traditional Theism since the incorporation of the Platonic worldview, which entails the existence of abstract objects that exist eternally, necessarily, and are uncaused, forces the Traditional Theist to compromise in some fashion his understanding of the nature of God, thereby leading the Theist to a departure from what is regarded as an orthodox understanding of the nature of God.

b. Nicholas Wolterstorff: A Restrictive Idea of Creation

Nicholas Wolterstorff finds a mediating position between the Platonic and Theistic worldviews. He does so, however, by adopting a non-Traditional Theistic perspective, which according to some is an unavoidable consequence of endorsing Platonism. Wolterstorff proposes that necessarily existing abstract objects are in fact not dependent upon God. (Wolterstorff, 1970) and he promotes the view that some properties, specifically those exemplified by God, are to be excluded from God’s creative activity. (Gould, 2010, 134) Wolterstorff goes so far as to propose that God in his nature has properties that he did not bring about. (Wolterstorff, 1970, 292) He writes:

[Consider] the fact that propositions have the property of being either true or false. This property is not a property of God. . . . For the propositions “God exists” and “God is able to create” exemplify being true or false wholly apart from any creative activity on God’s part; in fact, creative ability on his part presupposes that these propositions are true, and thus presupposes that there exists such a property as being either true of false. (Wolterstorff, 1970, 292; Gould, 2010, 135)

As such, Wolterstorff presents what may be termed a restrictive understanding of the creative activity of God. (Wolterstorff, 1970, 292). Wolterstorff, a Christian, argues that the biblical writers simply did not endorse a wide scope reading of the doctrine of creation. He posits that it cannot legitimately be entertained that the biblical writers actually had universals in view when speaking of God’s being the Creator of all things. In addition, he points out that the creator/creature distinction is invoked in Scripture for religious and not theoretical or metaphysical reasons.

Again we see in Wolterstorff’s approach what those who reject Traditional Theism altogether understand to be an inevitable result of endorsing Platonism. Wolterstorff, due to his endorsing of Platonism, is said therefore to have compromised the understanding of Traditional Theism in that God ceases to be the creator of various dimensions of his own identity, as well as of objects existing beyond himself.

c. Morris and Menzel: Theistic Activism

Christopher Menzel and Thomas Morris acknowledge a tension between Theism and Platonism, but seek to reconcile the divergent metaphysical perspectives utilizing the concept of Theistic Activism. Morris and Menzel ask whether God can not only be responsible for the creation of all contingent reality, but also if it can be intelligently and coherently concluded that God can also be creatively responsible for necessary existence and necessary truth. Morris and Menzel proceed to demonstrate what they term as the extraordinary compatibility of core elements of the Platonic and Theistic metaphysical visions. (Morris and Menzel, 1986, 361). Menzel writes,

The model that will be adopted . . . is simply an updated and refined version of Augustine’s doctrine of divine ideas, a view I will call theistic activism, or just activism, for short. Very briefly, the idea is this. On this model, abstract objects are taken to be contents of a certain kind of divine intellective activity in which God is essentially engaged; roughly, they are God’s thoughts, concepts, and perhaps certain other products of God’s mental life. This divine activity is. . . causally efficacious: the abstract objects that exist at any given moment, as products of God’s mental life, exist because God is thinking them; which is just to say that he creates them. (Menzel, 1986)

The authors, therefore, attempt to provide a Theistic ontology which places God at the center and which views everything else as exemplifying a relation of creaturely dependence on God. The authors agree that Platonism, in general, has been viewed historically as incompatible with Western Theism, but they propose that this perceived incompatibility is not insurmountable, and that the notion of Theistic Activism can overcome this apparent incompatibility. Menzel and Morris have two consequent objectives. First, they strive to eliminate the apparent inconsistency between Platonism and Theism. Second, the authors strive to preserve the Platonic notions of abstract objects, such as properties as necessary beings, as eternal, and as uncreated.

Morris and Menzel resolve the tension between abstract objects existing in simultaneity with God, concluding that God, in some fashion, must be creatively responsible for abstract objects. The authors therefore advance Theistic Activism, suggesting that the origination for the framework of reality that includes abstract objects has its source in the divine intellectual activity.

First, they argue that a Theistic Activist will hold God creatively responsible for the entire modal economy, for what is possible as well as what is necessary, and even for what is impossible. As stated above, the authors resort to the Augustinian divine ideas tradition, which concludes that the Platonic framework of reality arises out of the creatively efficacious intellective activity of God. The authors contend that the entire Platonic realm is, therefore, to be understood as deriving from God (Morris and Menzel, 1986, 356).

Second, Morris and Menzel proceed to propose a continuous model of creation, according to which God is always playing a direct causal role in the existence of his creatures and his creative activity is essential to a creatures being at all times, throughout its spacio-temporal existence. This is true regardless of whether God initially causes the created entity to exist. This conclusion is essential to the proposal of Morris and Menzel in that it provides a framework in which it can coherently be argued that God creates absolutely all objects, be they necessary or contingent. (Menzel, 1982, 2)

Third, for the Theistic Activist, God is understood to necessarily create the framework of reality. Morris and Menzel acknowledge the potentially problematic nature of this contention with regard to the activity of God as a free creator. As a resolution to the dilemma posed by the notions of God necessarily creating and God’s freedom, the authors argue that divine freedom must be understood in a radically different fashion from human freedom. Divine freedom is shaped by God’s moral nature. Therefore, God could not have done morally otherwise than was conducted in the act of creation.

Fourth, Morris and Menzel also address the problem of God’s own nature in relationship to this creative activity. The authors give consideration to the question of whether the varied dimensions of God’s own nature are part of the creative framework. The authors have two responses. They reject the proposal of some that God is to be understood as pure being and therefore devoid of determinate attributes such as omnipotence or omniscience. Morris and Menzel opt for the solution that God has a nature and that God creates his own nature. (Morris, 1989)

The writers conclude:

On the view of absolute creation, God is indeed a determinate, existent individual, but one whose status is clearly not just that of one more item in the inventory of reality. He is rather the source of absolutely everything there is: to use Tillich’s own characterization, he is in the deepest sense possible the ground of all-being. (Morris and Menzel, 1986, 360)

d. Bergman and Brower: Truthmaker Theory

Bergman and Brower conclude that Platonism is inconsistent with the central thesis of Traditional Theism, the aseity-dependence doctrine, which holds that God is an absolutely independent being who exists entirely from himself or a se. This central thesis of Traditional Theism led both philosophers and theologians of the Middle Ages to endorse the doctrine of divine simplicity by which God is understood to be an absolutely simple being, completely devoid of any metaphysical complexity. Further, according to the doctrine, God lacks the complexity associated with material or temporal composition, as well as the minimal form of complexity associated with the exemplification of properties.

The inconsistency is most apparent with regard to the tension between Platonism and divine simplicity. Platonism requires all true predications to be explained in terms of properties. Divine simplicity requires God to be identical with each of the things that can be predicated of him. If both are true, then God is identical with each of his properties and is therefore himself a property. This conclusion stands in contrast with the Traditional Theists understanding of God as a person and the conclusion that persons cannot be exemplified. Therefore Bergman and Brower advance that Platonism is inconsistent with the aseity-dependence doctrine itself. They further argue that the rejection of divine simplicity fails to remove this tension. In their conclusion, contemporary philosophers of religion have lost sight of a significant tension existing between Traditional Theism and Platonism, concluding that the two are perfectly compatible.

Bergman and Brower describe Platonism as characterized by two components. They remind that Platonism entails the view that a unified account of predication can be provided in terms of properties or exemplifiables. They also point out that Platonism entails the view that exemplifiables are best conceived of as abstract objects. Bergman and Brower indicate that Traditional Theism has typically addressed the second of these views and they propose that the distinctive aspect of their own argument targets the first. For Bergman and Brower this distinction is all important since it is often concluded that the inconsistency of Platonism and Traditional Theism is avoided merely by rejecting the Platonic view of properties in favor of another, such as the Augustinian view that properties are ideas in the mind of God. They write,

Traditional Theists who are Platonists, therefore, cannot avoid the inconsistency merely by dropping the Platonic conception of properties and replacing it with another – whether it be an Aristotelian conception (according to which there are no unexemplified universals), some form of immanent realism (according to which universals are concrete constituents of things that exemplify them), a nominalistic theory of tropes (according to which properties are concrete individuals), or even the Augustinian account (according to which all exemplifiables are divine concepts). (Bergman and Brower, 2006, 3-4)

However, Bergman and Brower contend that the inconsistency between the two metaphysical perspectives remains as long as the Traditional Theist continues to endorse the second of the two components of Platonism cited above. They further argue that the inconsistency can be resolved in only one of two ways. Either one is compelled to reject Traditional Theism and, therefore, become either a non-Theist or a non-Traditional Theist, or one is compelled to reject any unified account of predication in terms of exemplifiables. Those who desire to maintain the perspective of Traditional Theism are naturally inclined to adopt a unified account of predication and it is at this point that Bergman and Brower propose the alternative of Truthmaker Theory. (Bergman and Brower, 2006, 4)

But what is intended with the designation Truthmaker? The authors point out that the designation is not to be understood in causal terms or literally in terms of a “maker”, but on the contrary it is to be understood in terms of what they regard as a broadly logical entailment. Bergman and Brower begin their defense of Truthmaker Theory with a defense of the Truthmaker Theory of predication. Twenty-first century philosophers typically speak of Truthmakers as entailing the truth of certain statements or as predication by which is intended the truths expressed by them. For instance:

TM: If an entity E is a Truthmaker for a predication P, then “E exists” entails the truth expressed by P.

As a result, Socrates may be regarded as the Truthmaker for the statement “Socrates is human,” and God may be regarded as the Truthmaker for the statement, “God is divine.” If Traditional Theists desire to explain the truth of this predication in terms of something other than properties or exemplifiables, they can do so in terms of Truthmakers since, given that “God is divine” is a case of essential predication and that God necessitates its truth, God is, therefore, a plausible candidate for its Truthmaker. (Bergman and Bower, 2006, 25-27)

Not only do Bergman and Brower defend a Truthmaker Theory of predication, but they also attempt to demonstrate that Truthmaker Theory yields an understanding of the doctrine of divine simplicity that rescues the doctrine from the standard contemporary objection leveled against it, its alleged lack of coherence. Therefore, from the fact that God is simple, the medievals infer that God lacks any accidental or contingent properties and therefore that all true predications of the form “God is F” are cases of essential predication. Therefore, from the truth, “God is divine” it can be inferred that God is identical with his nature or divinity, which conclusion redeems the doctrine of divine simplicity. From the truth “God is good,” it can be inferred that he is identical with his goodness, the essence of the doctrine of divine simplicity. This is true for every other predication of this nature. Further, it can be concluded that just as God is identical with each of these qualities, so also each of these qualities is identical with each of the others, a further component of the doctrine of divine simplicity.

e. Plantinga: Christian Platonism

Alvin Plantinga has been described as a Platonist par–excellence. (Gould, 2010, 108) If Platonism is defined as the metaphysical perspective that there are innumerably many necessarily existing abstract entities, then Plantinga’s Does God Have A Nature? represents a thorough defense of Christian Platonism. (Freddoso, 145-53) Plantinga acknowledges that most Christians believe that God is the uncreated creator of all things and all things depend on him, and he depends upon nothing at all. The created universe presents no problem for this doctrine. God’s creation is dependent on him in a variety of ways and God is in no way dependent upon it. However, what does present a problem for this doctrine is the entire realm of Platonic universals, properties, kinds, propositions, numbers, sets, states of affairs and possible worlds. These things are everlasting, having no beginning or end. Abstract objects are also said to exist necessarily. Their non-existence is impossible. But how then are these abstract objects related to God? Plantinga frames the problem:

According to Augustine, God created everything distinct from him; did he then create these things? Presumably not; they have no beginnings. Are they dependent on him? But how could a thing whose non-existence is impossible . . . depend upon anything for its existence? And what about the characteristics and properties these things display? Does God just find them constituted the way they are? Must he simply put up with their being thus constituted? Are these things, their existence and their character, outside his control?  (Plantinga, 1980, 3-4)

Plantinga acknowledges two conflicting perceptions regarding God and he attempts to reconcile these two perspectives. On the one hand, it is argued that God has control over all things (sovereignty) and we believe that God is uncreated or that God exists a se.  Second, it is argued that certain abstract objects and necessary truths are independent of God and that certain of these, such as omniscience, omnipotence, omni-benevolence, constitute God’s nature. These two conclusions, however, are logically contradictory. How can God have sovereign control over all things and abstract objects exist independently?

Either the first or the second of these intuitions must be false. The entirety of Does God Have A Nature? is dedicated to an attempt to resolve this dilemma. Plantinga first discusses the proposal of Kant. Kant resolved the problem of these two conflicting intuitions through the denial that God has a nature, a conclusion that Plantinga rejects. Plantinga then moves to the consideration of the proposed solution of Thomas Aquinas. Aquinas argues on behalf of the doctrine of divine simplicity, which posits that God has a nature, but that God is identical with his nature. Plantinga concludes that Aquinas’ proposal is also inadequate due to the implications of the doctrine of divine simplicity, which seems to be problematic in that it leads to the denial of the personhood of God, thereby reducing him to an abstract object. Plantinga then turns to nominalism. The nominalist contends that abstract objects, such as properties, do not exist in any real sense. Abstract objects, therefore, are nothing more than designations and do not refer to any objects. Nominalism fails, in Plantinga’s opinion, since it is irrelevant to the real issue, the preservation of God’s absolute control. Plantinga then contends, in light of the failure of the previous approaches, that we may resolve to deny the truth of our intuition that abstract objects are necessary, or eternal, a conclusion which is designated as universal possibilism since the implication of the position is that everything is possible for God, a notion which Plantinga also rejects, since, in his opinion, this conclusion simply seems absurd.

However, for Plantinga the bifurcation between the Theistic notion of God as the uncreated creator of all that exists outside of himself and the Platonic notion of the existence of abstract objects, which exist necessarily and eternally, is not insurmountable. Plantinga endorses a form of Platonic realism. He espouses a conception of properties according to which these abstract objects are a specific type of abstract entity, namely, universals. Plantinga, proposes the following solution to the dilemma,

Augustine saw in Plato a vir sapientissimus et eruditissimus (Contra Academicos III, 17); yet he felt obliged to transform Plato’s theory of ideas in such a way that these abstract objects become . . . part of God, perhaps identical with his intellect. It is easy to see why Augustine took such a course, and easy to see why most later medieval thinkers adopted similar views. For the alternative seems to limit God in an important way; the existence and necessity of these things distinct from him seems incompatible with his sovereignty. (Plantinga, 1980, 5)

Plantinga, therefore, concludes that there may be some sense of dependence between God and abstract objects, that these abstract objects depend on God asymmetrically, and that they are the result of God’s intellective activity.

From the preceding overview we see that there exists a tension between the central notion of Traditional Theism, that God exists as the uncreated creator and that all objects existing beyond God have the source of their being in the creative activity of God, and the central notion of Platonism, that there exists a realm of abstract objects which are uncreated, and exist necessarily and eternally. Furthermore, we have seen that there exists a variety of proposals ranging from those that reject altogether the notion that these two distinctive worldviews are reconcilable, to those that would argue on behalf of their compatibility. (Freddosso, 1983)

6. References and Further Reading

a. Books

  • Aquinas, T. (1948). Summa Theologiae, trans. Fathers of the English Dominican Province. U.S.A: Christian Classics.
  • Brown, C. (1968). Philosophy and the Christian Faith. Illinois: Intervarsity Press.
    • Provides an examination of the historical interaction of philosophical thought and Christian theology.
  • Campbell, K. (1990). Abstract Particulars. Basil Blackwell Ltd.
    • Provides an in-depth analysis of Abstract Particulars.
  • Davies, B. (2004) An Introduction to the Philosophy of Religion (3rd ed.). New York: Oxford University Press.
    • An excellent introduction to the basic issues in Philosophy of Religion.
  • Gerson, L. P. (1990). Plotinus: The Arguments of the Philosophers. New York: Routledge.
    • Provides an analysis of the development of Platonic philosophy and its incorporation into Christian Theology.
  • Morris, T. (1989) Anselmian Explorations: Essays in Philosophical Theology. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Plantinga, A. (1980). Does God Have a Nature? Milwaukee, Wisconsin: Marquette University Press.
    • Discusses the relationship of God to abstract objects.
  • Plantinga, A. (2000). Warranted Christian Belief. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • Explores the intellectual validity of Christian faith.
  • Van Inwagen, P. (1993) Metaphysics. Westview Press.
    • An in-depth exploration of the dimensions of metaphysics.
  • Wolterstorff, N. (1970). On Universals: An Essay in Ontology. University of Chicago.
    • Explores the nature of Platonic thought, the tenets of Traditional Theism.

b. Articles

  • Bergman, M., Brower, J. E. (2006). “A Theistic Argument against Platonism.” Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, 2, 357-386.
    • Discusses the logical inconsistency between Theism and Platonism by virtue of the aseity dependence doctrine.
  • Brower, J. E. “Making Sense of Divine Simplicity.” Unpublished.
    • Presents an in-depth analysis of the nature of divine simplicity.
  • Freddoso, A. (1983). “Review of Plantinga’s ‘Does God Have a Nature?’.” Christian Scholars Review, 12, 78-83.
    • An excellent and helpful review of Plantinga’s most significant work.
  • Gould, P. (2010). “A Defense of Platonic Theism: Dissertation.” Purdue University West.
    • A defense of Platonic Theism, which seeks to remain faithful to the Theistic tradition.
  • Leftow, B. (1990). “Is God an Abstract Object?.” Nous, 24, 581-598.
    • Strives to demonstrate that the Identity Thesis follows from a basic Theistic belief.
  • Menzel, C. (2001). “God and Mathematical Objects.” Bradley, J., Howell, R. (Eds.). Mathematics in a Postmodern Age: A Christian Perspective. Eerdman’s.
  • Menzel, C. (1987). “Theism, Platonism, and the Metaphysics of Mathematics.” Faith and Philosophy, 4(4), 1-22.
  • Morris, T., Menzel, C. (1986). “Absolute Creation.” American philosophical quarterly, 23, 353-362.
    • Seeks to reconcile the divergent metaphysical perspectives utilizing the concept of Theistic Activism
  • Plantinga, A. (1982). “How to be an Anti-Realist.” Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association, 56 (1), 47-70.
    • An insightful and helpful discussion of Plantinga’s rejection of contemporary anti-realism and unbridled realism.
  • Ross, J. (1989). “The Crash of Modal Metaphysics.” Review of Metaphysics, 43, 251-79.
    • Addresses Quantified Modal Logic as at one time promising for metaphysics.
  • Ross, J. (1983). Creation II. “In The Existence and Nature of God.” A. J. Freddoso, (Ed). Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Van Inwagen, P. (2009). “God and Other Uncreated Things.” Timpe, K. (Ed). Metaphysics and God: Essays in Honor of Eleonore Stump, 3-20.
    • Addresses the question regarding whether there is anything other than himself that God has not created.
  • Van Inwagen, P. (1988). “A Theory of Properties.” Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, 1, 107-138.
    • Explores the rationality of belief in abstract objects in general and properties in particular.

 

Author Information

Eddy Carder
Email: efcarder@pvamu.edu
Prairie View A & M University
U. S. A.

Last updated: January 6, 2012 | Originally published: