Plato is one of the world’s best known and most widely read and studied philosophers. He was the student of Socrates and the teacher of Aristotle, and he wrote in the middle of the fourth century B.C.E. in ancient Greece. Though influenced primarily by Socrates, to the extent that Socrates is usually the main character in many of Plato’s writings, he was also influenced by Heraclitus, Parmenides, and the Pythagoreans.
There are varying degrees of controversy over which of Plato’s works are authentic, and in what order they were written, due to their antiquity and the manner of their preservation through time. Nonetheless, his earliest works are generally regarded as the most reliable of the ancient sources on Socrates, and the character Socrates that we know through these writings is considered to be one of the greatest of the ancient philosophers.
Plato’s middle to later works, including his most famous work, the Republic, are generally regarded as providing Plato’s own philosophy, where the main character in effect speaks for Plato himself. These works blend ethics, political philosophy, moral psychology, epistemology, and metaphysics into an interconnected and systematic philosophy. It is most of all from Plato that we get the theory of Forms, according to which the world we know through the senses is only an imitation of the pure, eternal, and unchanging world of the Forms. Plato’s works also contain the origins of the familiar complaint that the arts work by inflaming the passions, and are mere illusions. We also are introduced to the ideal of “Platonic love:” Plato saw love as motivated by a longing for the highest Form of beauty—The Beautiful Itself, and love as the motivational power through which the highest of achievements are possible. Because they tended to distract us into accepting less than our highest potentials, however, Plato mistrusted and generally advised against physical expressions of love.
It is widely accepted that Plato, the Athenian philosopher, was born in 428-7 B.C.E and died at the age of eighty or eighty-one at 348-7 B.C.E. These dates, however, are not entirely certain, for according to Diogenes Laertius (D.L.), following Apollodorus’ chronology, Plato was born the year Pericles died, was six years younger than Isocrates, and died at the age of eighty-four (D.L. 3.2-3.3). If Plato’s date of death is correct in Apollodorus’ version, Plato would have been born in 430 or 431. Diogenes’ claim that Plato was born the year Pericles died would put his birth in 429. Later (at 3.6), Diogenes says that Plato was twenty-eight when Socrates was put to death (in 399), which would, again, put his year of birth at 427. In spite of the confusion, the dates of Plato’s life we gave above, which are based upon Eratosthenes’ calculations, have traditionally been accepted as accurate.
Little can be known about Plato’s early life. According to Diogenes, whose testimony is notoriously unreliable, Plato’s parents were Ariston and Perictione (or Potone—see D. L. 3.1). Both sides of the family claimed to trace their ancestry back to Poseidon (D.L. 3.1). Diogenes’ report that Plato’s birth was the result of Ariston’s rape of Perictione (D.L. 3.1) is a good example of the unconfirmed gossip in which Diogenes so often indulges. We can be confident that Plato also had two older brothers, Glaucon and Adeimantus, and a sister, Potone, by the same parents (see D.L. 3.4). (W. K. C. Guthrie, A History of Greek Philosophy, vol. 4, 10 n. 4 argues plausibly that Glaucon and Adeimantus were Plato’s older siblings.) After Ariston’s death, Plato’s mother married her uncle, Pyrilampes (in Plato’s Charmides, we are told that Pyrilampes was Charmides’ uncle, and Charmides was Plato’s mother’s brother), with whom she had another son, Antiphon, Plato’s half-brother (see Plato, Parmenides 126a-b).
Plato came from one of the wealthiest and most politically active families in Athens. Their political activities, however, are not seen as laudable ones by historians. One of Plato’s uncles (Charmides) was a member of the notorious “Thirty Tyrants,” who overthrew the Athenian democracy in 404 B.C.E. Charmides’ own uncle, Critias, was the leader of the Thirty. Plato’s relatives were not exclusively associated with the oligarchic faction in Athens, however. His stepfather Pyrilampes was said to have been a close associate of Pericles, when he was the leader of the democratic faction.
Plato’s actual given name was apparently Aristocles, after his grandfather. “Plato” seems to have started as a nickname (for platos, or “broad”), perhaps first given to him by his wrestling teacher for his physique, or for the breadth of his style, or even the breadth of his forehead (all given in D.L. 3.4). Although the name Aristocles was still given as Plato’s name on one of the two epitaphs on his tomb (see D.L. 3.43), history knows him as Plato.
When Socrates died, Plato left Athens, staying first in Megara, but then going on to several other places, including perhaps Cyrene, Italy, Sicily, and even Egypt. Strabo (17.29) claims that he was shown where Plato lived when he visited Heliopolis in Egypt. Plato occasionally mentions Egypt in his works, but not in ways that reveal much of any consequence (see, for examples, Phaedrus 274c-275b; Philebus 19b).
Better evidence may be found for his visits to Italy and Sicily, especially in the Seventh Letter. According to the account given there, Plato first went to Italy and Sicily when he was “about forty” (324a). While he stayed in Syracuse, he became the instructor to Dion, brother-in-law of the tyrant Dionysius I. According to doubtful stories from later antiquity, Dionysius became annoyed with Plato at some point during this visit, and arranged to have the philosopher sold into slavery (Diod. 15.7; Plut. Dion 5; D.L. 3.19-21).
In any event, Plato returned to Athens and founded a school, known as the Academy. (This is where we get our word, “academic.” The Academy got its name from its location, a grove of trees sacred to the hero Academus—or Hecademus [see D.L. 3.7]—a mile or so outside the Athenian walls; the site can still be visited in modern Athens, but visitors will find it depressingly void of interesting monuments or features.) Except for two more trips to Sicily, the Academy seems to have been Plato’s home base for the remainder of his life.
The first of Plato’s remaining two Sicilian adventures came after Dionysius I died and his young son, Dionysius II, ascended to the throne. His uncle/brother-in-law Dion persuaded the young tyrant to invite Plato to come to help him become a philosopher-ruler of the sort described in the Republic. Although the philosopher (now in his sixties) was not entirely persuaded of this possibility (Seventh Letter 328b-c), he agreed to go. This trip, like the last one, however, did not go well at all. Within months, the younger Dionysius had Dion sent into exile for sedition (Seventh Letter 329c, Third Letter 316c-d), and Plato became effectively under house arrest as the “personal guest” of the dictator (Seventh Letter 329c-330b).
Plato eventually managed to gain the tyrant’s permission to return to Athens (Seventh Letter 338a), and he and Dion were reunited at the Academy (Plut. Dion 17). Dionysius agreed that “after the war” (Seventh Letter 338a; perhaps the Lucanian War in 365 B.C.E.), he would invite Plato and Dion back to Syracuse (Third Letter 316e-317a, Seventh Letter 338a-b). Dion and Plato stayed in Athens for the next four years (c. 365-361 B.C.E.). Dionysius then summoned Plato, but wished for Dion to wait a while longer. Dion accepted the condition and encouraged Plato to go immediately anyway (Third Letter 317a-b, Seventh Letter 338b-c), but Plato refused the invitation, much to the consternation of both Syracusans (Third Letter 317a, Seventh Letter 338c). Hardly a year had passed, however, before Dionysius sent a ship, with one of Plato’s Pythagorean friends (Archedemus, an associate of Archytas—see Seventh Letter 339a-b and next section) on board begging Plato to return to Syracuse. Partly because of his friend Dion’s enthusiasm for the plan, Plato departed one more time to Syracuse. Once again, however, things in Syracuse were not at all to Plato’s liking. Dionysius once again effectively imprisoned Plato in Syracuse, and the latter was only able to escape again with help from his Tarentine friends ( Seventh Letter 350a-b).
Dion subsequently gathered an army of mercenaries and invaded his own homeland. But his success was short-lived: he was assassinated and Sicily was reduced to chaos. Plato, perhaps now completely disgusted with politics, returned to his beloved Academy, where he lived out the last thirteen years of his life. According to Diogenes, Plato was buried at the school he founded (D.L. 3.41). His grave, however, has not yet been discovered by archeological investigations.
Aristotle and Diogenes agree that Plato had some early association with either the philosophy of Heraclitus of Ephesus, or with one or more of that philosopher’s followers (see Aristotle Metaph. 987a32, D.L. 3.4-3.5). The effects of this influence can perhaps be seen in the mature Plato’s conception of the sensible world as ceaselessly changing.
There can be no doubt that Plato was also strongly influenced by Parmenides and Zeno (both of Elea), in Plato’s theory of the Forms, which are plainly intended to satisfy the Parmenidean requirement of metaphysical unity and stability in knowable reality. Parmenides and Zeno also appear as characters in his dialogue, the Parmenides. Diogenes Laertius also notes other important influences:
He mixed together in his works the arguments of Heracleitus, the Pythagoreans, and Socrates. Regarding the sensibles, he borrows from Heraclitus; regarding the intelligibles, from Pythagoras; and regarding politics, from Socrates. (D.L. 3.8)
A little later, Diogenes makes a series of comparisons intended to show how much Plato owed to the comic poet, Epicharmus (3.9-3.17).
Diogenes Laertius (3.6) claims that Plato visited several Pythagoreans in Southern Italy (one of whom, Theodorus, is also mentioned as a friend to Socrates in Plato’s Theaetetus). In the Seventh Letter, we learn that Plato was a friend of Archytas of Tarentum, a well-known Pythagorean statesman and thinker (see 339d-e), and in the Phaedo, Plato has Echecrates, another Pythagorean, in the group around Socrates on his final day in prison. Plato’s Pythagorean influences seem especially evident in his fascination with mathematics, and in some of his political ideals (see Plato’s political philosophy), expressed in various ways in several dialogues.
Nonetheless, it is plain that no influence on Plato was greater than that of Socrates. This is evident not only in many of the doctrines and arguments we find in Plato’s dialogues, but perhaps most obviously in Plato’s choice of Socrates as the main character in most of his works. According to the Seventh Letter, Plato counted Socrates “the justest man alive” (324e). According to Diogenes Laertius, the respect was mutual (3.5).
Supposedly possessed of outstanding intellectual and artistic ability even from his youth, according to Diogenes, Plato began his career as a writer of tragedies, but hearing Socrates talk, he wholly abandoned that path, and even burned a tragedy he had hoped to enter in a dramatic competition (D.L. 3.5). Whether or not any of these stories is true, there can be no question of Plato’s mastery of dialogue, characterization, and dramatic context. He may, indeed, have written some epigrams; of the surviving epigrams attributed to him in antiquity, some may be genuine.
Plato was not the only writer of dialogues in which Socrates appears as a principal character and speaker. Others, including Alexamenos of Teos (Aristotle Poetics 1447b11; De Poetis fr. 3 Ross [=Rose2 72]), Aeschines (D.L. 2.60-63, 3.36, Plato Apology 33e), Antisthenes (D.L. 3.35, 6; Plato, Phaedo 59b; Xenophon, Memorabilia 2.4.5, 3.2.17), Aristippus (D.L. 2.65-104, 3.36, Plato Phaedo 59c), Eucleides (D.L. 2.106-112), Phaedo (D.L. 2.105; Plato, Phaedo passim), Simon (D.L. 122-124), and especially Xenophon (see D.L. 2.48-59, 3.34), were also well-known “Socratics” who composed such works. A recent study of these, by Charles H. Kahn (1996, 1-35), concludes that the very existence of the genre—and all of the conflicting images of Socrates we find given by the various authors—shows that we cannot trust as historically reliable any of the accounts of Socrates given in antiquity, including those given by Plato.
But it is one thing to claim that Plato was not the only one to write Socratic dialogues, and quite another to hold that Plato was only following the rules of some genre of writings in his own work. Such a claim, at any rate, is hardly established simply by the existence of these other writers and their writings. We may still wish to ask whether Plato’s own use of Socrates as his main character has anything at all to do with the historical Socrates. The question has led to a number of seemingly irresolvable scholarly disputes. At least one important ancient source, Aristotle, suggests that at least some of the doctrines Plato puts into the mouth of the “Socrates” of the “early” or “Socrates” dialogues are the very ones espoused by the historical Socrates. Because Aristotle has no reason not to be truthful about this issue, many scholars believe that his testimony provides a solid basis for distinguishing the “Socrates” of the “early” dialogues from the character by that name in Plato’s supposedly later works, whose views and arguments Aristotle suggests are Plato’s own.
One way to approach this issue has been to find some way to arrange the dialogues into at least relative dates. It has frequently been assumed that if we can establish a relative chronology for when Plato wrote each of the dialogues, we can provide some objective test for the claim that Plato represented Socrates more accurately in the earlier dialogues, and less accurately in the later dialogues.
In antiquity, the ordering of Plato’s dialogues was given entirely along thematic lines. The best reports of these orderings (see Diogenes Laertius’ discussion at 3.56-62) included many works whose authenticity is now either disputed or unanimously rejected. The uncontroversial internal and external historical evidence for a chronological ordering is relatively slight. Aristotle (Politics 2.6.1264b24-27), Diogenes Laertius (3.37), and Olympiodorus (Prol. 6.24) state that Plato wrote the Laws after the Republic. Internal references in the Sophist (217a) and the Statesman (also known as the Politicus; 257a, 258b) show the Statesman to come after the Sophist. The Timaeus (17b-19b) may refer to Republic as coming before it, and more clearly mentions the Critias as following it (27a). Similarly, internal references in the Sophist (216a, 217c) and the Theaetetus (183e) may be thought to show the intended order of three dialogues: Parmenides, Theaetetus, and Sophist. Even so, it does not follow that these dialogues were actually written in that order. At Theaetetus 143c, Plato announces through his characters that he will abandon the somewhat cumbersome dialogue form that is employed in his other writings. Since the form does not appear in a number of other writings, it is reasonable to infer that those in which it does not appear were written after the Theaetetus.
Scholars have sought to augment this fairly scant evidence by employing different methods of ordering the remaining dialogues. One such method is that of stylometry, by which various aspects of Plato’s diction in each dialogue are measured against their uses and frequencies in other dialogues. Originally done by laborious study by individuals, stylometry can now be done more efficiently with assistance by computers. Another, even more popular, way to sort and group the dialogues is what is called “content analysis,” which works by finding and enumerating apparent commonalities or differences in the philosophical style and content of the various dialogues. Neither of these general approaches has commanded unanimous assent among scholars, and it is unlikely that debates about this topic can ever be put entirely to rest. Nonetheless, most recent scholarship seems to assume that Plato’s dialogues can be sorted into different groups, and it is not unusual for books and articles on the philosophy of Socrates to state that by “Socrates” they mean to refer to the character in Plato’s “early” or Socratic dialogues, as if this Socrates was as close to the historical Socrates as we are likely to get. (We have more to say on this subject in the next section.) Perhaps the most thorough examination of this sort can be found in Gregory Vlastos’s, Socrates: Ironist and Moral Philosopher (Cambridge and Cornell, 1991, chapters 2-4), where ten significant differences between the “Socrates” of Plato’s “early” dialogues and the character by that name in the later dialogues are noted. Our own view of the probable dates and groups of dialogues, which to some extent combine the results of stylometry and content analysis, is as follows (all lists but the last in alphabetical order):
(All after the death of Socrates, but before Plato’s first trip to Sicily in 387 B.C.E.):
Apology, Charmides, Crito, Euthydemus, Euthyphro, Gorgias, Hippias Major, Hippias Minor, Ion, Laches, Lysis, Protagoras, Republic Bk. I.
(Either at the end of the early group or at the beginning of the middle group, c. 387-380 B.C.E.):
Cratylus, Menexenus, Meno
(c. 380-360 B.C.E.)
Phaedo, Republic Bks. II-X, Symposium
(Either at the end of the middle group, or the beginning of the late group, c. 360-355 B.C.E.)
Parmenides, Theaetetus, Phaedrus
(c. 355-347 B.C.E.; possibly in chronological order)
Sophist, Statesman, Philebus, Timaeus, Critias, Laws
Except for the Timaeus, all of Plato’s works were lost to the Western world until medieval times, preserved only by Moslem scholars in the Middle East. In 1578 Henri Estienne (whose Latinized name was Stephanus) published an edition of the dialogues in which each page of the text is separated into five sections (labeled a, b, c, d, and e). The standard style of citation for Platonic texts includes the name of the text, followed by Stephanus page and section numbers (e.g. Republic 511d). Scholars sometimes also add numbers after the Stephanus section letters, which refer to line numbers within the Stephanus sections in the standard Greek edition of the dialogues, the Oxford Classical texts.
Several other works, including thirteen letters and eighteen epigrams, have been attributed to Plato. These other works are generally called the spuria and the dubia. The spuria were collected among the works of Plato but suspected as frauds even in antiquity. The dubia are those presumed authentic in later antiquity, but which have more recently been doubted.
Ten of the spuria are mentioned by Diogenes Laertius at 3.62. Five of these are no longer extant: the Midon or Horse-breeder, Phaeacians, Chelidon, Seventh Day, and Epimenides. Five others do exist: the Halcyon, Axiochus, Demodocus, Eryxias, and Sisyphus. To the ten Diogenes Laertius lists, we may uncontroversially add On Justice, On Virtue, and the Definitions, which was included in the medieval manuscripts of Plato’s work, but not mentioned in antiquity.
Works whose authenticity was also doubted in antiquity include the Second Alcibiades (or Alcibiades II), Epinomis, Hipparchus, and Rival Lovers (also known as either Rivals or Lovers), and these are sometimes defended as authentic today. If any are of these are authentic, the Epinomis would be in the late group, and the others would go with the early or early transitional groups.
Seventeen or eighteen epigrams (poems appropriate to funerary monuments or other dedications) are also attributed to Plato by various ancient authors. Most of these are almost certainly not by Plato, but some few may be authentic. Of the ones that could be authentic (Cooper 1997, 1742 names 1, 2, 7, and especially 3 as possibly authentic), one (1) is a love poem dedicated to a student of astronomy, perhaps at the Academy, another (2) appears to be a funerary inscription for that same student, another (3) is a funerary inscription for Plato’s Syracusan friend, Dion (in which the author confesses that Dion “maddened my heart with erôs“), and the last (7) is a love poem to a young woman or girl. None appear to provide anything of great philosophical interest.
The dubia present special risks to scholars: On the one hand, any decision not to include them among the authentic dialogues creates the risk of losing valuable evidence for Plato’s (or perhaps Socrates’) philosophy; on the other hand, any decision to include them creates the risk of obfuscating the correct view of Plato’s (or Socrates’) philosophy, by including non-Platonic (or non-Socratic) elements within that philosophy. The dubia include the First Alcibiades (or Alcibiades I), Minos, and Theages, all of which, if authentic, would probably go with the early or early transitional groups, the Cleitophon, which might be early, early transitional, or middle, and the letters, of which the Seventh seems the best candidate for authenticity. Some scholars have also suggested the possibility that the Third may also be genuine. If any are authentic, the letters would appear to be works of the late period, with the possible exception of the Thirteenth Letter, which could be from the middle period.
Nearly all of the dialogues now accepted as genuine have been challenged as inauthentic by some scholar or another. In the 19th Century in particular, scholars often considered arguments for and against the authenticity of dialogues whose authenticity is now only rarely doubted. Of those we listed as authentic, above (in the early group), only the Hippias Major continues occasionally to be listed as inauthentic. The strongest evidence against the authenticity of the Hippias Major is the fact that it is never mentioned in any of the ancient sources. However, relative to how much was actually written in antiquity, so little now remains that our lack of ancient references to this dialogue does not seem to be an adequate reason to doubt its authenticity. In style and content, it seems to most contemporary scholars to fit well with the other Platonic dialogues.
Although no one thinks that Plato simply recorded the actual words or speeches of Socrates verbatim, the argument has been made that there is nothing in the speeches Socrates makes in the Apology that he could have not uttered at the historical trial. At any rate, it is fairly common for scholars to treat Plato’s Apology as the most reliable of the ancient sources on the historical Socrates. The other early dialogues are certainly Plato’s own creations. But as we have said, most scholars treat these as representing more or less accurately the philosophy and behavior of the historical Socrates—even if they do not provide literal historical records of actual Socratic conversations. Some of the early dialogues include anachronisms that prove their historical inaccuracy.
It is possible, of course, that the dialogues are all wholly Plato’s inventions and have nothing at all to do with the historical Socrates. Contemporary scholars generally endorse one of the following four views about the dialogues and their representation of Socrates:
Now, some scholars who are skeptical about the entire program of dating the dialogues into chronological groups, and who are thus strictly speaking not historicists (see, for example, Cooper 1997, xii-xvii) nonetheless accept the view that the “early” works are “Socratic” in tone and content. With few exceptions, however, scholars agreed that if we are unable to distinguish any group of dialogues as early or “Socratic,” or even if we can distinguish a separate set of “Socratic” works but cannot identify a coherent philosophy within those works, it makes little sense to talk about “the philosophy of historical Socrates” at all. There is just too little (and too little that is at all interesting) to be found that could reliably be attributed to Socrates from any other ancient authors. Any serious philosophical interest in Socrates, then, must be pursued through study of Plato’s early or “Socratic” dialogues.
In the dialogues generally accepted as early (or “Socratic”), the main character is always Socrates. Socrates is represented as extremely agile in question-and-answer, which has come to be known as “the Socratic method of teaching,” or “the elenchus” (or elenchos, from the Greek term for refutation), with Socrates nearly always playing the role as questioner, for he claimed to have no wisdom of his own to share with others. Plato’s Socrates, in this period, was adept at reducing even the most difficult and recalcitrant interlocutors to confusion and self-contradiction. In the Apology, Socrates explains that the embarrassment he has thus caused to so many of his contemporaries is the result of a Delphic oracle given to Socrates’ friend Chaerephon (Apology 21a-23b), according to which no one was wiser than Socrates. As a result of his attempt to discern the true meaning of this oracle, Socrates gained a divinely ordained mission in Athens to expose the false conceit of wisdom. The embarrassment his “investigations” have caused to so many of his contemporaries—which Socrates claims was the root cause of his being brought up on charges (Apology 23c-24b)—is thus no one’s fault but his “victims,” for having chosen to live “the unexamined life” (see 38a).
The way that Plato’s represents Socrates going about his “mission” in Athens provides a plausible explanation both of why the Athenians would have brought him to trial and convicted him in the troubled years after the end of the Peloponnesian War, and also of why Socrates was not really guilty of the charges he faced. Even more importantly, however, Plato’s early dialogues provide intriguing arguments and refutations of proposed philosophical positions that interest and challenge philosophical readers. Platonic dialogues continue to be included among the required readings in introductory and advanced philosophy classes, not only for their ready accessibility, but also because they raise many of the most basic problems of philosophy. Unlike most other philosophical works, moreover, Plato frames the discussions he represents in dramatic settings that make the content of these discussions especially compelling. So, for example, in the Crito, we find Socrates discussing the citizen’s duty to obey the laws of the state as he awaits his own legally mandated execution in jail, condemned by what he and Crito both agree was a terribly wrong verdict, the result of the most egregious misapplication of the very laws they are discussing. The dramatic features of Plato’s works have earned attention even from literary scholars relatively uninterested in philosophy as such. Whatever their value for specifically historical research, therefore, Plato’s dialogues will continue to be read and debated by students and scholars, and the Socrates we find in the early or “Socratic” dialogues will continue to be counted among the greatest Western philosophers.
The philosophical positions most scholars agree can be found directly endorsed or at least suggested in the early or “Socratic” dialogues include the following moral or ethical views:
Socrates also appears to argue for, or directly makes a number of related psychological views:
In these dialogues, we also find Socrates represented as holding certain religious beliefs, such as:
In addition, Plato’s Socrates in the early dialogues may plausibly be regarded as having certain methodological or epistemological convictions, including:
Scholarly attempts to provide relative chronological orderings of the early transitional and middle dialogues are problematical because all agree that the main dialogue of the middle period, the Republic, has several features that make dating it precisely especially difficult. As we have already said, many scholars count the first book of the Republic as among the early group of dialogues. But those who read the entire Republic will also see that the first book also provides a natural and effective introduction to the remaining books of the work. A recent study by Debra Nails (“The Dramatic Date of Plato’s Republic,” The Classical Journal 93.4, 1998, 383-396) notes several anachronisms that suggest that the process of writing (and perhaps re-editing) the work may have continued over a very long period. If this central work of the period is difficult to place into a specific context, there can be no great assurance in positioning any other works relative to this one.
Nonetheless, it does not take especially careful study of the transitional and middle period dialogues to notice clear differences in style and philosophical content from the early dialogues. The most obvious change is the way in which Plato seems to characterize Socrates: In the early dialogues, we find Socrates simply asking questions, exposing his interlocutors’ confusions, all the while professing his own inability to shed any positive light on the subject, whereas in the middle period dialogues, Socrates suddenly emerges as a kind of positive expert, willing to affirm and defend his own theories about many important subjects. In the early dialogues, moreover, Socrates discusses mainly ethical subjects with his interlocutors—with some related religious, methodological, and epistemological views scattered within the primarily ethical discussions. In the middle period, Plato’s Socrates’ interests expand outward into nearly every area of inquiry known to humankind. The philosophical positions Socrates advances in these dialogues are vastly more systematical, including broad theoretical inquiries into the connections between language and reality (in the Cratylus), knowledge and explanation (in the Phaedo and Republic, Books V-VII). Unlike the Socrates of the early period, who was the “wisest of men” only because he recognized the full extent of his own ignorance, the Socrates of the middle period acknowledges the possibility of infallible human knowledge (especially in the famous similes of light, the simile of the sun and good and the simile of the divided line in Book VI and the parable of the cave in Book VII of the Republic), and this becomes possible in virtue of a special sort of cognitive contact with the Forms or Ideas (eidê ), which exist in a supra-sensible realm available only to thought. This theory of Forms, introduced and explained in various contexts in each of the middle period dialogues, is perhaps the single best-known and most definitive aspect of what has come to be known as Platonism.
In many of his dialogues, Plato mentions supra-sensible entities he calls “Forms” (or “Ideas”). So, for example, in the Phaedo, we are told that particular sensible equal things—for example, equal sticks or stones (see Phaedo 74a-75d)—are equal because of their “participation” or “sharing” in the character of the Form of Equality, which is absolutely, changelessly, perfectly, and essentially equal. Plato sometimes characterizes this participation in the Form as a kind of imaging, or approximation of the Form. The same may be said of the many things that are greater or smaller and the Forms of Great and Small (Phaedo 75c-d), or the many tall things and the Form of Tall (Phaedo 100e), or the many beautiful things and the Form of Beauty (Phaedo 75c-d, Symposium 211e, Republic V.476c). When Plato writes about instances of Forms “approximating” Forms, it is easy to infer that, for Plato, Forms are exemplars. If so, Plato believes that The Form of Beauty is perfect beauty, the Form of Justice is perfect justice, and so forth. Conceiving of Forms in this way was important to Plato because it enabled the philosopher who grasps the entities to be best able to judge to what extent sensible instances of the Forms are good examples of the Forms they approximate.
Scholars disagree about the scope of what is often called “the theory of Forms,” and question whether Plato began holding that there are only Forms for a small range of properties, such as tallness, equality, justice, beauty, and so on, and then widened the scope to include Forms corresponding to every term that can be applied to a multiplicity of instances. In the Republic, he writes as if there may be a great multiplicity of Forms—for example, in Book X of that work, we find him writing about the Form of Bed (see Republic X.596b). He may have come to believe that for any set of things that shares some property, there is a Form that gives unity to the set of things (and univocity to the term by which we refer to members of that set of things). Knowledge involves the recognition of the Forms (Republic V.475e-480a), and any reliable application of this knowledge will involve the ability compare the particular sensible instantiations of a property to the Form.
In the early transitional dialogue, the Meno, Plato has Socrates introduce the Orphic and Pythagorean idea that souls are immortal and existed before our births. All knowledge, he explains, is actually recollected from this prior existence. In perhaps the most famous passage in this dialogue, Socrates elicits recollection about geometry from one of Meno’s slaves (Meno 81a-86b). Socrates’ apparent interest in, and fairly sophisticated knowledge of, mathematics appears wholly new in this dialogue. It is an interest, however, that shows up plainly in the middle period dialogues, especially in the middle books of the Republic.
Several arguments for the immortality of the soul, and the idea that souls are reincarnated into different life forms, are also featured in Plato’s Phaedo (which also includes the famous scene in which Socrates drinks the hemlock and utters his last words). Stylometry has tended to count the Phaedo among the early dialogues, whereas analysis of philosophical content has tended to place it at the beginning of the middle period. Similar accounts of the transmigration of souls may be found, with somewhat different details, in Book X of the Republic and in the Phaedrus, as well as in several dialogues of the late period, including the Timaeus and the Laws. No traces of the doctrine of recollection, or the theory of reincarnation or transmigration of souls, are to be found in the dialogues we listed above as those of the early period.
The moral psychology of the middle period dialogues also seems to be quite different from what we find in the early period. In the early dialogues, Plato’s Socrates is an intellectualist—that is, he claims that people always act in the way they believe is best for them (at the time of action, at any rate). Hence, all wrongdoing reflects some cognitive error. But in the middle period, Plato conceives of the soul as having (at least) three parts:
and justice will be that condition of the soul in which each of these three parts “does its own work,” and does not interfere in the workings of the other parts (see esp. Republic IV.435b-445b). It seems clear from the way Plato describes what can go wrong in a soul, however, that in this new picture of moral psychology, the appetitive part of the soul can simply overrule reason’s judgments. One may suffer, in this account of psychology, from what is called akrasia or “moral weakness”—in which one finds oneself doing something that one actually believes is not the right thing to do (see especially Republic IV.439e-440b). In the early period, Socrates denied that akrasia was possible: One might change one’s mind at the last minute about what one ought to do—and could perhaps change one’s mind again later to regret doing what one has done—but one could never do what one actually believed was wrong, at the time of acting.
The Republic also introduces Plato’s notorious critique of the visual and imitative arts. In the early period works, Socrates contends that the poets lack wisdom, but he also grants that they “say many fine things.” In the Republic, on the contrary, it seems that there is little that is fine in poetry or any of the other fine arts. Most of poetry and the other fine arts are to be censored out of existence in the “noble state” (kallipolis) Plato sketches in the Republic, as merely imitating appearances (rather than realities), and as arousing excessive and unnatural emotions and appetites (see esp. Republic X.595b-608b).
In the Symposium, which is normally dated at the beginning of the middle period, and in the Phaedrus, which is dated at the end of the middle period or later yet, Plato introduces his theory of erôs (usually translated as “love”). Several passages and images from these dialogues continued to show up in Western culture—for example, the image of two lovers as being each other’s “other half,” which Plato assigns to Aristophanes in the Symposium. Also in that dialogue, we are told of the “ladder of love,” by which the lover can ascend to direct cognitive contact with (usually compared to a kind of vision of) Beauty Itself. In the Phaedrus, love is revealed to be the great “divine madness” through which the wings of the lover’s soul may sprout, allowing the lover to take flight to all of the highest aspirations and achievements possible for humankind. In both of these dialogues, Plato clearly regards actual physical or sexual contact between lovers as degraded and wasteful forms of erotic expression. Because the true goal of erôs is real beauty and real beauty is the Form of Beauty, what Plato calls Beauty Itself, erôs finds its fulfillment only in Platonic philosophy. Unless it channels its power of love into “higher pursuits,” which culminate in the knowledge of the Form of Beauty, erôs is doomed to frustration. For this reason, Plato thinks that most people sadly squander the real power of love by limiting themselves to the mere pleasures of physical beauty.
One of the novelties of the dialogues after those of the middle period is the introduction of a new philosophical method. This method was introduced probably either late in the middle period or in the transition to the late period, but was increasingly important in the late period. In the early period dialogues, as we have said, the mode of philosophizing was refutative question-and-answer (called elenchos or the “Socratic method”). Although the middle period dialogues continue to show Socrates asking questions, the questioning in these dialogues becomes much more overtly leading and didactic. The highest method of philosophizing discussed in the middle period dialogues, called “dialectic,” is never very well explained (at best, it is just barely sketched in the divided line image at the end of Book VI of the Republic). The correct method for doing philosophy, we are now told in the later works, is what Plato identifies as “collection and division,” which is perhaps first referred to at Phaedrus 265e. In this method, the philosopher collects all of the instances of some generic category that seem to have common characteristics, and then divides them into specific kinds until they cannot be further subdivided. This method is explicitly and extensively on display in the Sophist, Statesman, and Philebus.
One of the most puzzling features of the late dialogues is the strong suggestion in them that Plato has reconsidered his theory of Forms in some way. Although there seems still in the late dialogues to be a theory of Forms (although the theory is, quite strikingly, wholly unmentioned in the Theaetetus, a later dialogue on the nature of knowledge), where it does appear in the later dialogues, it seems in several ways to have been modified from its conception in the middle period works. Perhaps the most dramatic signal of such a change in the theory appears first in the Parmenides, which appears to subject the middle period version of the theory to a kind of “Socratic” refutation, only this time, the main refuter is the older Eleatic philosopher Parmenides, and the hapless victim of the refutation is a youthful Socrates. The most famous (and apparently fatal) of the arguments provided by Parmenides in this dialogue has come to be known as the “Third Man Argument,” which suggests that the conception of participation (by which individual objects take on the characters of the Forms) falls prey to an infinite regress: If individual male things are male in virtue of participation in the Form of Man, and the Form of Man is itself male, then what is common to both The Form of Man and the particular male things must be that they all participate in some (other) Form, say, Man 2. But then, if Man 2 is male, then what it has in common with the other male things is participation in some further Form, Man 3, and so on. That Plato’s theory is open to this problem gains support from the notion, mentioned above, that Forms are exemplars. If the Form of Man is itself a (perfect) male, then the Form shares a property in common with the males that participate in it. But since the Theory requires that for any group of entities with a common property, there is a Form to explain the commonality, it appears that the theory does indeed give rise to the vicious regress.
There has been considerable controversy for many years over whether Plato believed that the Theory of Forms was vulnerable to the “Third Man” argument, as Aristotle believed it was, and so uses the Parmenides to announce his rejection of the Theory of Forms, or instead believed that the Third Man argument can be avoided by making adjustments to the Theory of Forms. Of relevance to this discussion is the relative dating of the Timaeus and the Parmenides, since the Theory of Forms very much as it appears in the middle period works plays a prominent role in the Timaeus. Thus, the assignment of a later date to the Timaeus shows that Plato did not regard the objection to the Theory of Forms raised in the Parmenides as in any way decisive. In any event, it is agreed on all sides that Plato’s interest in the Theory shifted in the Sophist and Stateman to the exploration of the logical relations that hold between abstract entities. In the Laws, Plato’s last (and unfinished) work, the Theory of Forms appears to have dropped out altogether. Whatever value Plato believed that knowledge of abstract entities has for the proper conduct of philosophy, he no longer seems to have believed that such knowledge is necessary for the proper running of a political community.
In several of the late dialogues, Socrates is even further marginalized. He is either represented as a mostly mute bystander (in the Sophist and Statesman), or else absent altogether from the cast of characters (in the Laws and Critias). In the Theaetetus and Philebus, however, we find Socrates in the familiar leading role. The so-called “eclipse” of Socrates in several of the later dialogues has been a subject of much scholarly discussion.
Plato’s famous myth of Atlantis is first given in the Timaeus, which scholars now generally agree is quite late, despite being dramatically placed on the day after the discussion recounted in the Republic. The myth of Atlantis is continued in the unfinished dialogue intended to be the sequel to the Timaeus, the Critias.
The Timaeus is also famous for its account of the creation of the universe by the Demiurge. Unlike the creation by the God of medieval theologians, Plato’s Demiurge does not create ex nihilo, but rather orders the cosmos out of chaotic elemental matter, imitating the eternal Forms. Plato takes the four elements, fire, air, water, and earth (which Plato proclaims to be composed of various aggregates of triangles), making various compounds of these into what he calls the Body of the Universe. Of all of Plato’s works, the Timaeus provides the most detailed conjectures in the areas we now regard as the natural sciences: physics, astronomy, chemistry, and biology.
In the Laws, Plato’s last work, the philosopher returns once again to the question of how a society ought best to be organized. Unlike his earlier treatment in the Republic, however, the Laws appears to concern itself less with what a best possible state might be like, and much more squarely with the project of designing a genuinely practicable, if admittedly not ideal, form of government. The founders of the community sketched in the Laws concern themselves with the empirical details of statecraft, fashioning rules to meet the multitude of contingencies that are apt to arise in the “real world” of human affairs. A work enormous length and complexity, running some 345 Stephanus pages, the Laws was unfinished at the time of Plato’s death. According to Diogenes Laertius (3.37), it was left written on wax tablets.
U. S. A.
Nicholas D. Smith
Lewis & Clark College
U. S. A.
Last updated: May 9, 2009 | Originally published: