Political Revolution

Revolutions are commonly understood as instances of fundamental socio-political transformation. Since “the age of revolutions” in the late 18th century, political philosophers and theorists have developed approaches aimed at defining what forms of change can count as revolutionary (as opposed to, for example, reformist types of change) as well as determining if and under what conditions such change can be justified by normative arguments (for example, with recourse to human rights). Although the term has its origins in the fields of astrology and astronomy, “revolution” has witnessed a gradual politicization since the 17th century. Over the course of significant semantic shifts that often mirrored concrete political events and experiences, the aspect of regularity, originally central to the meaning of the term, was lost: Whereas in the studies of, for example, Nicolaus Copernicus, “revolution” expressed the invariable movements of the heavenly bodies and, thus, the repetitive character of change, in its political usage, particularly stresses the moments of irregularity, unpredictability, and uniqueness.

In light of the marked heterogeneity of the ways in which thinkers such as Thomas Paine (1737-1809), J.A.N. de Condorcet (1743-1794), Immanuel Kant (1724-1804), G.W.F. Hegel (1770-1831), Mikhail Bakunin (1814-1876), Karl Marx (1818-1883), Hannah Arendt (1906-1975), and Michel Foucault (1926-1984) reflect on the possibilities and conditions of radically transforming political and social structures, this article concentrates on a set of key questions confronted by all these theories of revolution. Most notably, these questions pertain to the problems of the new, of violence, of freedom, of the revolutionary subject, the revolutionary object or target, and of the temporal and spatial extension of revolution. In covering these problems in turn, it is the goal of this article to outline substantial arguments, analyses, and aporias that shape modern and contemporary debates and, thereby, to indicate important conceptual and normative issues concerning revolution.

This article is divided into three main sections. The first section briefly reconstructs the history of the concept “revolution.” The second section gives an overview of the most important strands of politico-philosophical thought on revolution. The third section examines paradigmatic positions developed by theorists with respect to the central problems mentioned above. As the majority of thinkers who address revolution do not elaborate comprehensive theories and as there is comparatively little thematic secondary literature on the subject, this part proposes a framework for individually situating and systematically relating the differing approaches.

Table of Contents

  1. History of the Concept
  2. Three Traditions of Thought
    1. The Democratic Tradition
    2. The Communist Tradition
    3. The Anarchist Tradition
  3. Concepts of Revolution
    1. The Question of Novelty
    2. The Question of Violence
    3. The Question of Freedom
    4. The Question of the Revolutionary Subject
    5. The Question of the Revolutionary Object
    6. The Question of the Extension of Revolution
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. History of the Concept

In preparation for presentation of the different philosophical approaches to revolution in the following article, this section is concerned with providing a concise outline of the history of the concept. In so far as “revolution” is employed to describe political transformation, conceptual historians understand its origins to be genuinely modern. Critically informed by the experience of the revolutions in England, America, and France, the term in common usage designates the epitome of political change, that is, change not only in laws, policies, or government but in the established order that is both profound and durable. Earlier conceptions of political change are missing the notions of a people’s autonomous ability to act or of its right to emancipation. Further, the absence of two structural preconditions explains why revolution in the sense of fundamental politico-social transformation is not conceived prior to modernity. On the historical level, it is the formation of the “strong” state that is conducive to a political imagination of radical liberation from state oppression and the subsequent founding of an essentially different order. The extent of the Hobbesian type of the state’s disciplining power and the impossibility of direct political participation thus lay the ground for revolutionary projects. On the conceptual level, the supersession of cyclical conceptions of history as advocated by Aristotle, Polybius, Cicero, or Machiavelli by linear models of thought allows for the idea of irreversible progress in politics and society. In the course of this shift in historical thinking revolution is eventually looked upon as a catalyzing, even enabling factor of progress. Since history is no longer understood as dependent on forces beyond human control (such as, for example, divine providence), human agency comes to be regarded as the decisive factor in shaping its course (compare Koselleck, 1984 and 2004; for arguments that revolution, both as a concept and a phenomenon, does have pre-modern origins, compare Rosenstock-Huessy, 1993 [1938]; Berman, 1985).

The history of political thought largely attests to the assessment that the idea of revolution as structural, justifiable change is unknown prior to modernity. Aristotle’s reflections on political change (metabolé tes politeías) in books III and IV of Politics show that the alterations he takes into consideration do not amount to the complete breakdown of an existing order, its organizing hierarchy, and its principles of inclusion/exclusion. Despite certain arguable similarities to modern concepts (for instance, with respect to the element of violence), conceptual predecessors of “revolution” such as stasis and kinesis in the Greek tradition or seditio, secessio, and tumultus in the Roman tradition have strong negative connotations. In ancient and medieval political thought, they are primarily related to anarchy and civil war. Even in the works of an early-modern thinker like Machiavelli the idea of an absolute hiatus, a fundamental rupture on the continuum of politics is not developed fully. Although he is occupied with political change, key concepts related to the topic (most importantly, rinovazione, mutazione, and alterazione) are overridden by the conviction that all shifts as to forms of constitutions ultimately do not break out of a cycle of historical recurrence. In short, the notion of a world-shaping human “power to interrupt” and “to begin” (compare Merleau-Ponty, 2005 [1945]) and the corresponding “pathos of novelty” (compare Arendt, 2006 [1963]) remain alien to pre-modern thought.

In the 17th and 18th century, the discovery of revolution as a relevant political category is reflected and supported by political and moral philosophy. John Locke, in his Second Treatise on Civil Government (1689), develops an influential defense of the right of resistance, rebellion, and even revolution. Going beyond Thomas Hobbes’s considerations on a subject’s right to defend herself against the sovereign if her life is under threat, his social contract theory presents this protective right against stately coercion and oppression as a necessary political concretization of the individuals’ inalienable natural right to “life, liberty, and estate.” Jean-Jacques Rousseau, in the Discourse on the Origin of Inequality (1755) and the Social Contract (1762), aims at exposing the morally degenerate, politically illegitimate state of the Ancien Régime and proposing a liberal, egalitarian political and legal constitution to replace it. According to Rousseau, the “general will” ousts the particular will of the monarch as the guideline in politics, thereby implying that the people attain autonomy, sovereignty, and, thus, the status of full political subjectivity. Locke’s and Rousseau’s considerations thus importantly add to a revaluation of acts of protest and insurrection: Such acts can no longer be dismissed as the work of political offenders or public enemies as was the case prior to the undermining of the “political theology” of absolutism and feudalism, which was largely based on the doctrine of divine right (compare Kantorowicz, 1997 [1957]; Walzer, 1992). Instead, thanks to the political thought of the enlightenment in general and to Lockean and Rousseauian social contract and natural rights theory in particular, such acts can now be interpreted as an exercise of rationally and morally justifiable political self-determination. Although neither Locke nor Rousseau present elaborated theories of revolution, they develop positions that are inherently critical of any political order that is not built on the principles of consent and trust and, thus, potentially revolutionary. Their reflections on legitimate governance and on citizens’ rights go beyond earlier discussions of justified resistance to monarchs—such as the 1579 Vindiciae contra Tyrannos, published under the pseudonym Stephen Junius Brutus—, which rely on expertocratic leadership as opposed to political self-determination of the people. Their works thus prepare the ground for the two main ideas of the revolutionary age: “natural” human rights and national sovereignty (compare Habermas, 1990; Menke/Raimondi, 2011).

Resulting from a plethora of intellectual and material factors, the distinctly modern understanding of “revolution” takes shape on the eve of the historical revolutions of the late 18th century: It is both a “combat term” (R. Koselleck) in political praxis and an “essentially contested concept” (W.B. Gallie) in political theory. It is in the works of thinkers like Condorcet, Kant, or Marx that this contest is henceforth held and that the specific political and philosophical meaning of the term is spelled out, albeit in widely differing ways.

2. Three Traditions of Thought

Before turning to a detailed examination of important conceptual and normative issues concerning revolution, this section aims at giving an overview of three dominant lines of thought on revolution. Given the considerable discontinuities and breaks within each of these strands on the one hand and the numerous overlaps and interchanges between them on the other, the lines of thought presented here have to be understood as ideal types. Although it is likely that there are alternative perspectives, very few theories of revolution resist classification into one of these strands.

a. The Democratic Tradition

A primarily democratic strand of theory is influenced by the works of Locke, takes shape in Thomas Jefferson’s and J.A.N. de Condorcet’s thinking, and is further developed in Kant’s reflections on gradual, yet profound transformation. Throughout the 19th and 20th century, it is continued selectively in the late writings of Friedrich Engels or in Hannah Arendt’s and Jürgen Habermas’s considerations of the subject. This strand is characterized by a strong emphasis on non-violent, legal means and on politico-legal liberty and equality as the essential aims of revolution. Its representatives understand revolution as a continuing project or task that cannot reach a point of completion and satisfaction. Correspondingly, these thinkers, for the most part, reject notions of instantaneous rupture and absolute novelty whereby they undermine rigid distinctions between revolutionary and reformist change. Key elements of this tradition resonate in the work of a contemporary thinker like Etienne Balibar. He suggests an understanding of revolution as a progressive power that operates from within the democratic system. Instead of aiming at the radical overthrow of this system, democratic citizens assume the role of the revolutionary subject by advocating constant additions to and revisions of the existing order and its institutions—for example, an extension of what Arendt calls “the right to have rights” to non-citizens, increased possibilities for political participation, or a more consequent adherence to human rights—allowing for its continued legitimacy (compare Balibar, 2014).

b. The Communist Tradition

A primarily communist line of revolutionary theory begins with the works of Rousseau. This line is elaborated decisively in the thinking of Karl Marx and Friedrich Engels. Significant modifications notwithstanding, it is continued in the writings of Vladimir Lenin and Jean-Paul Sartre during the 20th century. The majority of its representatives share the belief in the possibility of revolutions being finalized and completed. Although they offer different suggestions as to justifiable forms and degrees of violence, they further share the idea that violence, in general, can function as an acceptable means of revolution. They also agree that the realization of material liberty and equality (as opposed to merely “formal,” that is, legal liberty and equality) in the social sphere are its main goals. As this sphere includes apolitical institutions such as the market, substantial revolutionary transformation cannot satisfy itself with abstract political principles but needs to affect the concrete conditions in which a society exists (for example, the relations of production). In addition, the notion of solidarity is central to these thinkers’ vision of revolutionary action and of a post-revolutionary society that is realized through these actions. Key elements of this strand of revolutionary thought shape the works of contemporary theorists such as Alain Badiou and Slavoj Zizek. Interpreting existing democratic orders as regimes of radical immanence, it is evident to them that genuine transcendence (a “communism to come”) has to manifest itself as a supersession of this order. To overcome the inherently bourgeois structures and discourses of power that are ceaselessly reproduced by late-capitalist democracies, radical disruptions are needed. Taking the form of acts of “terror” or “subtraction,” such disruptions express the “eternal truths” of the suffering of the masses (compare Badiou, 2012; Zizek, 2012).

c. The Anarchist Tradition

An anarchist tradition of revolutionary theory has its sources in 19th century America (Josiah Warren), France (Pierre-Joseph Proudhon), and in the thought of the Russian theorists Mikhail Bakunin and Peter Kropotkin. This tradition is later taken up in the works of, for example, Emma Goldman, Rosa Luxemburg, and Paul Goodman. Although these thinkers differ considerably in their assessment of revolutionary violence, they converge as to the crucial emancipatory aim of revolution: As any form of institutionalized authority is considered incompatible with human autonomy, their vision is the creation of a society independent of “imperial institutions” in the economic, social, and political realms. Consequently, they do not content themselves with a redistribution of political power, however radical, within the framework of the state, but aim at its abolition instead. David Graeber, in his contemporary reformulation of anarchism, describes the way in which the envisaged revolutionary abolition of vertical structures is linked to the emergence of new forms of horizontal relations, that is, of communal existence. These forms are no longer organized by the logic of dominance and of cost/benefit; instead, they are shaped by the principles of mutual aid and free cooperation, which are not guided by instrumental rationality (compare Graber, 2004).

3. Concepts of Revolution

The following section discusses central questions addressed in the works of theorists from these main strands: The questions of novelty, violence, freedom, the revolutionary subject, the revolutionary object or target, and the extension of revolution. As it is neither possible to comprehensively discuss relevant concepts of revolution proposed by political philosophers and theorists nor to comprehensively include thematic considerations of the theorists presented here, this section contents itself with highlighting certain crucial features. Since this article is concerned with concepts of revolution as developed by political philosophers and theorists, important historical (compare Furet/Ozouf, 1989; Hobsbawm, 1996 [1962]; Palmer, 2014 [1959]), sociological (compare Skopcol, 1979), and politological (compare DeFronzo, 2011) studies that primarily concentrate on the phenomenon of revolution, its empirical forms and causes, are not taken into account. Further, a number of theoretical explorations of revolution are also not taken into consideration. This applies to the works of partisans of revolution such as, for example, Georges Sorel or Georg Lukács as well as to the works of critics of revolution such as, for example, Edmund Burke, Jeremy Bentham, Joseph de Maistre, or Carl Schmitt.

The exclusive focus on the six questions mentioned above is justified by the fact that they constantly appear in the theoretical debates regarding revolution as criteria in determining (a) if and under what conditions political change can be considered as revolutionary and (b) if and under what conditions such revolutionary change can be considered as legitimate. Despite the differing historical settings as well as the differing political and philosophical commitments of the individual thinkers, these questions thus constitute the common themes that connect their heterogeneous approaches to revolution. For each of these questions, the intent is to display the extremes of the spectrum on which important theorists of revolution operate and to indicate paradigmatic stances they take on this spectrum. It is with the help of this analytical framework that the various approaches to revolution since its intellectual discovery can be individually situated and systematically related to one another: The original revolutionary experience in the context of the American and French Revolution as reflected in the writings of Jefferson, Paine, Sieyès, and Condorcet; its reception in German Idealism; the further development of revolutionary thought in different versions of Marxism; its application to the problem of colonialism in the 20th century; and, finally, contemporary debates about the relevance and meaning of revolution informed, among other things, by the crises of late capitalism and representative democracy.

a. The Question of Novelty

The question of novelty pertains to the degree of revolutionary transformation and to the mode in which such transformation is achieved. Whereas some theorists of revolution argue that the post-revolutionary state needs to be absolutely new and different in comparison to the pre-revolutionary state, others hold that revolution is conceivable as a realization of relative novelty. Although some theorists argue that transformation needs to take place in a historically disruptive or discontinuous fashion in order to be revolutionary in character, others hold that effective revolutionary change can unfold in a continuous or stepwise manner.

For Thomas Paine, there can be no doubt that the American revolutionary struggle for independence from colonial rule, understood as a practical application of enlightenment thought, amounts to a radical break in history. According to his remarks, the liberation of the colonies from monarchical government must be seen as the unique and irreversible establishment of a fundamentally new political order. Employing nature as a timeless criterion for revolution, he describes monarchy not only as an anachronistic, unjustifiable “absurdity” but as a grave violation of natural law. In Paine’s view, its supersession by consent-based, liberal, and egalitarian republicanism is therefore tantamount to “begin[ning] the world over again” (Paine, 2000: 44). In contrast to Paine’s considerations that often oscillate between conceptual analyses and calls to revolutionary action (and, thus, indicate the difficulty inherent to addressing the subject of revolution in an objective, non-partisan manner), his contemporary Condorcet suggests an understanding of revolution that is not informed by a comparatively strong concept of novelty. Condorcet’s understanding becomes particularly apparent in his stance towards the trial and execution of Louis XVI. Rejecting the extra-legalism advocated by, among others, Robespierre and Saint-Just, he develops a theoretical position that argues for the compatibility of profound change of the political system and historical continuity: For him, the largely unprecedented challenge of bringing the king to court can only be met by taking recourse to elements of previous politico-legal systems. What is more, it is precisely such elements that—under the condition that they are not just imitated, but innovatively rearranged—make the necessary “regulation” of revolutionary dynamics possible and, thus, guarantee revolutionary progress (compare Condorcet, 2012; Walzer, 1992). Instead of interpreting novelty in terms of the political creation of a “new world” without historical parallel, the new, here, is comprehended in terms of a reconfiguration of constitutive parts of the old, that is, of the pre-revolutionary world.

As represented here by Paine and Condorcet, the axis of the new, crucial for conceptually grasping revolution, runs between the extremes of absolute and relative rupture or inception. The ends of this spectrum are reflected in numerous later theories of revolution. For instance, Friedrich Engels (1820-1895), in late works such as, for example, his introduction to the reprint of Marx’s The Class Struggles in France, describes revolutionary struggle as ongoing and procedural in character. For Engels, this struggle cannot be detached from existing political, legal, and economic conditions, meaning that radical revolutionary breaks or leaps are inconceivable. As his moderate understanding of the new allows for minor modifications of the state of affairs to be labeled as revolutionary, it is inclined to tie revolution closely to reform. This propensity is reflected in his programmatic idea of a re-appropriation of universal suffrage, which turns it from a means of bourgeois dominance into an ultimately revolutionary means of proletarian liberation. As opposed to Engels’s approach to the question of the new, Walter Benjamin (1892-1940), in On the Concept of History, propounds an understanding of revolution as a state of exception in which the continuum of history is “burst open.” According to his “messianic” concept of novelty, revolutions are unforeseeable, kairological events that suspend the regular, chronological order of time: They constitute a leap into an epoch that is incommensurable with what has previously existed.

Immanuel Kant, in his thoughts on revolution, attempts to avoid similarly one-sided answers to the question of the new. Rather, his complex considerations on progressive transformation aim at undermining the dichotomy between either emphatic or deflationary notions of the new by closely associating “complete change” or “complete revolution” (völlige Umwälzung) and “thorough reform” (gründliche Reform) (compare Kant, 2006c [1795/96]). Yet, Kant’s remarks on the subject of political or politico-moral change—scattered over writings such as What is Enlightenment?, Toward Perpetual Peace, The Metaphysics of Morals, and The Contest of the Faculties—seem marked by a tension between a reformist bias and revolutionary tendencies. Whereas the former is expressed in his privileging of enlightened monarchs such as Frederick II of Prussia as the agents of change or in his explicit criticism of the French Revolution on the grounds of excessive use of violence, the latter becomes apparent in his comments on the “enthusiasm” with which contemporary Europeans observe the revolutionary events in France or in his reflections on the radical switch from “despotism” to “republicanism,” that is, from the old absolutist order to a new order of freedom and morality. Kant evidently considers the difference between the two types of order to be tremendous: An order responsible for the heteronomous subjugation of the individual by the ruler is overcome by an order primarily characterized by the proliferation of individual autonomy and political participation as well as the decrease of armed conflict and war. Kant appears to resolve what presents itself as a tension between differing, even incompatible concepts of the new by taking into account the specific temporal constitution of profound political change: For him, such change is grasped adequately only as a process that is mediated in multiple ways, but not as a sudden gestalt switch. Rejecting the sharp, static dichotomy between relative and absolute novelty (and, with it, the dichotomy between reform and revolution) and integrating the two instead, Kant shows that there is no necessary interdependence between the suddenness and the depth of political change. He thus does not accept the common assumption among theorists of revolution and active revolutionaries alike that only abrupt, immediate transformation can count as profound and progressive in a relevant sense. Although republican states, according to Kant, are fundamentally different from despotic states the principles of which are superseded entirely, the emancipatory transition from heteronomy to autonomy is achieved stepwise. Kant’s idea of “complete change” reflects his teleological understanding of history as an imperfect, yet steady development “from worse to better” as expounded in his considerations on the conditions of the possibility of progress in Idea for a Universal History from a Cosmopolitan Perspective and Conjectural Beginning of Human History; it crystallizes in concepts such as “gradualness” (Allmählichkeit) and “approximation” (Annäherung) used by Kant to illustrate his notion of progressive transformation. It follows that, with Kant, the new can impossibly be conceived in theologically charged terms of the miracle or the “event.” Yet, the terminal phase of this gradual, indeterminate transition, for him, does mark the inception of a genuinely new age in the history of humanity, which is not only “an age of ‘enlightenment’ but ‘an enlightened age’” (compare Kant, 2006a [1784]). Politically, the latter manifests itself in consent-based republican systems essentially guided by the humanity formulation of the Categorical Imperative and, thus, in a “political body the likes of which the earlier world has never known” (Kant, 2006b [1784]: 14).

Within the theoretical debates, further problems arise that are immediately tied to the question of revolutionary novelty. For instance, several theorists of revolution do not merely reflect upon the new in terms of its degree and its mode. Instead, they also investigate its sources: The new is conceived as a result made possible by acts of re-appropriation (as expressed, for example, in Jefferson’s recourse to classical antiquity), by acts of reconfiguration (as expressed, for example, in Condorcet’s approach to assembling individual elements of various previous and present legal systems), or by acts of creation (as expressed, for example, in Bakunin’s idea of creative destruction by revolutionary “bandits”).

b. The Question of Violence

The question of violence pertains to legitimate means of revolutionary transformation. While some thinkers of revolution approve of violence as an essential vehicle for bringing about radical change and assert its creative capacities, others advocate its unreserved exclusion from the realm of progressive politics and make recourse to right and law instead. Again, numerous intermediate positions between the extremes of permissive and prohibitive attitudes toward violence can be found in which theorists try to identify specific conditions under which the use of violence is legitimate (for example, if violence contributes to a measurable increase in freedom) or to determine specific forms of violence that are justifiable (for example, violence against property). In addition, this section focuses on prevalent strategies for justifying revolutionary violence with recourse to, among others, utilitarian and politico-theological arguments.

Anarchist theorist and activist Mikhail Bakunin, in his thoughts on radical socio-political transformation, stresses the creative power of humans in general and the creative potential of violence in particular. For him, revolution begins with the forcible destruction of the old (statist) order, which prepares the “fertile” ground for a fundamentally new (non-statist) order (compare Bakunin, 1990 [1873]). Even though Bakunin declares the institutions that constitute the political and economic centers of power to be the primary target of acts of revolutionary “bandits,” he holds that such violence can also legitimately affect the persons who are present at these centers. In order to justify the use of revolutionary violence Bakunin argues for an understanding of such violence as reactive and necessary: Confronted with the repressive violence of the state, its police and military units, partisans of the “social revolution” must resort to violence. In his view, such violence is justified both as an act of self-defense and as a means of a progressive politics that transcends a deeply unjust status quo in which autonomy is made impossible by the existence and the authority of the state. Thus, for Bakunin, violence is not merely an extreme alternative in case non-violent (for example, legal) vehicles of transformation fail. Instead, it is an inherent factor of revolution. In his comments on revolution, provoked by the experience of the Iranian Revolution, Michel Foucault agrees with this assessment insofar as he considers manifestations of violence an important motor of transformative politics (compare Foucault, 2005 [1978-79]). Based on irreconcilable concepts of the political and further fueled by resentment, intolerance, and hatred, a quasi-Schmittian fighting position between “friends” and “enemies” of the revolution, that is, between the supporters of the “saint” (Ayatollah Khomeini) and the “king” (Shah Reza Pahlevi) emerges. This fighting position, for Foucault, is to be seen as an inevitable element of radical change. Despite his constative judgment that violent conflict essentially enables revolutionary dynamics, he does not present an elaborate justification of revolutionary violence.

Contrary to Bakunin and Foucault, Kant understands violence as neither a necessary nor a justifiable element of revolution. Not only do his remarks reveal a pronounced reservation resulting from empirical observations of the cruelties committed in the course of the revolution in France (cf. Kant, 1991 [1798]). What is more, his rejection of the idea that violence could be considered a legitimate means of progress is a matter of principle. His position becomes particularly manifest in his reflections on the trial against Louis XVI as presented in the Doctrine of Right (compare Kant, 1996 [1797]). From the standpoint of his practical philosophy, there can be no doubt that the execution of the previous monarch is not acceptable. For Kant, this form of legally regulated and sanctioned regicide differs from historically well-known simple regicide, that is, the killing of a king on impulse or motivated by political power strategies: For in the trial, the established political principle of the inviolable nature of sovereign power is undermined and ultimately replaced by the principle of violence. Since the prosecution, in trying and finally executing the former king of France, does not appeal to a singular, exceptional situation but, instead, lends general juridical character to it, violent revolutionary insurrection against the sovereign is turned into a principle or Grundsatz of politics. To understand the right to violent resistance and revolution as a political principle (as is the case in the trial), for Kant, anticipates the Great Terror of 1793/94 (for a similar critique of the trial and execution of Louis XVI, compare Camus, 1991 [1951]). More importantly, it passes off the violent protest against sovereign governments as generally permissible and problematically normalizes it. As a consequence of the legalization of permanent insurrection, the consolidation of political (and, with it, moral) order is considerably complicated while civil disorder and war, in Kant’s view the key impediment to politico-moral progress, become the rule. A comparably unambiguous rejection of violence as an instrument of revolution can be found in Arendt’s On Revolution where she describes violence as a “limit” of the realm of the political: For her, the revolutionary praxis of violence (as exercised in the revolutions in France and Russia) as well as theoretical justifications of revolutionary violence (as given by, for example, Bakunin) are inherently anti-political.

Condorcet is one of the thinkers who neither understands violence as an integral part of revolution and gives carte blanche to its use nor completely rules out that it can serve as a justifiable means in processes of radical transformation. His intermediate position crystallizes in his considerations on the trial against Louis XVI: Representing the standpoint of the Girondins, he argues that the charges against the former king (or, rather, the “citizen Louis Capet”) cannot be based on “enmity” as suggested by Jacobins like Robespierre and Saint-Just, but have to refer to “treason” instead. The binary logic of the Jacobins according to which any monarch has to either rule or die and their corresponding attempt to apply the laws of war in the trial against the king are thus curbed. The position suggested by Condorcet allows for an at least tentative maintenance of the rule of law and of the validity of principles of justice. Like any other laws and measures, revolutionary laws and measures as developed in the course of the trial are subject to the rules of justice (compare Condorcet, 2012). In stark contrast to the Jacobins’ enthusiasm for unrestricted, extralegal, and decisionist self-authorization, what is emphasized here is the necessity of revolutionary self-restraint. According to Condorcet, the exceptional, unprecedented situation of the revolutionary trial has to be modeled on the ideal of due process of law if it is to remain distinguishable from mere revolutionary terror. Thus, revolutionary violence as it manifests itself in the eventual execution of the former king is not categorically rejected. However, it can only be considered as justified if it is legally channeled and, as a result, compatible with certain demands of justice. Insisting on the significance of revolutionary justice (however imperfect in its practical realization) in the exercise of legally qualified violent acts, Condorcet avoids the common opposition of either violence or law as the decisive tools of transformation. On the one hand, this treatment of the representatives of the old system, in not suspending the law, sets an example for the new order and for the way in which it interprets law and justice. It thus contributes to the transformation of revolutionary violence into legitimate authority. On the other hand, this treatment of the collapsed regime contributes to facilitating the peaceful co-existence of partisans and opponents of the revolution in a post-revolutionary society: Instead of declaring the former king to be a “moral monster” to be immediately “annihilated” and instead of declaring war against supporters of the monarchy and all other “enemies of freedom” as suggested by Robespierre and Saint-Just, Condorcet’s insistence on legal equality aims at finding peaceful trading zones and common ground between the factions so that previous political opponents can be repositioned as potential future partners.

Intermediate positions between the extremes of approval and rejection of violence as an instrument of revolution are also developed by Walter Benjamin, Herbert Marcuse, and, more recently, by Slavoj Zizek. With regard to the question of justification, these thinkers propose alternatives to Condorcet’s idea of legalized and, thus, legitimate revolutionary violence. Benjamin, taking recourse to political theology, interprets and justifies revolutionary movements as inner-worldly manifestations of unmediated “divine violence” that overcomes the oppressive “mythical violence” exercised by the state. With respect to the content and effect of “divine violence,” Benjamin’s remarks remain sketchy. On the one hand, the notion can be taken to imply the use of force against representatives of the state’s “mythical” authority; on the other hand, it can be interpreted as resulting in a fundamental transformation of the law which becomes critical of itself by recognizing and counter-balancing its inherent violent potential. At any rate, revolutionary movements, for Benjamin, represent a form of justice that incommensurably exceeds the existing legal order. If they are successful, they cathartically suspend the “serfdom” and “barbarity” characteristic of human history and realize the possibility of the fundamentally new (compare Benjamin, 1999 [1921]). Marcuse (1898-1979), in contrast, proposes a quasi-utilitarian justification of revolutionary violence. In Ethics and Revolution (1964) he argues that only a “brutal calculus” can determine whether a specific revolutionary project is legitimate. The suggested calculus amounts to a cost-benefit analysis of the probable number of victims on the one hand and the probable gains in human progress on the other (in terms of, for example, tolerance or human rights). For Marcuse, the historical events in England, America, and France prove the dialectical character of revolutionary violence, that is, the fact that violent conflict can contribute decisively to substantial economic and social, political and moral improvements. However, he insists that such violence is justifiable only if its use (a) is directly and recognizably tied to specific moral goals and (b) ceases at the earliest possible stage of the revolutionary process. Zizek (1949) attributes a central role to violence as an instrument to break out of the absolutely imminent “deadlock” represented by the current order of liberal democracy and market economy. His reflections concentrate on the revolutionary capacities of passive forms of violence, which he presents as particularly justifiable. Most importantly, he suggests a “Bartlebian politics” of refusal and withdrawal that undermines the discursive power of the dominant system. Such a politics, which has an expressive, communicative function, rejects the prevailing “hegemonic” language and counters the existing system’s power to name with subversive silence. For Zizek, political forms of direct non-action, guided by Bartleby’s maxim of “I would prefer not to” allow for a first negative step in the revolutionary process in creating a “vacuum” of effective power which, in a second step, can be filled with positive content. Thus, in arguing that, in the present circumstances, “doing nothing is the most violent thing to do” (an idea that also informs the traditions of strikes, pickets, and silent vigils), he designates radical non-action as a justifiable mode of revolutionary violence (compare Zizek, 2008).

Debates within and around contemporary movements with fundamentally transformative social and political agendas attest to the continued significance of violence, of its permissibility and justifiability, as the central normative problem in the context of revolution. Supporters of the Occupy movement deny the legitimacy of physical violence and, in particular, of physical violence directed against persons, as a means of revolutionary change. Instead, they largely subscribe to a “Bartlebian” revolutionary politics of non-violent violence, that is, a politics of subversive silence and, respectively, creative re-naming. The adherence to this kind of inactive, discursive violence was expressed performatively during the 2013 Gezi Park protests in Istanbul. Whereas the “standing man” actions enacted a “bodily politics” of obstruction (compare Butler, 2015) and an attitude of refusal through silence and passivity, the derogative term çapulcu (looter, marauder) used by government officials to discredit the protesters was creatively appropriated by them and re-interpreted as a honorific title. In Egypt, supporters of the Arab Spring movement took recourse to certain strands within the Islamic legal tradition when considering the question of violence. It was not only in terms of human rights and democratic governance but also in terms of the Islamic law of rebellion and of war that the question of violence was discussed. Although the positions of the main legal schools of thought differ considerably in their assessment of the question, there is a pronounced tendency to attempt to avoid or, at least, limit violence in internal conflicts and to consider it justifiable only if all other means of bringing about change have been exhausted (compare El Fadl, 2006; Al Dawoody, 2011).

c. The Question of Freedom

The question of freedom pertains to the primary objective of revolutionary transformation. Here, the spectrum established by theorists of revolution spans between the poles of freedom as liberation from oppression (that is, negative revolutionary freedom) and of freedom as the foundation and realization of a new political order (that is, positive revolutionary freedom).

Post-colonial theorist Frantz Fanon (1925-1961), in his reflections on revolutionary change, primarily concentrates on the aspect of liberation. For Fanon, whose work attests to the de-Europeanization of revolution during the 20th century, decolonization is to be understood as a process of “rehabilitation” of the suppressed that importantly implies a justifiably violent moment of radical riddance of the structural cornerstones of political, social, economic, and cultural domination and exploitation. Revolutionary liberation thus leads to the creation of a “tabula rasa,” which is the precondition for the subsequent development of a new institutional order and, what is more, the emergence of “sovereign” forms of post-colonial subjectivity (compare Fanon, 1967 [1961]). A comparable focus on revolutionary freedom as freedom from oppression characterizes the thinking of critical theorist Herbert Marcuse. For him, breaking free from the existing order is the essential element of a revolution. He argues that in light of the extent to which an inherently “repressive” socio-political order, the order of late capitalism, clearly dominates, strategies of resisting and undermining have to be considered before anything else. As Marcuse makes clear in Ethics and Revolution, such strategies of liberation do not only include forms of passive resistance as indicated in the concept of “the great refusal” but also the use of violence. Both can serve as a means to unsettle the systemic “paralysis” or blockage of human needs and potentials in industrialized Western societies. Consequently, Marcuse’s understanding of freedom is shaped by the idea of emancipation from a system of extreme immanentism that produces entirely controlled, uniform, “one-dimensional” humans. In spite of the emphasis on revolutionary freedom as liberation from prevailing modes of materialistic existence and instrumentally rational thought, he also points to a more positive notion of freedom: With explicit recourse to the thought of Jean-Paul Sartre, he discusses the necessity of “projects” that allow for forms of free (for example, artistic) action to be released (compare Marcuse, 1991 [1964]).

As opposed to Fanon and Marcuse, Hannah Arendt holds that the content of revolutionary freedom is “participation in public affairs,” that is, the positive freedom to act politically. In historical terms, this kind of freedom is exemplified for Arendt in the American Revolution where the foundation of a new political constitution—a republican constitution which codifies participatory citizenship—is itself achieved by participatory, autonomous “speech and action.” Although Arendt admits that an element of negative freedom is integral to thorough transformation, she is unequivocal in qualifying the “desire for liberation” as an insufficient objective of revolution if the latter is to be genuinely “political” as opposed to merely “social.” Employing the term “political” in a normative rather than a descriptive way, she appropriates the Aristotelian distinction between “political” and “despotic” forms of constitutional order and transposes it to the problem of revolutionary disorder. Consequently, in Arendt’s view, not every revolution can automatically be considered political. Instead, processes of profound, sustainable transformation have to meet certain conditions if they are to be labeled as political. The delineation Arendt suggests is essentially based on two criteria: For her, a revolution is apolitical or even anti-political if (a) what she calls “the social question” is its essential driving force and if (b) violence plays a central role in bringing about a new order (compare Arendt, 2006 [1963]). Similarly, Thomas Jefferson (1743-1826), himself a central intellectual and political figure of the American Revolution, insists on the importance of positive aspects of revolutionary freedom. This becomes apparent when he directly relates the idea of an “empire for liberty” to the notion of “self-government.” It is underlined in his remarks on resistance and rebellion: Despite their potential legitimacy and their “refreshing” effects on the “tree of liberty,” such attempts to be free from forms of “despotism” and “tyranny” remain insufficient in that they fail to found an alternative order that reliably rests on a constitution conducive to the realization of “life, liberty, and the pursuit of happiness” (compare Jefferson, 2004).

Karl Marx endeavors to relativize the opposition between either negative or positive freedom as definitive of revolutionary freedom. For him, revolution has to be conceived as a temporal process spanning over different stages. Thereby, an element of liberation plays a crucial role at the beginning of radical change insofar as it contributes to the liquefaction of an existing, oppressive system (such as the system of bourgeois, capitalist “class rule”). However, Marx’s theory of revolution expounds that this deconstructive element needs to be complemented by a reconstructive element once, in the later stages of the revolutionary process, the solidification of its transformative dynamics, that is, the formation of a new system becomes the essential task. The final paragraph of the 1848 Communist Manifesto paradigmatically reveals Marx’s (and Engels’s) understanding of revolutionary freedom as necessarily encompassing both negative and positive moments: The communist revolution casts off the “chains” as well as it “wins” a new, classless “world.” According to Marx, such a world makes possible the exercise of “real freedom” in the positive sense of individual “self-realization” that is embedded in a community and manifested in labor. As already stated in On the Jewish Question (1843/44), freedom thus understood differs from the bourgeois conception of freedom which is based on a “monadic” view of humans who only relate to each other in terms of competition. Marx argues that under the guise of this strictly individualist and merely formal kind of freedom, it is exclusively capital, not humans that can be considered as free. Thus, it is the idea of commitment, grounded in the communal and practical orientation of his notion of “self-realization,” which, against the background of his criticism of capitalist society, characterizes Marx’s concept of post-revolutionary freedom. In his understanding, the indeterminacy or openness of this concept as regards content guarantees that the spontaneity constitutive of freedom is not prefigured and, thereby, inhibited or even suppressed: For Marx, it is evident that the precise results of authentically free human action and interaction cannot be predicted. Thus, the significance of his vision of a future free society, in which the difference between oppressors and oppressed is overcome, is underlined in his deliberate refusal to further specify its shape.

d. The Question of the Revolutionary Subject

The question of the revolutionary subject pertains to the primary agent of radical transformation. Here, the spectrum ranges from history unfolding largely independent of man’s decisions and actions on the one end to autonomous, history-shaping man on the other. In the latter case, the agent can take a variety of forms ranging from exceptional individuals to a transnational “multitude,” from a distinct avant-garde to an amorphous crowd.

G.W.F. Hegel’s concept of revolution is thoroughly determined by his concept of history. Radicalizing Kant’s teleological conception, Hegel understands history as a rational process in which the “idea of freedom” successively realizes itself. According to his macro-perspective, this progressive development, the self-actualization of objective “spirit,” unfolds based on the principle of dialectics. It becomes manifest in the “oriental” civilizations of China, India, and Persia, in ancient Greece, in the Roman Empire, and, finally, in the “Germanic” age of reformation and enlightenment which supersedes the “dark night” of the Middle Ages, Renaissance, and the era of feudalism (compare Hegel, 1991 [1832-45]). From this it follows that the revolutions in the United States and France or the 1791 slave uprising in Haiti on which Hegel comments have to be interpreted as indicative of the current stage of development of the idea of freedom. As a consequence, revolutions, for Hegel, cannot be “made” by humans as autonomous agents. Rather, they mark epochal transitions in the “necessary” progression of history, which finds expression in the thoughts and deeds of humans. Hegel’s remarks on the French Revolution reveal that revolutionary achievements (most importantly, man’s historically unparalleled attempt to govern reality through ideas) and revolutionary failures (most importantly, the “abstract,” “subjective,” and, thus, deficient understanding of freedom which leads to the Terreurs) are to be seen primarily as reflections of the imperfect level reached by “spirit” thus far (compare Hegel, 1977 [1807]).

In opposition to Hegel’s accentuation of the progressive dynamics inherent to history, a wide range of theorists emphasize the principal role of human action with regard to the question of revolutionary subjectivity. However, these thinkers suggest various concretizations of man as the driving force of profound transformation: Bakunin emphasizes the world-changing potential of individual “bandits” (compare Bakunin, 1990 [1873]); Lenin points to a revolutionary avant-garde of limited size (compare Lenin, 1987 [1902]); Foucault attributes this role to the entirety of a people united by an experience of “political spirituality” (compare Foucault, 2005 [1978-79]); Fanon understands revolutionary subjectivity to be actualized by the “wretched” victims of colonialism (compare Fanon, 1967 [1961]; Sartre, 1967); Marcuse sees the heterogeneous group of the marginalized and “hopeless” both within and without Western societies as the key agent of revolution (compare Marcuse, 1991 [1964]); finally, contemporary theorists like Michael Hardt and Antonio Negri present a global “multitude” as the only political unit capable of realizing a revolution against the system of late capitalism (compare Hardt/Negri, 2004; Negri, 2011).

In Marx’s thought, the dichotomy between the idea that revolution is the effect of history’s independent development and the idea that revolution is the immediate product of human action is put into question. On the one hand, Marx’s position is strongly influenced by Hegelian philosophy: Despite modifying Hegel’s dialectics materialistically, he reiterates the thought of an internal logic to history (for Marx, the logic of “class struggle”) on the basis of which all processes of transformation can be explained as “necessary.” Yet, on the other hand, a specific social class is needed to concretely carry out such processes. In the historical context of the 19th century this social class is the “proletariat,” which is presented as the decisive factor of revolutionary change (compare Marx/Engels, 2012 [1848]). Thus, although Marx and Engels hold that revolution cannot be “made” thanks to human will and action alone, it cannot become manifest without human will and action. With respect to the problem of the revolutionary subject, a similar interplay between history’s inaccessible movement and self-determined human agency is described by theorists concerned with the kairos, that is, the right moment or timing for radical change. Rousseau, for instance, argues that specific historical constellations (“crises”) are necessary for humans (here, a people) to successfully initiate revolutions (compare Rousseau, 2012 [1762]). For Jefferson, such constellations—“precious occasions” beyond human planning and control—are the precondition for successfully consolidating the progress thus far achieved by bringing to a halt the revolutionary dynamics before it escalates into continuing violence and irreversible political, social decomposition (compare Jefferson, 2010). In both cases, human will and action is autonomous. Yet, according to Rousseau and Jefferson, revolutionary subjectivity is strongly affected and limited by what historical situations grant or deny respectively.

Further questions arise once theorists have identified man as the subject to actively make revolution. For instance, it is to be determined whether the revolutionary subject’s capacity to act in a world-transforming way is the result of minute “organization” as argued by Lenin for example, or whether it emerges “spontaneously” as, for example, Kropotkin claims. Another debate in this context concerns the driving motivational forces behind revolutionary subjectivity. Here, some theorists emphasize material, that is, social or economic factors, while others understand immaterial, that is, intellectual or spiritual factors, to be decisive. This tension between “being” and “consciousness” is reflected in the controversy between Jean-Paul Sartre and Maurice Merleau-Ponty: Whereas the former understands the revolutionary subject’s actions as caused by a concrete material “situation” of oppression (compare Sartre, 1955 [1946]), the latter insists that such actions constitute a form of “significance” (“Sinn-gebung”), that is, a form of freely creating meaning through revolutionary projects, which is irreducible to materialist causality (compare Merleau-Ponty, 2005 [1945]). Finally, the positions diverge with respect to the attitudes that are considered particularly conducive to effective individual or collective revolutionary action. Foucault, based on his observations of the overthrow of the Shah, underlines the influence of the “profane register” of indignation, resentment, even hatred that crucially fuels the revolutionary movement in Iran (compare Foucault, 2005 [1978-79]). Pointing to the deeply transformative political projects of Mahatma Gandhi, Martin Luther King, and Nelson Mandela, Martha Nussbaum attributes their success to an attitude that overcomes negative, destructive emotions and is committed to “non-anger” instead (compare Nussbaum, 2013). In her view, this mental commitment to non-anger is more decisive for revolutionary justice and for post-revolutionary reconciliation between former opponents than the practical commitment to non-violence.

e. The Question of the Revolutionary Object

The question of the revolutionary object pertains to the primary target of revolutionary change. Two predominant strands can be distinguished: While some theorists hold that revolutions should primarily aim at converting the attitudes, convictions, belief systems and world-views of individuals, others argue that the material, institutional frameworks within which humans act and interact constitute the main object or site of revolutionary change. Once more, a variety of positions can be found in between these extremes. Such positions hold both dimensions not only to be necessary conditions of radical change but also to mutually affect each other.

Fanon is one of the thinkers who argue that revolution cannot be limited to a remaking of the external world, that is, to the establishment of a different political, economic, social, and cultural order. Instead, full transformation is only achieved by an internal process of “creation” in which the carriers of the revolution, individually as well as collectively, re-humanize themselves in their struggle for liberation from systemically de-humanizing colonial rule. According to Fanon’s politico-psychological theory of revolution, the inner sphere of attitudes towards oneself, one’s community, and one’s former oppressors is the essential locus of revolutionary change: It is there that a radical transformation of the revolutionaries’ status occurs which turns them from an “animalized” and “objectified,” anonymous and disposable mass into “sovereign” subjects capable not only of self-determination but also of self-respect (compare Fanon, 1967 [1961]).

In contrast, the anarchist theorists Mikhail Bakunin and Peter Kropotkin (1842-1921) point to the institutional conditions as the main target of the “social revolution” they advocate. In their understanding, it is above all the institution of the state that has to be destroyed if freedom, morality, and solidarity are to be realized among humans: Being a source of “artificial” authority, any state, independent of its specific form, makes the unrestricted, free flourishing of men impossible (compare Bakunin, 2009 [1871]). Therefore, conquering freedom in its totality is tantamount to establishing an order that abolishes every political or religious institution that exercises authority. Such a society organizes itself according to the principles of decentralization, social diversity, and horizontal interconnectedness, which allow for harmony and happiness on both the subjective and inter-subjective level (compare Kropotkin, 2008 [1892]). This line of thought, which emphasizes the primacy of institutional transformation, is also represented by Kant. Far from suggesting the abolition of the state, however, Kant marks the essential institutions of the state—its politico-legal constitution and system of law—as the decisive lever to unhinge despotism and promote progress with respect to freedom, rationality, and morality in a process of “complete revolution.” In his view, a program of political pedagogy that aims at directly transforming the way in which humans understand themselves and the world is not only empirically unreliable, but also categorically insufficient. What is needed instead is a progressive shift as to systemic conditions that make it possible for a “spirit of freedom” to unfold successively. It is conditions founded on principles of right that will eventually lead to a fuller realization of the individuals’ moral and rational potential (compare Kant, 1991 [1798]; 1996 [1797]).

Insisting on the comprehensive character of revolution, Rousseau, when thinking about its adequate object or target, attempts to avoid comparable predeterminations. He argues that both the modus operandi of individual humans (that is, their ways of thinking, feeling, and acting) and of political institutions (that is, their ways of being structured and of acting upon citizens) has to be tackled for thorough transformation to occur. Consequently, if “moral” and “civil” liberty and equality are to be realized, it takes the contribution of education, as elaborated in Emile, as well as of institutional restructuring, as elaborated in the Social Contract: According to Rousseau, both the individual and the framework of politico-legal institutions constitute necessary targets of revolutionary change. Rousseau’s considerations thus underline the interdependence of both transformative dimensions.

f. The Question of the Extension of Revolution

This question pertains to (a) the temporality or, more narrowly, the duration and (b) the expansion of revolutionary transformation. Theorists dissent considerably as to whether such transformation has to be conceived as momentary, procedural, or permanent; they also disagree whether revolutions are to be understood as local, national, international, or global instances of profound, lasting politico-social change.

On the basis of his “messianic” conception of time and history that rejects the conventional understanding of time as “empty” (that is, as continuous and homogenous), Benjamin interprets revolution as a “shock” that kairologically disrupts the prevailing chronological and, with it, social and political order. For him, revolution thus constitutes a momentary event that makes a switch from a state of historical normalcy to a state of historical exception possible. This switch is as radical as it is sudden: “Every second” has the potential to serve as the gate through which “the messiah” can enter to fundamentally transform the world (compare Benjamin, 2009 [1940/42]). As opposed to Benjamin, thinkers like Hegel or Antonio Gramsci (1891-1937) understand revolution as a process that spans in time before it leads to substantial, intelligible change, that is, to new political, legal, and economic, cultural, linguistic, and aesthetic principles being implemented and effectively taking root. Although Hegel describes the French Revolution as a “glorious dawn,” it is evident for him that the political events of the late 1780s and early 1790s are belated, derivative effects of a long-lasting historical epoch of revolution that encompasses the ages of the reformation and the enlightenment (compare Hegel, 1991 [1832-45]). Discussing revolution in more narrowly political terms, Gramsci describes its realization as a tedious “war of position” against “hegemonic” power structures: It is only by means of persistently working their way through numerous struggles with the opponents of revolution over time that its carriers can hope to supersede an established order (compare Gramsci, 1992 [1929-35]). Similarly, Marx and Engels put emphasis on the aspect of duration. Modeling their understanding of revolution on the Israelites’ exodus from Egypt (compare Walzer, 1985), they attribute great significance to the interval period that lies in between the status quo at the time of the failed revolutions of 1848 and the future actualization of a classless society. Given the considerable distance between the initial and the terminal point of revolution, they propose a notion and practical program of “permanent revolution” that links immature democratic revolution to mature “proletarian” revolution. In modernizing and democratizing this idea, Étienne Balibar (*1942) expounds an understanding of revolution as a continuous, open-ended task. According to his view, revolution cannot hope for a final stage of satisfaction and completion (compare Balibar, 2014). Instead, it means an ongoing exercise in responsible citizenship and in “democratizing democracy.” This exercise allows for an ever increasing inclusion of groups and individuals who, heretofore, have been denied the ability to “take part,” that is, for their unrestricted recognition as full subjects of “equaliberty,” which is a hybrid term indicating the two main trajectories of modern emancipatory politics: On one side, the Lockean liberal and individualist strand and, on the other, the Rousseauian socialist and collectivist strand, which Balibar takes to be interdependent and co-constitutive elements of democratic revolution.

Other thinkers discuss revolution primarily in terms of its spatial extension. Contemporary anarchist theorist David Graeber (*1961) argues that revolutionary projects can be pursued by the creation of “autonomous spaces” on a local scale. Within such spheres, alternatives to dominant forms of coexistence and interaction, of politics and economy can be practiced whereby the existing order is unmasked as contingent. What is more, in drawing on exemplary practices from other epochs and cultures, the contours of an order devoid of institutions such as the state or capitalism and of repressive convictions such as racism and misogyny are “pre-figured.” For Graeber, the narrow spatial limits of these alternative micro-worlds characterized by autonomy, mutual aid, and direct democracy do not negatively affect their subversive, transformative capacities (compare Graeber, 2004). Whereas thinkers such as, for example, Sieyès and Foucault see the nation state as the adequate space for revolution to occur (compare Sieyès, 2003 [1789]; Foucault, 2005 [1978-79]), others claim that this is too limited a scope for radical transformation to have profound and lasting impact. For instance, Lenin, not unlike Sartre in his “revolutionary humanism” (compare Sartre, 1955 [1946]), follows Marx in emphasizing the transnational implications of revolution even if its scope, especially in its early phases, has to be national for reasons of mere practicability. According to Lenin, emancipatory projects carried out by a “revolutionary people” send shockwaves across neighboring as well as distant countries. Thus, it is evident to him, that the Russian Revolution ultimately represents the “interests of world socialism,” which outweigh mere national interests (compare Lenin, 1987 [1902]; 1978 [1917]). This position takes up the universalism inherent to the American and French Revolution which finds its expression in pronounced references to the “rights of man” in the writings and speeches of Paine or Mirabeau as well as in the essential political documents of the revolutionary period: the 1776 Declaration of Independence and the 1789 Declaration of the Rights of Man and of the Citizen.

4. Conclusion

Even when the plurality of manners in which “revolution” is used in the domains of technology and science, culture and art, is left aside and when the term is applied in the domain of politics only, the heterogeneity and contested nature of understandings remains considerable. In spite of the wide range of specific approaches, arguments, and agendas characteristic of the individual theories of political revolution, they can be situated within one multifaceted, yet unified intellectual space: From the theoretical enablers and “inventors” of revolution like Rousseau, Paine, or Kant to contemporary thinkers of revolution like Balibar or Graeber, their theories have been confronted with a number of central problems and questions which open up, shape, and sustain this space. It is primarily in terms of these central questions that they have attempted to conceptually grasp revolution. Six of these questions have been outlined in the above sections: (1) the question of revolutionary novelty which is discussed on a spectrum between the extremes of absolute and relative notions of rupture and beginning; (2) the question of revolutionary violence and its legitimacy discussed on the spectrum between unqualified approval and unreserved exclusion as a means of revolution; (3) the question of revolutionary freedom discussed on the spectrum between negative (liberation) and positive (foundation) concepts of freedom as the aim of revolution; (4) the question of the revolutionary subject discussed on the spectrum between individual doers on the one end and a global “multitude” on the other; (5) the question of the revolutionary object or target discussed on the spectrum between political, social institutions and individual, subjective attitudes, convictions, and beliefs; and, (6), the question of the temporal and spatial extension of revolution discussed on the spectrum between momentary and local on the one end, permanent and global on the other. Despite their pronounced heterogeneity and their attempts to periodically redefine revolution, it is with respect to these key questions that the theories presented here share family resemblances to one another.

Defining whether political change can be considered revolutionary constitutes the conceptual issue at the core of these theories. In particular, they aim at circumscribing revolution in regard to related, yet distinct concepts such as revolt, rebellion, and reform whereby the questions of the new, of liberty, and of the legitimacy of violence serve as the most relevant criteria for demarcation. The first two criteria play a central role in the distinction between revolution on the one hand, revolt and rebellion on the other. As a consequence of the underlying main goal of casting off an unjust, oppressive regime, both revolt and rebellion are based on limited notions of novelty and liberty. Thus, in comparison to revolutionary change, the specific kind of change they aspire to is more marginal in its scope. However, once revolution is not conceived as momentary but as procedural (as is the case in Kant’s or Marx’s considerations), drawing such a clear conceptual line seems less feasible: If revolution is understood as a temporal sequence that encompasses multiple stages, an initial “revolting” or “rebellious” phase is conceivable, for which the aspect of durable foundation of a new order is secondary. For the differentiation of revolution and reform, the criteria of novelty and violence are central. Whereas the criterion of violence reliably allows for a demarcation, temporalized understandings of revolution entail the blurring of a seemingly obvious difference with respect to the aspect of novelty: Here, a concluding “reformist” phase of revolution is thinkable in which the configuration of an institutional order or the establishment of a common ground with former “enemies of the revolution” takes precedence. Accordingly, when Kropotkin links revolution and revolt or when Kant explicitly associates revolution with reform, the relatedness between these concepts and not to mention the phenomena is reflected. In light of these resemblances, attempts at a precise conceptual critique of revolution, which distinguishes it sharply from revolt, rebellion, or reform remain heuristic in character.

Determining if and under what conditions revolutionary action and, especially, revolutionary violence are morally justified constitutes the normative issue at the core of theories of revolution. Although revolution represents the most radical expression of dissent and protest, the determination of its legitimacy reveals points of contact with debates on less extreme forms of a politics of resistance and transformation such as, for example, civil disobedience (compare Rawls, 1999). Despite the differences as to, inter alia, the scope of the envisaged transformation, their legitimacy essentially depends on the underlying cause and motivation. Revolutionary action and, with it, at least temporary political disorder, can only be considered legitimate if it aims at overcoming continued violations of the basic rights of specific groups or entire nations by the regime in power that are both severe and systematic. While conflict between ruling powers and revolutionary movements typically takes place within the context of a state, broader issues independent of the policies of a specific state can also be invoked as a justified cause to engage in radically transformative politics. The Occupy movement and its appeal to the inequalities brought about by the current global economic system is a case in point. Within and beyond the context of the state, the intention to right the wrongs—that is, the injustices as to dignity, liberty, and equality—committed by a regime and secured by unjust political, legal, social, or economic institutions is the primary precondition for a revolutionary project’s justifiability.

Furthermore, the (il)legitimacy of revolutionary politics is determined by the heavily disputed question of the permissibility of revolutionary violence. In relation to this question, the focus is not on the just cause, the right reason and intention of such a politics, but on the conduct in the course of its realization. The dispute pertains to different dimensions: It concerns the general issue whether violence can be considered a politically and, more importantly, morally justifiable means of revolution, in other words, whether, based on strategic or principled considerations, its use can be justified at all. In addition, it concerns more specific issues such as its justifiable form (for example, violence against property), scope (for example, violence limited to early stages of the revolutionary process), and status (for example, violence as a last resort once all peaceful alternatives have failed). Here, the discussion on revolution resembles theoretical debates on just war (Arendt, 2006 [1963]; Walzer, 2006 [1977]). For instance, much like in the case of the ius in bello, attempts to formulate essential criteria of acceptable revolutionary conduct aim at ensuring the proportionality of the use of violence, at discriminating between legitimate and illegitimate targets, and at prohibiting hostile acts which are “vile in themselves” (compare Kant, 2006c [1795/96]). Besides the perspectives of cause (in analogy to the terminology of just war theory: ius ad revolutionem) and conduct (ius in revolutione), there is a third critical perspective, in terms of which the legitimacy of revolutionary action and violence is determined. This perspective focuses on the ius post revolutionem, that is, on the final stage of a revolution, and assesses its capacity to terminate the state of exception in order to transition into a new and stable political order. Thereby, the stability of such a reconstitution is largely predicated on reconciliation with and inclusion of former adversaries. It is mainly thanks to the criteria of cause, conduct, and reconstitution that revolutionary violence becomes distinguishable from the violence used by criminals and, especially, terrorists. However, largely on the basis of formative historical experiences of excessive revolutionary violence—of revolutions not only harming their enemies, but also “devouring their children” —as well as of Gandhi’s or Mandela’s successful transformative projects, non-violent revolutionary action generally has a greater claim to justification.

A further relevant issue with regard to just revolution theory pertains to the self-authorization of revolutionary movements, which raises the questions whom such movements speak for and whose interests they represent. This issue crystallizes in revolutionary declarations that often appeal to “the people” (compare Habermas, 1990; Derrida, 2002). In this case, the legitimacy of a revolutionary project depends, among other things, on whether the revolutionaries’ political power and the sovereignty of the regime they establish is based on force or on discourse, that is, on oppression or persuasion of the majority.

To conclude, this article provides a sample of the rich theoretical discourse surrounding the contested concept of revolution. While the positions developed within the three dominant schools of thought (democratic, communist, and anarchist) are strongly shaped by broader commitments to the underlying political philosophies and often indebted to other debates (for example, on war), this discourse has distinctive features due to the specificity of its object of investigation and the controversial exchange of views between the different traditions. Given both its width and unsettledness, there are significant conceptual and normative issues for philosophers to address. It is not only in light of the often problematic history of revolutions that it is expedient to theoretically “provide yardsticks and measurements” (Hannah Arendt); a thorough analysis and critical assessment of transformative concepts, agendas, and strategies is also required because of the contemporary re-emergence of movements with revolutionary aspirations from the Zapatistas to the Arabellion, Occupy, or the Indignados.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Arendt, H., 2006, On Revolution [1963], New York: Penguin.
  • Badiou, A., 2012, The Rebirth of History, trans. G. Elliott, London/New York: Verso.
  • Balibar, É., 2014, Equaliberty: Political Essays, trans J. Ingram, Durham: Duke University Press.
  • Bakunin, M., 2009, God and the State [1871], New York: Cosimo.
  • Bakunin, M., 1990, Statism and Anarchy [1873], trans. & ed. M.S. Shatz, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Benjamin, W., 2009, On the Concept of History [1940/42], New York: Classic Books America.
  • Benjamin, W., 1999, Zur Kritik der Gewalt [1921], in Walter Benjamin Gesammelte Schriften, vol. II.1, eds. R. Tiedemann & H. Schweppenhauser, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 179–204.
  • Berman, H., 1985, Law and Revolution: The Formation of the Western Legal Tradition, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Butler, J., 2015, Notes Toward a Performative Theory of Assembly, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Camus, A., 1991, The Rebel: An Essay on Man in Revolt [1951], trans. A. Bower, New York: Vintage Books.
  • Condorcet, J.A.N. de, 2012, Political writings, eds. S. Lukes & N. Urbinati, Cambridge, UK/New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dawoody, M., 2011, The Islamic Law of War: Justifications and Regulations, London: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • DeFronzo, J., 2011, Revolution and Revolutionary Movements, Boulder: Westview Press.
  • Derrida, J., 2002, “Declarations of Independence”, in Negotiations: Interventions and Interviews 1971-2001, ed. & trans. E. Rottenberg, Stanford: Stanford University Press, 46–54.
  • Engels, F., 1969, Germany: Revolution and Counter-Revolution [1851/52], with the collaboration of Karl Marx, ed. E. Marx, London: Lawrence & Wishart.
  • Fadl, K., 2006, Rebellion and Violence in Islamic Law, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Fanon, F., 1967, The Wretched of the Earth [1961], trans. C. Farrington, Harmondsworth: Penguin.
  • Foucault, M., 2005, “Writings on the Iranian Revolution” [1978-79], in Foucault and the Iranian Revolution: Gender and the Seductions of Islamism, eds. J. Afary & K.B. Anderson, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 179–277.
  • Furet, F., and, M. Ozouf (eds.), 1989, A Critical Dictionary of the French Revolution, Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press.
  • Graeber, D., 2004, Fragments of an Anarchist Anthropology, Chicago: Prickly Paradigm Press.
  • Gramsci, A., 1992–, Prison Notebooks [1929-35], New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Habermas, J., 1990, “Naturrecht und Revolution”, in Theorie und Praxis, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 89–127.
  • Hardt, M., and A. Negri, 2004, Multitude: War and Democracy in the Age of Empire, New York: Penguin Press.
  • Hegel, G.W.F., 1977, Phenomenology of Spirit [1807], trans. A.V. Miller, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Hegel, G.W.F., 1991, The Philosophy of History [1832-45], trans. J. Sibree, Buffalo, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Hobsbawm, E., 1996, The Age of Revolution: Europe 1789-1848 [1962], New York: Vintage Books.
  • Jefferson, Th., 2004–, The Papers of Thomas Jefferson: Retirement Series, ed. J.J. Looney, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Jefferson, Th., 2010, The Selected Writings of Thomas Jefferson: Authoritative Texts, Contexts, Criticism, ed. W. Franklin, New York: W. W. Norton & Co.
  • Kant, I., 2006a, “An Answer to the Question: What is Enlightenment?” [1784] in Toward Perpetual Peace and other Writings on Politics, Peace, and History, ed. P. Kleingeld, trans. D.L. Colclasure, New Haven: Yale University Press, 17–23.
  • Kant, I., 2006b, “Idea for a Universal History from a Cosmopolitan Perspective” [1784], in Toward Perpetual Peace and other Writings on Politics, Peace, and History, ed. P. Kleingeld, trans. D.L. Colclasure, New Haven: Yale University Press, 3–16.
  • Kant, I., 1991, “The Contest of Faculties” [1798], in Kant: Political Writings, ed. H. Reiss, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 176–190.
  • Kant, I., 1996, The Metaphysics of Morals [1797], trans. & ed. M. Gregor, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kant. I, 2006c, “Toward Perpetual Peace: A Philosophical Sketch” [1795/96], in Toward Perpetual Peace and other Writings on Politics, Peace, and History, ed. P. Kleingeld, trans. D.L. Colclasure, New Haven: Yale University Press, 67–109.
  • Kantorowicz, E., 1997, The King’s two Bodies: A Study in Medieval Political Theology [1957], Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Koselleck, R., 2004, Futures Past: On the Semantics of Historical Time, trans. K. Tribe, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Koselleck, R. et al., 1984, “Revolution (Rebellion, Aufruhr, Bürgerkrieg)”, in Geschichtliche Grundbegriffe. Historisches Lexikon zur politisch-sozialen Sprache in Deutschland, volume 5, eds. O. Brunner, W. Conze, & R. Koselleck, Stuttgart: Klett-Cotta, 653–788.
  • Kropotkin, P., 2008, The Conquest of Bread [1892], Oakland, CA: AK Press.
  • Kropotkin, P., 1972, Mutual Aid: A Factor of Evolution [1902], ed. P. Avrich, New York: New York University Press.
  • Lenin, V.I., 1987, Essential Works of Lenin: What is to be done? and other writings, ed. H.M. Christman, New York: Dover Publications.
  • Lenin, V.I., 1978, State and Revolution: Marxist Teaching about the Theory of the State and the Tasks of the Proletariat in the Revolution [1917], Westport: Greenwood Press.
  • Locke, J., 1986, Second Treatise on Civil Government [1689], Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Marcuse, H., 1984, “Ethik und Revolution” [1964], in Herbert Marcuse Schriften, volume 8, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 100–114.
  • Marcuse, H., 1991, One-dimensional Man: Studies in the Ideology of Advanced Industrial Society [1964], Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Marx, K., 2001a, Capital: A critique of Political Economy. Vol. I, Book One, The Process of Production of Capital [1867], trans. S. Moore & E. Aveling, London: Electric Book Co.
  • Marx, K., 2001b, The Class Struggles in France [1850], London: Electric Book Co.
  • Marx, K., 2012, The Communist Manifesto [1848], with Friedrich Engels, London: Verso.
  • Menke, Ch., and, F. Raimondi (eds.), 2011, Die Revolution der Menschenrechte. Grundlegende Texte zu einem neuen Begriff des Politischen, Berlin: Suhrkamp.
  • Merleau-Ponty, M., 2005, Philosophy of Perception [1945], London/New York: Routledge.
  • Nail, T., 2012, Returning to Revolution: Deleuze, Guattari, and Zapatismo, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Nussbaum, M., 2013, Political Emotions: Why Love Matters for Justice, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Paine, Th., 2012, Common Sense [1776], ed. R. Beeman, New York: Penguin.
  • Paine, Th., 2000, Political Writings, ed. B. Kuklick, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Paine, Th., 1992, Rights of Man [1791], ed. G. Claeys, Indianapolis: Hackett Pub. Co.
  • Palmer, R., 2014, The Age of Democratic Revolution: A Political History of Europe and America 1760-1800 [1959], Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Rawls, J., 1999, “The Justification of Civil Disobedience”, in John Rawls: Collected Papers, S. Freeman (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 176–189.
  • Rosenstock-Huessy, E., 1993, Out of Revolution: Autobiography of Western Man [1938], Providence: Berg Publishers.
  • Rousseau, J.-J., 1992, Discourse on the Origin of Inequality [1755], trans. D.A. Cress, Indianapolis: Hackett Pub. Co.
  • Rousseau, J.J., 2012, Of the Social Contract and other Political Writings [1762], ed. C. Bertram, trans. Q. Hoare, London: Penguin.
  • Sartre, J.-P., 1962, “Materialism and Revolution” [1946], in Literary and Philosophical Essays, transl. A. Michelson, New York: Criterion Books, 185–239.
  • Sartre, J.-P., 1967, “Preface”, in The Wretched of the Earth, F. Fanon, Harmondsworth: Penguin.
  • Sieyès, E.J., 2003, Political Writings: Including the Debate between Sieyès and Tom Paine, with a Translation of What is the Third Estate?, ed. M. Sonenscher, Indianapolis: Hackett Pub. Co.
  • Skopcol, T., 1979, States and Social Revolutions, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Walzer, M., 1985, Exodus and Revolution, New York: Basic Books.
  • Walzer, M., 2006, Just and Unjust Wars: A Moral Argument with Historical Illustrations [1977], New York: Basic Books.
  • Walzer, M., 1992, Regicide and Revolution: Speeches at the Trial of Louis XVI [1972], New York/Oxford: Columbia University Press.
  • Zizek, S., 2012, The Year of Dreaming Dangerously, London/Brooklyn, NY: Verso.
  • Zizek, S., 2008, Violence: Six Sideway Reflections, New York: Picador.

Author Information

Florian Grosser
Email: florian.grosser@unisg.ch
University of St. Gallen