Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Praise and Blame

Joel Feinberg observed that “moral responsibility… is a subject about which we are all confused” (1970: 37). Perhaps nowhere is this confusion more evident than in our understandings of praise and blame. This entry will contrast three influential philosophical accounts of our everyday practices of praise and blame, in terms of how they might be justified. On the one hand, a broadly Kantian approach sees responsibility for actions as relying on forms of self-control that point back to the idea of free will. On this account praise and blame are justified because a person freely chooses her actions. Praise and blame respond to the person as the chooser of her deed; they recognize her dignity as a rational agent, as Kantians tend to put it. This approach sharply contrasts with two further ways of thinking about the issues. One is utilitarian, where praise and blame are justified in terms of their social benefits. Another, more complex approach is roughly Aristotelian. This approach situates practices of praise and blame in terms of our on-going relationships with one another. This approach stresses the importance of mutual accountability, moral education, and assessments of character in terms of the many vices and virtues.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Problem of Free Will
  3. Two Contrasting Approaches
    1. The Utilitarian Account
    2. The Aristotelian Account
  4. The Kantian Account and Moral Worth
  5. The Idea of Moral Worth
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

This article will not try to convey the exact details of these accounts, but to show how these ways of looking at mutual accountability capture important parts of our everyday commonsense. One modern commentator claimed that, in our attitudes to moral responsibility, “we are all Kantians now” – by “we” meaning not just philosophers but all Western persons (Adkins, 1960: 2). Another central figure in this debate, Bernard Williams, agrees that Kant captured a widespread tendency of modern moral thinking, but also claims that there exist important counter-tendencies in our actual practices of responsibility. For Williams, ancient Greek understandings are actually more realistic and helpful than the Kantian one. So far as our modern praising and blaming actually make sense, he claims, they are better captured by a (roughly) Aristotelian account.

There are some important differences between praise and blame that will not be central to this entry; in fact, blame will get the greatest attention here. This is partly because praise seems less problematic: misplaced blame is felt as deeply unfair, not least because being exposed to blame is unpleasant and costly in a way that being praised is not. But it is principally because blame has a closer connection than praise to matters of intense philosophical interest, including freedom, responsibility and desert. We often praise inanimate objects (such as art works or buildings) and animals (a loyal pet, for example), although we could not blame such entities, however deeply dissatisfied we felt with them. The focus of this article, however, will be upon entities that are clearly open to blame as well as praise: human beings.

What is blame, such that only human beings can be blamed? We are all familiar with resentment, reproach and accusation regarding a person’s past actions; likewise, we all know the sense of guilt, shame or indignation they can elicit. Philosophers differ on how far certain emotions may be central to blame (this relates to a wider dispute, regarding which emotions, if any, constitute a proper basis for moral action). What is clear is that blame suggests both responsibility and culpability. Here, responsibility only implies that the act can be identified with a person, such that she can reasonably be expected to respond for it in some way. That is, it does not necessarily imply fault, or culpability. This is the idea that the person is “in the wrong,” that fault somehow attaches to them so that they deserve blame. (Philosophers tend to describe this as “blameworthiness.”) What sense we should give to these ideas of culpability or desert, and what is necessary for us to think of a person as responsible: these are central issues for this entry.

For further aspects of responsibility, see the sister entry to this article, responsibility. Another article also examines the topic of free will in depth. Nonetheless, since Kant’s account begins with the question of free will, it is also necessary to say something about this straightaway. The entry will then set out the utilitarian and Aristotelian accounts, before returning to Kant’s theory. It concludes by discussing ideas of moral worth and desert that make Kant’s account so appealing.

2. The Problem of Free Will

The free will debate has become an old chestnut of modern philosophy. It is an intuitively plausible way of approaching the issues – familiar to many even before they encounter philosophical texts. It is perhaps surprising, then, that this debate is actually a rather modern one.

The basic gist is this: if I am to be responsible (really responsible) for my conduct, then it must be within my control. However, if it is true that every event in the universe is determined by causal laws, then this must be true of the events that constitute my actions. Therefore, my conduct cannot really be within my control; therefore, I am not really responsible for my conduct. Two conclusions immediately suggest themselves. One is that it is incoherent to praise or blame me – and everyone else – for our actions, because it is so difficult to doubt the causal well-orderedness of the universe. The alternative conclusion, scarcely more appealing, is that the human will somehow sits outside this causal framework – ie, we have free will – because it is unthinkable that our moral ideas be so desperately incoherent.

Both lines of thought are incompatibilist; that is, they see the ideas of responsibility involved in praise and blame as incompatible with the causal well-orderedness of the universe. But while both attract some limited support among philosophers, the overwhelming consensus now lies with compatibilism. This is simply the thesis that responsibility and causal order are compatible. Most philosophers agree that the alleged incompatibility results from some important confusions, although there is much less consensus about what these may be. At least one area of confusion is clear, however, and forms the central issue of this article: what sort of responsibility for conduct is involved in praise and blame? Several familiar points in the free will debate are helpful for approaching this.

In the first place, it is well-known that this debate does not turn on the truth of determinism as such. Determinism is the idea that every event is determined by fixed causal laws. Yet it may well be that every event is somehow random in origin. One interpretation of quantum physics claims that causal laws are the product of statistical regularities, while these regularities stem from a near infinite number of random events. So far as the human will is concerned, this makes no difference. If my conduct is the product of chance, this makes me no more responsible for it than does its being generated by causal laws. The point is that if I am to be blamed or praised, then I must control my conduct – not causal laws, nor mere chance, nor some particular combination of the two.

Second, the free will debate bears a disquieting similarity to an older controversy. In medieval philosophy it used to be asked how God’s omniscience – his knowledge of everything that has happened and will happen – could be reconciled with our being subject to his moral judgment (that is, being sent to heaven or to hell). If God knows what we will do then this seems to imply that it is already decided whether we will act well or badly. And this, in turn, suggests that it makes no sense to punish or reward us. Theologians developed various doctrines to overcome this difficulty, but few sound convincing to modern ears – perhaps because the problem itself is no longer a live one, even for most believers. However that may be, it is interesting that many modern versions of the debate seem to take at least one of the planks of Christian theology for granted: that individuals have wills that can be bad or good, usually now expressed in the terms of people’s “blameworthiness” or (less often) “praiseworthiness.”

In this way, the modern American philosopher Joel Feinberg ironically referred to “a moral bank account” that we carry through life, which sums up our moral credits and debits in a single sum (1970: 20). Whether or not such an “account” makes sense, it is at least clear that the idea of “the will” is by no means self-explanatory. For Kant, as we shall see, it was obvious that all my choices can be summed up in a single moral evaluation, whether I have a “good” or “bad” will. Kant is equivocal, however, as to whether only God might make this evaluation, or whether human beings might also form reasonable opinions on the matter. But especially if we take the point of view of mutual, human accountability, it is not obvious why we should believe any such single evaluation to be possible, or what role this evaluation might play in our individual or collective lives. Certainly, we usually praise and blame in terms of particular actions and particular vices and virtues – not a good or bad will.

Third, this way of framing the issues creates a problematic gulf between normal moral agents (adult human beings of sound mind) and other creatures – animals and children. At some stage of evolution, and at some stage toward maturity, certain animals become “free,” when before they had all been determined in their conduct. Although it is grossly implausible that there are no relevant moral differences between the other animals, children, and human adults, it is no more plausible that the free will simply pops into existence at a certain stage of human development. (Within a Christian framework this issue was less problematic: human beings, and only human beings, have souls.) Nonetheless, we tend to think there is something sufficiently distinctive about human action, so that many non-religious people find the idea of free will plausible, and almost everyone assumes that blame (if not praise) only makes sense with regard to (mature?) human beings.

Taking the last three points together generates a further point. If the idea of the will is complex, and there is no straightforward moral dividing line between children and adults, between humans and other animals – together, these ideas suggest that a “will” is not something we all straightforwardly “have.” In other words: it is implausible that all adult humans have the same capacities, all to the same extent, that are involved in controlling action. One way of retaining the idea of the will might be to think of it as the bundle of capacities that are needed to control action in the light of moral concerns, these capacities being set only at such a level that all adult human beings of sound mind really seem to possess them. But two points need to be kept in mind about such a strategy. First, it remains the case that people will vary in how far they possess such capacities, and this variation will largely be a product of upbringing and natural qualities – that is, not something within an individual’s own control. Second, the sort of ultimate control over one’s moral character supposed in Kant’s or similar “free will” accounts is unlikely to be vindicated in this way.

3. Two Contrasting Approaches

Two influential lines of thought oppose the idea that praise and blame relate to “free will,” the metaphysical idea that we are responsible for our action because they are controlled by us and not (simply) caused by the world around us. For the utilitarian, praise and blame, like all our other practices, can only be justified in terms of their social consequences. A more complex account was given by Aristotle, who shares the utilitarian’s sense that praise and blame have important social consequences, but also offers an extended account of how they relate to the capacities needed for moral action.

a. The Utilitarian Account

The utilitarian case is straightforward. Blame and praise encourage us to perform socially valuable actions and to avoid socially costly actions. If we know we will be blamed for greed or cruelty, for example, then we have powerful motives to avoid these. Praise and blame also involve us in making assessments of people’s strengths and weaknesses, which is important when it comes to deciding who should be entrusted with which tasks and responsibilities. The stingy person might make a good banker, but a bad organizer of social occasions.

This approach does seem to capture important truths: we want to encourage and discourage different sorts of activity, and we need to have a sense of what different people are good at. It also makes sense of why we don’t blame some actions, even if they had bad outcomes (even though, in principle, only outcomes matter to the utilitarian). If the bad outcome was not chosen by the person (for example, she was forced to act that way by someone else), then there is nothing to be gained from blaming them (much better to blame the person who forced her). Thus the utilitarian can accommodate the important fact that praise and blame relate to free action: but this need not be thought of in terms of metaphysical “free will,” but instead the compatibilist freedom involved in choosing one’s actions independently of others’ interference.

But the utilitarian account faces a simple objection: does it really provide for responsibility, still more culpability? For example, if we know that someone does not respond well to criticism, it seems that the utilitarian case for blame is undermined. We would do much better to flatter and cajole them into acting differently. Of course, the utilitarian might reply that this is often what we in fact do with such people. Further, he might add that we do still blame such people when we discuss their characters behind their backs, perhaps describing them as self-righteous or stubborn. What seems to be missing in this response, however, is the idea that the person deserves blame. They seem to deserve criticism in just the same way that a faulty machine or a cracked mug deserve criticism: it’s useful that everyone knows they’re faulty, but they can hardly be described as blameworthy. Especially when we move from blame to the question of sanctions or punishment, this lack of desert seems to present a real problem for the utilitarian account.

Utilitarians face a more complex criticism, which goes beyond the scope of this entry. Historically more concerned with the actions of government than individuals, utilitarianism never developed a realistic moral psychology – that is, very roughly, an account of what makes the decent person tick. This lack of attention has permitted some of the most devastating critique of utilitarianism, such as Bernard Williams’s and Susan Wolf’s. But if we want to understand responsibility, our capacity to accept praise and blame as well as our tendency to dole them out, then we need to have a fairly good picture of moral agency.

b. The Aristotelian Account

This is where Aristotle’s more complex account enters the story. The most famous discussion of when people can be praised and blamed for their actions remains Aristotle’s. As with the utilitarians, Aristotle saw no need to talk about praise and blame in terms of free will. Aristotle speaks of whether acts are voluntary, and whether we attribute them to a person or to other factors. Some have ascribed this way of framing the issues to a lack of moral or scientific sophistication on the part of the ancient Greeks. However, a number of modern philosophers, most prominently Bernard Williams and Martha Nussbaum, have suggested that an Aristotelian account is actually more coherent and sophisticated than those typical of modern philosophy – and, indeed, more coherent than our modern, “common sense” intuitions about moral responsibility.

At first glance, it looks as if Aristotle takes it for granted that we are responsible for our actions, so that others can reasonably praise or blame or punish us. What he does is to highlight various conditions that lessen or cancel our responsibility. He discusses force of events, threats and coercion, ignorance, intoxication and bad character. Yet, taken together, his account shows us the basic elements involved in being a person who can reasonably be praised or blamed.

The first limitation upon voluntary action that Aristotle discusses is force of circumstances. His well-known example concerns a ship caught in a storm; the sailors must throw goods overboard if the ship is not to sink (NE 1110a). In this case the action is not fully voluntary, and we would not blame the sailors for their actions. (Nor, of course, would we blame the storm: the undesirable consequence, the loss of the goods, must be chalked off as the product of natural causes, for which no one can be blamed.) Note that such cases are extreme examples of the force of necessity under which we always live – we are always constrained in our actions by circumstances, although we only tend to notice this when the constraint is sudden or unexpected. (If blame were to arise in such a situation, it would be where the sailors failed to take account of necessity, so that the ship and many aboard perished.)

In fact, it tends to be the interference of other people that causes us the most grief – and which really causes problems for responsibility attributions. Such interference can take many forms, but its paradigmatic forms are coercion and manipulation. Regarding coercion, Aristotle’s judgment is balanced. It depends on what action my coercer is demanding of me, and what threats he makes. Some actions are so heinous that we should be blamed for doing them, whatever we are threatened with (and whatever blame also attaches to our coercer) – thus Aristotle dismisses the idea that a man might be “compelled” to kill his mother (NE 1110a). This makes it clear that a central issue at stake in attributions of responsibility is the expectations that people have of one another. There are some forms of coercion we do not usually expect people to resist, but there are also some sorts of action that we think people should never undertake, regardless of such factors. In such cases praise and blame are clearly working to clarify and reinforce these expectations – in other words, they provide for a form of moral education.

Aristotle does not comment on manipulation, where other people lead us to a false view of our circumstances. But he does discuss ignorance of these circumstances, and how it undermines our responsibility. If we are ignorant of who someone is, for example – as was Oedipus, who did not know that the old man obstructing him was actually his father – we may commit acts we would otherwise abhor – thus Oedipus committed patricide, killing his own father. For Aristotle, such actions are not to be blamed (with the important provisos that the ignorance is not itself culpable and the action was otherwise justified). What decides good or bad character is how a person reacts when he finds out the truth – if we fail to regret our deeds, then we can certainly be blamed, even if the original choice was justifiable. Our regret about the deed shows that we want to disown it, and prepares us to make up for it as best we can. A lack of regret shows we are happy for the deed to have been done anyhow, even though we are now aware of facts that others think should have prevented us from acting that way.

This argument hints at an important point. For Aristotle, the moral judgment of the self may be quite different from the judgments of others. The actor should regret his action deeply but, as long as he does so, on-lookers should not blame, but rather pity or perhaps console him. If we suppose that both actor and on-looker are making a judgment about the actor’s moral worth this seems puzzlingly inconsistent. Yet Aristotle’s account has a different logic: The actor’s regret reveals his determination not to be associated with such an action. The on-lookers’ pity relates to their awareness that this “self-blame” is proper yet not earned; it is something that could fall upon anyone in the wrong circumstances. Simplifying, we could say that on-lookers make a positive judgment of the actor, based on his preparedness to make a negative judgment of himself. But this is not so paradoxical if we think of these judgments, not as relating to moral worth, but as preparations for action. Something has gone wrong, after all, and those affected seem to deserve some recompense. In such a situation, the actor will feel duty-bound to help put things right (perhaps to compensate, at any rate to apologise or show remorse). On-lookers, pitying rather than blaming, try to make his task easier, since the responsibility, in such a case, was not earned by the actor.

We have just discussed actions done in ignorance of the facts. But not every form of ignorance excuses; factual knowledge is very different from moral knowledge. What if a man did not know murder was wrong? Would this make his murders morally innocent? Aristotle says not: there are certain things we can and do expect people to know – above all, basic moral truths such as the wrongness of murder. But this knowledge is not as straightforward as it might appear: it must include a fairly good capacity to judge which sorts of killing count as murder. Nazi bureaucrat Adolf Eichmann organized the killing of thousands, without a sense of its wrongness. Aristotle is clear: such moral ignorance, an inability or failure to judge, excuses no adult. Eichmann should be held responsible for murder. But why should moral ignorance not excuse, when factual ignorance does? We must recognize that moral knowledge is actually rather different from factual knowledge. If a person is morally ignorant it is his whole character, his lasting ability to judge and act well, that is impaired – and presumably very difficult to set right. Isolated errors in factual knowledge, on the other hand, can be easily corrected. So long as we subsequently recognize and regret what we have done, factual mistakes involve no lasting corruption of character.

Still, if a person is morally ignorant it follows that they are unable to choose well. Aristotle agrees, arguing that those of settled bad character – be they morally ignorant or otherwise – are unable to make decent moral judgments. Does this mean that blame is incoherent or misplaced? He claims not. Even if the vicious person cannot now choose to act otherwise, there was a time when her vices were not fixed, when she could have chosen not to be vicious. Therefore, Aristotle says, she can be blamed. This is neat but rather unconvincing. Aristotle is famous for emphasising the importance of good upbringing and habituation, and presumably many vices are formed in childhood, before people have formed capacities for deliberating reasonably. Indeed, many vices undercut the capacity for rational deliberation. So it is a clear implication of Aristotle’s own account that the badly brought up person may never be in a position to choose not to be vicious. Note, further, that this move represents Aristotle at his most Kantian: blame is justified by reference to control, to a “could have done otherwise” – even when his own account of character formation suggests that such control probably never existed.

What are we to say, then, when a person seems unlikely to change: she appears quite settled in some particular vice, either because she cannot understand the criticism or because she is unable to alter her character or habits? Such cases are very common, and – unless we suppose that they are not morally deplorable – seem to undermine the modern assumption that blame must relate only to conduct under our control. (The same sort of argument can also be made with praise: a virtuous person might be quite unable to do certain things – commit cruelty, for example.) Clearly, if we think a character trait is really beyond alteration, by us or by the person concerned, our blaming won’t involve an attempt to reason with the person we condemn. But our condemnation might have another rationale: for example, to clarify what sort of standards we expect of others, or to signal our fellow-feeling with those who have been adversely affected by someone’s vices.

In sum, Aristotle’s account is not entirely self-consistent. Generally his focus is two-fold: upon the qualities of character revealed by acts, in terms of our overall moral expectations; and upon the responsibilities that must be born, given the effects of an action. For most of the time, his account proceeds without much reference to desert, and it is this neglect that seems to pose the chief difficulty for the Aristotelian story. It is interesting, then, that Aristotle himself sometimes suggests that bad qualities are to be blamed because they were originally subject to choice, even though this quasi-Kantian claim is not (on his own account of character formation) really supportable. Whether or not Aristotle should have made this argument, it does show how powerful is the thought that blame must be justified in terms of what the person herself chose – however long ago that choice supposedly was made.

Despite this, philosophers have returned to Aristotle’s account again and again to illuminate key ingredients of responsible agency.

  • The capacity to respond to others’ censure and encouragement, whether expressed emotionally (eg, as resentment) or in the more articulated forms of praise and blame.
  • A reasonable grasp of how actions are understood by people around us and how they affect others, including the need to share out responsibilities for “patching things up” where something has gone wrong. (That we praise and blame children, however, emphasises the educative and encouraging role that praise and blame play in developing such knowledge.)
  • Together with our own ability to express judgments of others, these capacities allow us to participate in forms of mutual accountability, whereby we inculcate and to some extent enforce shared standards of action.

This list is not comprehensive, but it serves to illustrate the underlying point of an Aristotelian account: our praising and blaming of one another rest on these sort of fairly basic capacities, which do not seem to demand any strong metaphysical elaboration. Indeed, if we approach the matter this way, the puzzle seems to be inverted. Not, “how might free will and determinism be reconciled?;” rather, “why should we feel there is a metaphysical issue at all?”

4. The Kantian Account and Moral Worth

We have seen that the Aristotelian and utilitarian accounts face a common criticism. Illuminating as they may be, they seem to pay too little attention to the question of desert, or culpability. Is the vicious person blameworthy? Does the person of good will, however much she is hindered by bad luck and hard circumstances, not deserve moral recognition? Our intuitions tend to answer such questions affirmatively. And the most usual justification is that the bad person has less moral worth than the person of good will, and therefore deserves blame and perhaps even punishment. A utitilitarian such as JJC Smart sees such justifications as “pharisaical” – that is, as hypocritically self-righteous, and encouraging of excessively moralistic forms of blame and retribution. But there is no denying the power and influence of such justifications.

The reason why so many people – within and without academic philosophy – feel the pull of the free will debate lies in the idea of moral worth we often associate with responsibility attributions such as blame. Galen Strawson expresses the core idea as follows: “if we have [true responsibility], then it makes sense, at least, to suppose that it might be just to punish some with eternal torment in hell, and reward others with eternal bliss in heaven” (1991: viii). Any such “ultimate” merit or demerit clearly has to be a matter of strictly individual desert. If it were merely a matter of chance who went to heaven or hell – or who would do so, if those fates really existed – this would plainly be a matter of mere fortune. Such intense good or bad luck would make the world even more morally arbitrary than it already is. If such merit is to be fairly allocated, therefore, it needs to be seen as something that lies within individuals’ own control. This line of thought, in turn, is based on what John Skorupski calls an “ideal of pure egalitarian desert” (1999: 156). Modern morality regards each person as equal in moral standing, as having an intrinsic dignity and deserving of equal respect. The thought is that we all equally possess control over our will, so that it makes sense to imagine everybody reaping an equally fair return on how well we exercise that control. (Clearly, this line of thought goes against the idea of the will referred to above, as a “bundle” of capacities unequally distributed among human beings.)

The thinker who grapples most systematically with these questions is Kant. He sees us all as equal in our capacity to strive for morality. But he knows that we don’t all do this, and claims that only some are worthy of happiness.

For Kant, our moral worth – the goodness of our will – is gauged by how sincerely and persistently we have sought to do our duty. To do our duty may be much harder for some people, for instance, those who have violent passions or who were brought up with bad habits. But moral worth is not about results; it is about the will. We all have such a will, an ability to choose well, despite the fact that some of us face stronger counter-inclinations or more difficult circumstances. To truly judge a person’s moral worth involves seeing past all the obstacles that their will has faced. Kant argues that this makes moral worth impossible for us to judge with any assurance; only God can see beyond all those things. This lack of knowledge corresponds to Kant’s main concern, which is how we judge ourselves. Our concern should be to do the right thing, and to do it because it is the right thing. To Kant it’s no problem that we’re never sure about others’ wills, and the obstacles or benefits they have faced. The point is that we can never be sure of our own motivations, and must always be attempting to do better in the future.

Moreover, Kant claims we are all equally well able to see what we should do. For Kant “even the most hardened scoundrel” would act morally, were it not for the opposing incentives of his inclinations and desires (Groundwork, 4:454). Kant needs to claim this because otherwise he would not be able to justify condemning people who suppose they are doing the right thing, when in fact their acts are quite wicked – the problem of the self-righteous wrong-doer. Adolf Eichmann, who we mentioned before, seems to have been sincere in thinking his acts were defensible (he even justified his actions with a twisted version of Kant’s moral philosophy!). Yet no one, and certainly not Kant, would doubt that he deserved the gravest condemnation for his crimes. In simplest form, the Kantian thought is that, if only we wanted to, we could all see that certain things are wrong – for example, no one could possibly want a world where everyone committed actions like Eichmann’s. Nonetheless, such examples are problematic for Kant, because it does seem implausible that people are equal in their capacities for moral knowledge. People’s sensitivity to different moral considerations is highly variable, and is clearly shaped by up-bringing and environment.

(By way of contrast, it may be worth noting that from an Aristotelian perspective, the realities of moral ignorance and moral disagreement pose no theoretical problems. In fact, they provide an important justification for praise and blame in terms of mutual accountability – that is, they help with moral learning by communicating when we have met or failed to meet moral standards. But because Kant’s account goes inward, to my scrutiny of my motives and intentions, he says remarkably little about this crucial educative aspect of responsibility attributions.)

Modern Kantian writers differ on how to deal with these two issues, the invisibility of the will and the claim that we share equal access to moral knowledge. One important line of thought is Christine Korsgaard’s. When we blame someone, she claims, we are recognising his capacity to reason about his conduct. Many people have felt that it is “enlightened” not to blame people for bad conduct, and instead to offer explanations that excuse or mitigate – for instance, by taking a person’s anti-social behaviour to have been caused by a bad childhood rather than a bad will. But Kantians insist that this is to deny someone recognition as a rational agent, as someone capable of choosing his action in the light of reasons. This corresponds to the important intuition that there is something patronising about making excuses for people, and not taking their own point of view seriously.

It is not clear whether blame, on this account, need have any link with the idea that someone’s will has proved defective; and it is this which is important if we are to give a place to culpability within the Kantian schema. Modern Kantians usually concede that Kant was too optimistic about our ability always to see the right thing to do. In this case, it is sometimes difficult for us to judge correctly, and so we have to work together at discovering the moral standards applicable in complex situations. Clearly, then, we need to communicate concerning the rights and wrongs of our individual actions. What this seems to omit, however, is the fact that desert is in play when we blame: blame often has an emotional content, and rarely sounds like a disinterested conversation about what would have been the right thing to do. One reason for this, in turn, is that we are identified by our acts, and tend to identify ourselves with them: if our acts are faulty, and none of the standard excusing conditions apply (such as factual ignorance, as discussed by Aristotle), so too must our character be, if blame is to be deserved. (On the other hand, perhaps it is true that we tend to “take things too personally.”)

This points to a real difficulty for Kantians. Moral evaluation is supposed to concern the will, not all the other complicated factors that have formed our character. (Aristotelians, and many others, reject the idea that such a separation can be made, even in theory.) Although Kantians think such a separation is theoretically possible, in practice they concede that we can only guess at the will. This seems to suggest that we should not blame one another, inasmuch as blame implies culpability, an individual failure to will rightly. But this leaves us with two unrealistic alternatives. One is that we explain bad conduct in terms of mitigating factors, which is plainly unattractive, for the very good Kantian reason that it fails to respect people as the choosers of their deeds. Yet the other obvious alternative, that instead of blame we should pursue an enlightened, as well as enlightening, conversation about correct responses to situations, is patently unreal. If people as we know them are going to change, or learn, by and large it will not be unemotional reasoning that alters them, but the many forces that speak to all aspects of character – for instance, resentment, shame, force of opinion. Yet, for all that these characteristic aspects of blame do not operate on the will (as Kantians conceive it), they certainly convey moral disapproval, and can be very effective.

5. The Idea of Moral Worth

The notion of moral worth central to Kant’s account is probably what one writer on ancient Greek ethics – AWH Adkins – had in mind when he said, “We are all Kantians now.” (1960: 2) Kant’s idea attractively reconciles two broad value judgments: (i) the egalitarian idea that all persons are moral equals by virtue of having freedom to choose morally; and (ii) the idea that responsibility relates to desert, so that people can nonetheless be judged very differently – some being condemned for their lives and characters, others praised. Although we have seen serious problems with the idea that people have an equal ability to choose well, most people agree that blame which attaches to parts of our character that we cannot control is deeply unfair. Does this mean, then, that we should accept a Kantian idea of moral worth, where praise and blame are understood as responses to people’s ultimate deserts?

To begin with, contrast Kant with Aristotle. Aristotle makes no claims about a person’s ultimate merit or demerit. People might be vicious or virtuous in various ways, and there might be rare paragons who possess a comprehensive set of virtues (yes, these are philosophers). Naturally we would not want to associate with the vicious, and naturally we will want to condemn their vices in no uncertain terms: It might help them to learn to do better, and it may caution others against them, and it should reinforce our own and other people’s sense of what character traits are desirable. But for Aristotle there is no sense that the vicious are earning a lasting form of discredit that should condemn them in the eyes of an ultimate judge. If the vicious person were to protest to Aristotle that the condemnations he faced were unfair, perhaps because his character had been shaped by his vicious parents, one suspects Aristotle would be rather unmoved. Life isn’t fair, he might say, and we certainly won’t make it fairer by pretending some vices are less real because of their origin in early childhood, let alone because of their fixity within an individual’s character. It may be unpleasant (he might continue) for you to hear this blame and condemnation – indeed, I’m glad that it is, because at least it shows that you are not so vicious that you don’t care about others’ opinions of you – but there are other matters at stake here, above all the standards and expectations which regulate all our lives together.

So Aristotle’s characteristic view is that some people just are better than others, in their abilities to choose rightly as in other regards. Given this “brute fact,” it is all the more important to give attention to mutual moral education and ensuring that people feel the need to take responsibility where things have gone wrong. Yet it does seem true that Aristotle paid too little attention to the question of desert. We can see this by recalling that he is not wholly consistent here. As we saw, he does try to justify our blame of the vicious person in terms of that person’s choice to become vicious, supposing that otherwise our condemnation would be unfair. Nonetheless, the main thrust of his account seems to be that Kant’s egalitarian fairness is not something we can really achieve.

On the other hand, it is difficult to deny the basic, very appealing intuition of Kant’s ethics: that people’s happiness should correspond to their moral worth – to the sincere intentions that are within everyone’s control. Apart from its appeal to fairness, this conception is also plausible because it corresponds well to several features of praise and blame. We do tend to judge the intent behind people’s actions, rather than the often haphazard results of their deeds. We take account of people’s circumstances, and judge less harshly where these place hard or immoral pressures on people. We also, quite often, feel that allowances should be made for the effects on character of abusive or deprived upbringings. In each case, we can interpret these concessions in Kantian terms – as drawing a distinction between the person’s will and the obstacles of circumstance, thus keeping our moral evaluation to what is within a person’s control – and, therefore, what concerns their deserts.

There are, however, reasons to doubt whether this Kantian interpretation is really the best account of these intuitions. The most obvious problem is that we often expect people to take responsibility for things they didn’t intend. This is not only in those cases where we judge that someone should have formed their intentions more carefully. Certainly we judge the negligent driver who causes an accident more harshly than a driver who was careful but nevertheless caused an accident. But even in the latter case, we expect the driver to bear important responsibilities. The problem that many of the things which attract moral culpability are wholly or partly outside of individual control is connected with the problem of moral luck. It is important to realise, however, that this problem is based on the Kantian idea that moral judgments, be it of character or future responsibilities, are deserved because they relate to a person’s “moral worth.”

Aristotle’s account offers a different way of understanding these everyday intuitions about when blame is justified. On his account we are judging the character of the person we are dealing with, based on how they act, how seriously they take their responsibilities, and how they respond to others’ responsibility attributions. To judge such questions we do indeed give a lot of weight to a person’s intentions: obviously, an intended action reveals a person’s character especially clearly. At the same time, we need to appreciate what he knew about the situation he was responding to, what pressures he was under, and special factors affecting his ability to deliberate and choose. Hence Aristotle’s concern with factual ignorance, force of circumstances, and intoxication; and we might note the more modern concern with mental illness. On an Aristotelian line, the point is that these factors alter the extent to which actions reveal the character of the person. That they undermine the person’s “control” is true, but subsidiary. To support this thought, we might consider how certain forms of bad character constitute a lack of control over one’s actions – thus the person who is weak-willed or indecisive, for example. Here weak-willed, indecisive action reveals the person, and her inability to control her actions.

This suggests that we do not need to accept Kant’s will-based view, where blame relates to moral worth. But we might still wonder if the other accounts can explain the culpability aspect of blame, the idea that it relates to desert.

Both utilitarians and Aristotelians can agree that at least one sense of desert clearly applies. A person deserves to be judged accurately, just as the facts deserve to be assessed truly, if they are to be assessed at all. As we need to judge one another, then clearly we deserve to be assessed fairly. But this doesn’t quite take us to the idea that a person has earned blame, for the fact is that a negative judgment of our character is unpleasant and costly. After all, human beings understand such judgments, and feel their effects, in a way that other entities do not.

There is another question of desert: praise raises the possibility of reward, while blame almost automatically suggests we ought to do something to make up for what we have done or how we have been. Moral philosophers continue to dispute whether utilitarians can give a proper account of this sort of responsibility. But we have already seen how Aristotle could respond. On his view responsibility attributions have a practical aspect: they are preparations for action. It is obvious that when something has gone wrong, we need to distribute the resulting responsibilities: who should pay compensation, apologise, or even be punished. If we take the view that there are always duties to be done, including making good when things have gone wrong, then the question is not what the results say about people’s moral worth, but rather how responsibilities for making good can be fairly divvied up.

But whether this is enough to justify the sense of desert that tends to attach to judgments of blame, or whether we tend to be too keen to invest blame with ideas of personal desert – these are questions much beyond the scope of this entry.

6. Conclusion

Praise and blame relate to our sense of people as capable of taking responsibility for their actions. As we saw, ideas about responsibility are usually presented in terms of a contest between two positions, compatibilism and incompatibilism. Incompatibilists accept the dilemma of free will versus determinism: responsibility depends on me controlling my actions, rather than other causal influences that operate around me. Praise, but especially blame, make no sense if determinism is true. Compatibilists, on the other hand, want to insist that the causal well-orderedness of the universe is, precisely, compatible with our responsibility for our actions. But for most philosophers the question is not whether responsibility and causal well-orderedness are compatible, but how. In other words, to adapt Adkins’s adage, “we are all compatibilists now.”

The essential issue for any compatibilist position lies in the conception of responsibility it relies on – an issue much less well-explored by philosophers than the metaphysics of freedom and determinism. This article has contrasted three broad schools of thought on how we put responsibility into practice, by praising and blaming one another. When Adkins claimed that “we are all Kantians now,” he was not referring to Kant’s (incompatibilist) metaphysics but rather to our tendency to feel that responsibility attributions must have depth, that they reflect something about a person’s “real” deserts. Yet this position leads us to claims about control over the self, to the idea of choices that are really ours and not the result of any external influence. In other words, it is more difficult than it may seem to separate Kant’s position from his metaphysical account of freedom and the incompatibilism which he, above all other writers, so strongly articulated.

The roughly Aristotelian alternative discussed here has been most influentially articulated in Bernard Williams’s critique of modern accounts of morality, which he thinks are most clearly expressed in Kant’s philosophy. Williams argues that these ideas neither make sense on their own terms, nor do they make sense of what we actually do when we do engage in attributions of responsibility. As we have seen, Aristotle’s account of praise and blame is based on: (i) how far acts reveal character; (ii) the fair distribution of responsibilities to act; and (iii) the attempt to exchange reasons, share standards, and maintain relationships with those whom we judge – and who judge us in turn.

What both the Aristotelian and utilitarian accounts lack is the deep thirst for equality and fairness which motivate Kant. Aristotle’s account provides no equivalent to the Kantian will – some moral quantity which all human beings possess and which grounds the idea of their equal worth. Nor does it really satisfy the widespread sense that moral judgment should offer fairness – even though the world does not. There is a deeply appealing sense of fairness in Kant’s concern to do justice to each person’s will, by isolating some moral core to the person independent of all formative and environmental factors. Even if wicked people prosper and the innocent suffer, our moral judgment of each constitutes a deep and subtle form of compensation: with regard to what really matters, the one is lacking while the other is undiminished. Even if goodness is made much harder for some, and its results may be correspondingly less, nonetheless we should try to see past those externals, once more, to what really matters.

To this, the Aristotelian and the utilitarian alike may say: to treat praise and blame as reflecting such a pure form of desert is to lose touch with what really matters about them. Praise and blame help us live together in a world where ultimate deserts are impossible to make out, if they exist at all. But just because we cannot make out people’s “moral worth,” it is still true that we need to take responsibility – not least, in our openness to one another’s praise and blame.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Adkins, AWH (1960) Merit and responsibility, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Aristotle Nicomachean ethics (the most readable translation is Roger Crisp’s, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, 2000).
  • Feinberg, Joel (1970) Doing and deserving: essays in the theory of responsibility (Princeton University Press, Princeton NJ).
    • A set of classic essays on responsibility for action, including justifications of praise and blame.
  • Fingarette, Herbert (1967) On responsibility (Basic Books, New York).
    • Another set of classic essays, including the argument that blame is intelligible insofar as it connects up with someone’s pre-existing concern for others.
  • Kant, Immanuel (1784) Groundwork to the metaphysics of morals (the best translation is Mary Gregor’s, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, 1998).
  • Korsgaard, Christine (1996) “Creating the Kingdom of Ends: Reciprocity and Responsibility in Personal Relations” in her Creating the kingdom of ends (Cambridge University Press, Cambridge).
    • A sophisticated Kantian account of praise and blame.
  • Skorupski, John (1999) “The definition of morality” in his Ethical explorations (Oxford University Press, Oxford).
  • Smart, J.J.C. (1961) “Free will, praise and blame” Mind 70, 291-306.
    • A clear and succinct utilitarian account of praise and blame.
  • Smiley, Marion (1992) Moral responsibility and the boundaries of community: power and accountability from a pragmatic point of view (University of Chicago Press, Chicago).
    • Criticises conventional discussions of freedom and determinism, claiming that they fail to investigate the idea of responsibility.
  • Strawson, Galen (1991) Freedom and belief (Clarendon, Oxford).
  • Strawson, Peter (1974) “Freedom and resentment” in his Freedom and resentment and other essays (Methuen, London).
    • This famous essay resituates the free will debate by highlighting the importance of “reactive attitudes” such as resentment to interpersonal relations.
  • Williams, Bernard (1993) Shame and necessity (University of California Press, Berkeley CA) .
    • A sustained argument that the ancient Greeks had a nuanced and sophisticated account of responsibility attributions.
  • Williams, Bernard (1995a) “How free does the will need to be?” in his Making sense of humanity and other philosophical papers, 1982-1993 (Cambridge University Press, Cambridge).
  • Williams, Bernard (1995b) “Voluntary acts and responsible agents,” in his Making sense of humanity.

Author Information

Garrath Williams
University of Lancaster
United Kingdom

Last updated: April 27, 2006 | Originally published: