Political realism is a theory of political philosophy that attempts to explain, model, and prescribe political relations. It takes as its assumption that power is (or ought to be) the primary end of political action, whether in the domestic or international arena. In the domestic arena, the theory asserts that politicians do, or should, strive to maximize their power, whilst on the international stage, nation states are seen as the primary agents that maximize, or ought to maximize, their power. The theory is therefore to be examined as either a prescription of what ought to be the case, that is, nations and politicians ought to pursue power or their own interests, or as a description of the ruling state of affairs-that nations and politicians only pursue (and perhaps only can pursue) power or self-interest.
Political realism in essence reduces to the political-ethical principle that might is right. The theory has a long history, being evident in Thucydides’ Pelopennesian War. It was expanded on by Machiavelli in The Prince, and others such as Thomas Hobbes, Spinoza, and Jean-Jacques Rousseau followed (the theory was given great dramatical portrayed in Shakespeare’s Richard III). In the late nineteenth century it underwent a new incarnation in the form of social darwinism, whose adherents explained social and hence political growth in terms of a struggle in which only the fittest (strongest) cultures or polities would survive. Political realism assumes that interests are to be maintained through the exercise of power, and that the world is characterised by competing power bases. In international politics, most political theorists emphasise the nation state as the relevant agent, whereas Marxists focus on classes. Prior to the French Revolution in which nationalism as a political doctrine truly entered the world’s stage, political realism involved the political jurisdictions of ruling dynasties, whilst in the nineteenth century, nationalist sentiments focused realists’ attentions on the development of the nation-state, a policy that was later extended to include imperialist ambitions on the part of the major Western powers-Britain and France, and even Belgium, Germany and the United States were influenced by imperialism. Nationalist political realism later extended into geo-political theories, which perceive the world to be divided into supra-national cultures, such as East and West, North and South, Old World and New World, or focusing on the pan-national continental aspirations of Africa, Asia, etc. Whilst the social darwinist branch of political realism may claim that some nations are born to rule over others (being ‘fitter’ for the purpose, and echoing Aristotle’s ruminations on slavery in Book 1 of the The Politics), generally political realists focus on the need or ethic of ensuring that the relevant agent (politician, nation, culture) must ensure its own survival by securing its own needs and interests before it looks to the needs of others.
To explore the various shades and implications of the theory, its application to international affairs is examined.
Descriptive political realism commonly holds that the international community is characterized by anarchy, since there is no overriding world government that enforces a common code of rules. Whilst this anarchy need not be chaotic, for various member states of the international community may engage in treaties or in trading patterns that generate an order of sorts, most theorists conclude that law or morality does not apply beyond the nation’s boundaries. Arguably political realism supports Hobbes’s view of the state of nature, namely that the relations between self-seeking political entities are necessarily a-moral. Hobbes asserts that without a presiding government to legislate codes of conduct, no morality or justice can exist: “Where there is no common Power, there is no Law: where no Law, no Injustice¼ if there be no Power erected, or not great enough for our security; every man will and may lawfully rely on his own strength and art, for caution against all other men.” (Hobbes, Leviathan, Part I, Ch.13 ‘Of Man’, and Part II, Ch.17, ‘Of Commonwealth’) Accordingly, without a supreme international power or tribunal, states view each other with fear and hostility, and conflict, or the threat thereof, is endemic to the system.
Another proposition is that a nation can only advance its interests against the interests of other nations; this implies that the international environment is inherently unstable. Whatever order may exists breaks down when nations compete for the same resources, for example, and war may follow. In such an environment, the realists argue, a nation has only itself to depend on.
Either descriptive political realism is true or it is false. If it is true, it does not follow, however, that morality ought not to be applied to international affairs: what ought to be does not always follow from what is. A strong form of descriptive political realism maintains that nations are necessarily self-seeking, that they can only form foreign policy in terms of what the nation can gain, and cannot, by their very nature, cast aside their own interests. However, if descriptive realism is held, it is as a closed theory, which means that it can refute all counter-factual evidence on its own terms (for example, evidence of a nation offering support to a neighbour as an ostensible act of altruism, is refuted by pointing to some self-serving motive the giving nation presumably has–it would increase trade, it would gain an important ally, it would feel guilty if it didn’t, and so on), then any attempt to introduce morality into international affairs would prove futile. Examining the soundness of descriptive political realism depends on the possibility of knowing political motives, which in turn means knowing the motives of the various officers of the state and diplomats. The complexity of the relationship between officers’ actions, their motives, subterfuge, and actual foreign policy makes this a difficult if not impossible task, one for historians rather than philosophers. Logically, the closed nature of descriptive realism implies that a contrary proposition that nations serve no interests at all, or can only serve the interests of others, could be just as valid. The logical validity of the three resulting theories suggests that preferring one position to another is an arbitrary decision-i.e., an assumption to be held, or not. This negates the soundness of descriptive realism; it is not a true or false description of international relations but is reduced to an arbitrary assumption. Assumptions can be tested against the evidence, but in themselves cannot be proved true or false. Finally, what is the case need not be, nor need it ought to be.
That the present international arena of states is characterized by the lack of an overarching power is an acceptable description. Evidentially, war has been common enough to give support to political realism-there have been over 200 wars and conflicts since the signing of the Treaty of Westphalia in 1648. The seemingly anarchic state of affairs has led some thinkers to make comparisons with domestic anarchy, when a government does not exist to rule or control a nation. Without a world power, they may reason, war, conflict, tension, and insecurity have been the regular state of affairs; they may then conclude that just as a domestic government removes internal strife and punishes local crime, so too ought a world government control the activities of individual states-overseeing the legality of their affairs and punishing those nations that break the laws, and thereby calming the insecure atmosphere nations find themselves in. However, the ‘domestic analogy’ makes the presumption that relations between individuals and relations between states are the same. Christian Wolff, for example, holds that “since states are regarded as individual free persons living in a state of nature, nations must also be regarded in relation to each other as individual free persons living in a state of nature.” (Jus Gentium Methodo Scientifica Pertractatum Trans. Joseph Drake. Clarendon Press: Oxford, 1934, §2, p.9). Such an argument involves the collectivization of individuals and/or the personification of states: realism may describe nations as individuals acting upon the world stage to further their own interests, but behind the concept of ‘France’ or ‘South Africa’ exist millions of unique individuals, who may or may not agree with the claims for improving the national interest. Some (e.g., Gordon Graham, Ethics and International Relations, 1997) claim that the relationships between states and their civilians are much more different than those between nation states, since individuals can hold beliefs and can suffer whereas states cannot. If the domestic analogy does not hold, arguably a different theory must be proposed to explain the state of international affairs, which either means revising political realism to take into account the more complex relationship between a collective and individual entities, or moving to a alternative theory of international relations.
Beyond the descriptive propositions of political realism, prescriptive political realism argues that whatever the actual state of international affairs, nations should pursue their own interests. This theory resolves into various shades depending on what the standard of the national interest is claimed to be and the moral permissibility of employing various means to desired ends. Several definitions may be offered as to what ought to comprise the national interest: more often than not the claims invoke the need to be economically and politically self-sufficient, thereby reducing dependency on untrustworthy nations.
The argument in supporting the primacy of self-sufficiency as forming the national interest has a long history: Plato and Aristotle both argued in favour of economic self-sufficiency on grounds of securing a nation’s power-nations, they both reasoned, should only import non-necessary commodities. The power of this economic doctrine has been often been used to support political realism: in the eighteenth century especially, political theorists and mercantilists maintained that political power could only be sustained and increased through reducing a nation’s imports and increasing its exports. The common denominator between the two positions is the proposition that a nation can only grow rich at the expense of others. If England’s wealth increases, France’s must concomitantly decrease. This influential tier supporting political realism is, however, unsound. Trade is not necessarily exclusively beneficial to one party: it is often mutually beneficial. The economists Adam Smith and David Ricardo explained the advantages to be gained by both parties from free, unfettered trade. Nonetheless, the realist may admit this and retort that despite the gains from trade, nations should not rely on others for their sustenance, or that free trade ought not to be supported since it often implies undesired cultural changes. In that respect, the nation’s interests are defined as lying over and above any material benefits to be gained from international collaboration and co-operation. The right to a separate cultural identity is a separate
Political realists are often characterised as a-moralists, that any means should be used to uphold the national interest, but a poignant criticism is that the definition of morality is being twisted to assume that acting in one’s own or one’s nation’s interests is immoral or amoral at best. This is an unfair claim against serving one’s national interest, just as claiming that any self-serving action is necessarily immoral on the personal level. The discussion invokes the ethics of impartiality; those who believe in a universal code of ethics argue that a self-serving action that cannot be universalized is immoral. However, universalism is not the only standard of ethical actions. Partiality, it can be claimed, should play a role in ethical decisions; partialists deem it absurd that state officials should not give their own nation greater moral weight over other nations, just as it would be absurd for parents to give equal consideration to their children and others’ children. But if morality is employed in the sense of being altruistic, or at least universalistic, then political realists would rightly admit that attempting to be moral will be detrimental to the national interest or for the world as a whole, and therefore morality ought to be ignored. But, if morality accepts the validity of at least some self-serving actions, then ipso facto political realism may be a moral political doctrine.
Last updated: April 27, 2005 | Originally published: