A notable Enlightenment polymath, Joseph Priestley published almost two hundred works on natural philosophy, theology, metaphysics, political philosophy, politics, education, history and linguistics. Remembered today primarily as a scientist who isolated oxygen, Priestley considered his calling to be that of a theologian, and he spent most of his life working as a minister and teacher. He combined his Unitarian theology with an associationist, materialist and determinist philosophy to create a coherent world-view that was the subject of bitter controversy.
The implications of his metaphysics were challenging. Priestley posited that matter, far from being impenetrable and inert, was subject to internal forces such as attraction and compulsion. This enabled him to assert that the matter of the brain is sensitive to certain vibrations that form the basis of thought. He went on to argue in favor of a material basis for the soul and its complete physical unity with the body. Priestley believed that perception, knowledge, intellect, and memory were acquired through sensory experience and that simple ideas combined into complex ideas through a process of association. This mechanism was entirely material and therefore based on necessary causal laws determined by God.
Priestley tended to prioritize the practical and the experimental above the purely theoretical. His metaphysical beliefs grew in part from his passion for natural philosophy and his careful scientific investigation. His understanding of the world was based on an assumption that truths were demonstrable and revealed through observation and experience. This included studying scripture alongside the natural world in order to gain knowledge of a God who orchestrated and determined all events for the ultimate good of humanity. Priestley was a “rational dissenter” whose careful biblical exploration allowed him to argue for the unity of God. Jesus was wholly human and did not die as an atonement for inherently sinful humanity, but lived to exemplify the perfect moral life that all people could potentially attain.
Priestley argued that the truths of scripture were available to all through the careful application of reason. This influenced his liberal political position, as he penned many works in favor of complete toleration and minimal governmental intervention. Priestley believed that the story of humanity was a march of progress towards ultimate perfection. Liberal government was one means by which truth could triumph in an atmosphere of free and unfettered debate. Priestley was also a fervent millenarian, trusting in biblical prophecy and waiting for the second coming of Christ, the ultimate aim of all human progress. This optimistic liberalism saw Priestley through a barrage of vitriolic criticism and the infamous “Church and King” riots which destroyed his Birmingham home in 1791. Despite the disappointments of the French Revolution and his forced emigration, Priestley stuck tenaciously to his belief in progress and Providence. A hopeful advocate of reason and rational religion, he died with the conviction that his physical resurrection and perfect life with Christ would not be long coming
Priestley’s childhood was marked by upheaval, rejection and spiritual doubt, while his education granted him considerable intellectual liberty and independence of thought. To understand these early years of rejection, isolation and freedom is a significant step towards understanding Priestley’s adult thought as earnest and rational but at times controversial, idiosyncratic and consistently misunderstood.
The following account of Priestley’s life is taken mainly from his autobiography.
Priestley was born on March 13th, 1733 at Birstall Fieldhead, a small village just southwest of Leeds where his family had lived and worked for several generations. His father, Jonas Priestley, was a wool-cloth dresser and his mother, Mary Swift, came from a farming family. Priestley was their first-born child, but three brothers and two sisters soon followed in quick succession. The demands of a large family meant that the young Priestley was sent first to live his grandfather and later, after the death of his mother, to the home of his childless uncle and aunt.
Priestley recalls religious devotion on the part of his parents, his uncle and his aunt. However, while Priestley shared his family’s religiosity and remained a committed believer all his life, he was profoundly affected by early theological doubts. He tells us that he was “much distressed” because he could not “feel a proper repentance for the sin of Adam” and was equally disturbed by his failure to experience the “new birth” regarded as “necessary to salvation.” Having a weak constitution and facing death during adolescence, Priestley was faced with the “horror” of feeling that God had forsaken him (Autobiography 71).
It is fortunate that Priestley had the intellectual and spiritual resources to deal with these fears. Although a strict Calvinist, his aunt often entertained liberal Armenian and Baxterian theologians, so the young Priestley was able to explore the rational theology that would quell the horrors that haunted him. He was eventually able to view his doubts as part of his progression towards truth. He writes that his illness, rigorous religious upbringing and failure to experience a conversion allowed him to acquire a “serious turn of mind,” and his doubts were compensated by a rational understanding of God and proper action. However, as his theology drifted from that of his family and community, Priestley faced rejection and isolation. Priestley had grown up attending the Heckmondwike congregation and tells us that he desired to be admitted as a communicant. However, his membership was refused “because, when they interrogated me on the subject of the sin of Adam, I appeared not to be quite orthodox.” When Priestley adopted Arianism at Daventry it marked a break with the family that would not be reversed (Autobiography 73).
As a boy Priestley attended several schools in the local area and learned Latin, Greek and Hebrew. When his illness prevented him from going to school, he continued his education at home. These early years of self-education were marked with the seriousness, hard work and intellectual isolation that Priestley found so productive in later life. During these years Priestley taught himself French, Italian, and High Dutch “without a master,” while also learning geometry and algebra and reading the work of John Locke and Isaac Watts. In 1752 Priestley entered Daventry Academy, as his dissenting views prevented him from subscribing to the Westminster Confession and thus excluded him from the traditional universities. With young informal tutors and a liberal curriculum, Priestley found intellectual freedom and companionship and discovered the associationist ideas of David Hartley (Autobiography 70-75).
Priestley flourished at Daventry, enjoying the discipline and hard work and building “warm friendships.” In contrast to the rejection and isolation of his childhood, Priestley found himself part of a community of likeminded thinkers. As an adult he was to continue to find intellectual companionship with middle class dissenters and liberals, such as the Lunar society in Birmingham and his fellow tutors at Warrington. In 1762 he also married happily Mary Wilkinson (1743-1796), the daughter of the famous iron master Isaac Wilkinson, whose sons John and William continued to expand the family’s fortunes. He writes fondly although not passionately of Mary, calling his marriage a “very suitable and happy connexion” (Autobiography 87).
Priestley graduated from Daventry in 1755 and moved to Needham Market, Suffolk, to work as a minister at the local chapel. It was not a happy time: lacking the financial assistance originally promised by his aunt, Priestley struggled for money and also struggled to be accepted into the community. No one came to the school he established and most were unable to accept his Arian theology.
Despite these problems, it was this combination of educator and minister that would keep Priestley employed throughout his life. In 1758 he moved to Nantwich in Cheshire and again took on a congregation and established a school. This time he was much more successful and his ideas were communicated and received with ease. In 1761 Priestley took up a tutorship in languages and belles lettres at Warrington Academy and again combined this with a position as a minister.
In 1767 Priestley left Warrington to become a minister for the Mill Hill Chapel in Leeds, a post with increased financial security, allowing Priestley to put the role of minister at the center of his life once again. In the county of his childhood Priestley was accepted by the liberal dissenting congregation where once he had experienced theological rejection. Of course, he also continued to teach and set up a series of classes of religious instruction for members of the chapel.
Suffering financially at Leeds, and keen to broaden his horizons, Priestley took up an offer to sail with James Cook to the South Seas as the ship’s astronomer. However, the arrangement fell through, and after toying with the idea of moving to the colonies, Priestley finally, in 1773, took up residence in Calne, Wiltshire, in order to work in a varied and ill-defined role as Lord Shelburne’s companion. Priestley was given a house for his growing family and a healthy salary; in return he acted as intellectual companion and political ally to Lord Shelburne. He practised many of his now famous experiments for Shelburne’s guests, took over much of the education of his children and considerably expanded the library. Priestley was thus able to continue his role as a teacher, but he preached only occasionally.
His life with Shelburne was never as successful as either party had hoped, and in 1780 Priestley left the service with a good pension to become senior minister of the New Meeting in Birmingham, a large, wealthy and influential congregation. Priestley seems to have been very content in this role of minister, which he continued to see as the most important activity in his life. He also taught children from the congregation and established a number of Sunday schools that taught reading, writing and mathematics as well as religious tenets. However, these happy times did not last long. Priestley left Birmingham after his house and belongings were destroyed in the notorious Church and King riots of 1791. He moved the family to Hackney where they stayed until 1794. He succeeded Richard Price at the Gravel Pit meeting as morning preacher. Increasingly well known as a liberal political philosopher and theologian, Priestley was elected a citizen of France but declined an offer to be a representative to the National Convention.
Priestley faced continuing pressure and the fear of further riots while he lived in London. Significantly, he had to obtain official notice that he was not evading arrest before he could emigrate to the United States in 1794 where he hoped to find freedom and tolerance in the new world. Priestley lived in Pennsylvania until his death in 1804 in a house built in Northumberland and shared with his son Joseph and his family. Mary Priestley and their son Harry both died during this time, and Priestley’s health slowly deteriorated. Priestley preached only occasionally in the following years but published much and continued to write until the day of his death, February 6th. That evening, although very ill, Priestley finished dictating some changes to some pamphlets. When these were complete he said “That is right; I have done now” and died just hours later (Autobiography 139).
As a young teacher and minister in Nantwich, Priestley had acquired the basic apparatus needed for natural philosophy: an air pump and electrical machine used in lessons with the older pupils. As a tutor at Warrington, recently married, settled and part of a stimulating community, Priestley allowed his interest in natural philosophy to flourish. After moving to Leeds Priestley continued to experiment with electricity and researched optics. Turning to pneumatic chemistry he published his Directions for Impregnating Water with Fixed Air in 1772. The same year Priestley’s Observations on Different Kinds of Air was published in the Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society. The paper was significant—Priestley had isolated nitric oxide, anhydrous hydrochloride and acid gases. It also introduced the ideas of eudiometry and photosynthesis. In 1773 Priestley won the Copley medal from the Royal Society.
Priestley used the resources provided by Shelburne at Calne to continue his experiments in pneumatic chemistry and published many of his findings. He isolated samples of what we would now call ammonia gas, nitrous oxide, nitrogen dioxide, sulphur dioxide and most notably oxygen. He also continued to investigate refraction, heat expansion, sound transmission of gases and photosynthesis. Priestley’s scientific interests also found an outlet in Birmingham through his membership of the Lunar Society. Here he met many well-known scientists and businessmen including Erasmus Darwin, Josiah Wedgwood, Matthew Boulton and James Watt. Priestley also entered into a debate with Antoine Lavoisier about how best to interpret his experiments identifying oxygen. He built a new laboratory and published more of his findings while living in the United States. Until his dying day, he stubbornly stuck to his phlogiston theory despite convincing arguments in favor of Lavoisier.
Priestley was a man with a great deal to say but found it a struggle to speak and make himself understood. He stammered from early childhood, yet he followed a career demanding effective communication. His speech impediment caused him significant distress at school and at Daventry and contributed to his rejection at Needham where, he tells us, he found preaching “very painful” (Autobiography 80). Misunderstanding and miscommunication seem to be significant themes in Priestley’s life. The ideas that he saw as reasonable and pleasing to God were received as dangerously revolutionary both in politics and theology. Although he regarded himself as a rational advocate of truth who wrote according to the respectable precepts of the doctrine of candor, his adversaries called him arrogant and incendiary. He advocated political, religious and intellectual freedom and the pursuit of truth through unfettered debate, yet he could be stubborn and uncompromising and believed in absolute truth. This led him into heated controversy and acrimonious debate despite his insistence that he simply wanted a frank exchange of opinions. Priestley was portrayed by his enemies as a dangerous radical with a political and religious philosophy that would undermine the moral and social order. In print and in cartoon Priestley was “gunpowder Joe,” an explosive enemy of church authority, the truth of revealed religion and the political status quo.
We find a set of sophisticated religious and theological beliefs at the very heart of Priestley’s intellectual and moral life, his career and politics, his social networks, behavior and sentiments. To understand Priestley’s faith is to understand the central motivation for the majority of his published works.
Priestley’s most striking contribution to theological debate was his approach to the study of Christian scripture. He was one of a small group of Unitarian thinkers who devised a new translation of the Bible with the distinguishing feature that it should be in a state of continual improvement. Priestley had confidence in the project because he held that although truth itself was absolute and uniform, human attainment of truth was a fluid and gradual process. Knowledge must not be allowed to stagnate, and there was much work still to be done. At the heart of this slow progression toward absolute truth was Priestley’s belief that all humanity could reach the perfect understanding attained by Christ.
Priestley argues that reason is a tool for the use of all humankind and that application of reason alone is enough to convince us of the existence of a unified, benevolent, creator God. The empirical evidences of natural religion and the precepts of rationality are God-given resources provided in order for us to understand the deity as a self-comprehending, omnipresent and omniscient being. However, other essential knowledge is not available through reason and natural religion alone. Revelation is also needed in order to teach us important lessons such as the proper use of prayer and other teachings of Jesus.
Priestley approached scriptural study extremely seriously because of the essential role of revealed religion. He tells us that rational evaluation of the Bible is the only way in which truth can be attained. He denounced all the mystery and irrationality of orthodox theology, denying the Trinity and the Atonement as examples of such muddled and disordered thought. Without mystery and without the need for unfounded faith the individual was free to interpret scripture by the light of reason. Only rational thought, good education and complete liberty of conscience were needed for understanding the words of revealed law in their plainest sense and as a coherent whole. This was open to all individuals who possessed the powers of reason and thus religious authority and the need for a clergy–seen by him as distant and elite–were undermined in one sweep.
Priestley also developed a critical method in his approach to scripture based on careful linguistic and historical study. He emphasized the highly figurative nature of the scriptures and argued that many misunderstandings were merely verbal, the result of taking ancient languages out of their cultural context. Furthermore, Priestley studied history in order to explain the ways in which Christianity had become corrupted over time as misunderstandings crept in, disfiguring the pure and simple beliefs of the early church.
Application of his theological methods allowed Priestley to develop a set of religious beliefs which he regarded as highly rational and as close as possible to the pure Christianity of the early church. Already denying the Trinity, Priestley left Daventry Academy an Arian and tells us that it was after reading Nathaniel Lardner’s Letter on the Logos of1759that he adopted the Unitarian creed he held for most of his adult life. Priestley argued that the notion of the Trinity is an essentially irrational tenet of an unquestioning faith. It requires a willingness to replace individual reason with trust in the teaching of church authorities whose power is perpetuated by ideas shrouded in superstition and mystery. He compared this belief to the simple idea of a unified God, a rational truth present in both natural and revealed religion. His historical work allowed Priestley to argue that the early Christians and Church Fathers were Unitarian and that belief in the Trinity was a corruption that had crept into scripture over the centuries. The Trinity slowly developed over time as gentile and heathen beliefs infiltrated simple “pristine” understanding of the unlearned. The most important message of the Old Testament, argues Priestley, is that God is unified and indivisible. In the New Testament, while the role of Jesus is essential, the Father is entirely exclusive of the Son. He tells us that when scripture appears to say that the Father, Son and the Holy Spirit are equally divine, the language is highly figurative and should not be read literally. This leaves Jesus as wholly human and the powers he possessed as those granted by God to an ordinary man. Christ has the power for resurrection and ascension, but he is not God, according to Priestley. He is not divine and should not be worshipped, despite being an object of our utmost respect.
Priestley undermined the divinity of Jesus and in doing so deeply altered the whole interpretation of his death and resurrection. Priestley insisted that the death of Jesus was only a sacrifice in the figurative sense. His death was not a means by which the wrath of God had been diverted, and his sacrifice was not an atonement for sin. Jesus was not a divine mediator between God and humanity; he was a savior simply because his life was a demonstration of perfect moral duty and the truth of physical resurrection.
Priestley argued that the Calvinist notion of predestination was irrational and had only a flimsy basis in scripture. Arguing from utilitarian premises, Priestley writes that God’s manifest plan is to produce the greatest happiness for his people; a system which condemns many to eternal torment and therefore produces exceptional misery cannot be part of this plan. Priestley was drawn to the idea of universal salvation, the only system to ensure the greatest happiness. He acknowledged the role of punishment as an important part of divine justice and even wrote that it should be long and severe in order to be effective. However, he could not accept that finite humans would be punished infinitely.
The notion of grace that was prevalent among the clergy and orthodox believers was based on the idea of original sin pardoned by the death of Christ, a sacrifice for the sake of fallen humankind. Instead of believing in this idea of innate sinfulness and supernatural reconciliation, Priestley held that everyone had the potential to attain the perfect moral knowledge that Jesus had exemplified and taught. Part of this potential for perfection, writes Priestley, is that God has given us moral laws that we are perfectly capable of following. Although he concedes that everyday fallible humans are unlikely to be morally perfect, he contends that we can choose to lead a life pleasing to God and make constant effort to repent and change our behavior. He places this at the center of Christian life, rather than the emotional evangelical faith, the Calvinist “experience” or the fallacy of the death bed conversion. He tells us that it is not arrogance or pride which allows us to dismiss the idea of original sin and believe that all humankind can do what God tells us. It is simply the power that God has given to all of us. The idea that we are justified by faith or predestination diminishes this power that every person has to do the will of God.
The metaphysical basis for Priestley’s disavowal of the existence of the soul is explored in the section of this article on “Matter and Spirit.” Priestley combined exploration of the nature of matter with scriptural study to argue for the unity of body and spirit, insisting on the biblical basis for a belief in physical resurrection. He writes that there is no scriptural basis for a split between body and soul. Not only is belief in the soul unreasonable based on the evidence around us, writes Priestley, it is also a belief which careful historical exploration shows was an idolatrous heathen tenet that crept into Christianity and slowly corrupted it.
Priestley was a fervent millenarian, trusting in biblical prophecy and waiting for the second coming of Christ. He read widely on the millennium and placed himself within a well established scholarly tradition of millenarian study. Priestley was hopeful that he was living in the “last days” before the foretold return of Christ. Reading Daniel and Revelation, Priestley believed that the return of the Jews to their homeland would precede the glorious second coming and waited eagerly for such an event. He carefully watched worldwide political developments for signs that Christ’s rule on earth was soon to begin, and it is likely that looking for such evidence that the bible contained absolute truths and tangible proofs of the existence of the deity appealed to Priestley’s scientific mindset. The American Revolution seemed a good sign and his optimism intensified after the French Revolution and the Birmingham riots. At the end of his life Priestley became increasingly preoccupied with the millennium, putting a great deal of hope in the imminent arrival of Christ and studying scriptural prophecy in great detail.
For Priestley there was an order, even a beauty, which stemmed from the process of obtaining truth through reason, and in the pure, rational and simple truth that this process revealed. Although his enemies called him “gunpowder Joe,” his grains of gunpowder were no more than a series of necessarilyrelated ideas which, when marshaled by strict reason and controlled by rational thought, would always have the same outcome. However, to some of Priestley’s Anglican opponents his reason-driven truth was subversive and seditious. He was accused of demolishing the foundations of revealed truth and, in consequence, of morality. They saw moral upheaval where Priestley saw rationality and order.
Contemporary reactions to Priestley’s theological and religious works often involved in-depth scriptural analysis. This kind of discussion has been seen as less relevant today. Some secondary comment has focused on the interaction between Priestley’s theological position and his political beliefs, often identifying interesting conceptual links. For example, J.C.D. Clark stated that theological heterodoxy and radicalism were ‘conceptually basic’ (281). A.M.C. Waterman has added to the debate, arguing that although challenging the Trinity is enough to undermine the principle of subordination in church and society, there is no necessary link between dissent and subversive politics (Haakonssen 214). Other comment has examined Priestley’s belief in miracles and biblical prophecy in light of his highly rational stance. For example, Martin Fitzpatrick asks us to consider whether Priestley’s obsession with apocalyptic texts in his later life was the sign of an unbalanced mind (Fitzpatrick 1991 106). However, Clark-Garrett argues that, far from a weakness or drift in old age, Priestley’s millenarian speculations were consistent with his overall outlook. His attention focused by the French Revolution, Priestley was simply using his scientific method to observe the unfolding patterns of Providence, and the fulfilment of prophecy was a key part of this search for facts and evidence to bolster his rational religion (53).
At the heart of Priestley’s political philosophy lie the twin themes of progress and perfectibility. His work is shot-through with an optimism that arises from his unswerving belief in progress and a perfect future state. Priestley’s work rests on an assumption that humankind will be better off in the future than it is at present and that society in the present is already more perfect than life in the past. Unlike brute animals who continue in the same way without change, human society is constantly in a state of development, change and improvement. He tells us of the happiness he experiences because of the realization that whatever the world was like at the beginning the end will be perfect and “paradisiacal.” Importantly, mankind’s unbounded potential for future development requires good government, and, going full circle, good government here means government conducive to progress.
Priestley conjectures a social contract to illustrate his ideas on liberty. He tells us of a group of unconnected individuals who lead separate lives. They are exposed to many wrongs and have few advantages. If the people voluntarily submit to join forces as part of a group they resign some of their natural liberty in return for protection, alliance and other advantages. Some liberty has to be given up just for the society to function. A large group of people would need representatives in order to make decisions on behalf of society and, although this may seem like a sacrifice of liberty, these men would act purely for the good of society and reflect the sentiments of the whole body. The only thing that gives them power is that they are there to act for the public good. Reason and conscience guide them and the people judge them.
Significantly, Priestley divides “natural” liberty into civil and political liberty after the contractual agreement. This is a distinction which Robert E. Schofield says was only commonplace after Mill and that Priestley felt was necessary for the sake of clarity (1997 210). Political liberty, Priestley tells us, is the power of holding or electing public office. It is the “right of magistracy,” the power of the private opinion made public. Civil liberty is the power an individual has over their actions and only refers to their own conduct. It is the right to be exempt from the control of others. Priestley tells us that when natural liberty is resigned upon entering into society, it is civil liberty that is relinquished for the sake of increased political liberty.
Once elaborated, Priestley’s articulation of two types of liberty allows him to place his theory on utilitarian grounds. The good and happiness of the whole of society is made identical with the good and happiness of the majority of its members. Happiness, good and progress become inextricably linked within this theory, as Priestley had insisted that progress towards perfection is the ultimate goal for mankind and would result in unbounded happiness. He tells us that government is required to identify what is most conducive to progress, and therefore to happiness, and to eradicate barriers and limits to progress. For example, division of labor is useful and should be encouraged, as it aids the economy and increases knowledge. Specialization helps everyone reach their potential and means that the arts and sciences are likely to flourish. Meanwhile, progress is hindered by encroachments on civil liberty. Priestley was concerned that progress would stagnate if education and religion were not left free to flourish and reach perfection. He wrote against established religion and against state education, wary of uniformity and unnecessary authority. He insisted that diversity of opinion was essential for free debate and ultimate progress and therefore advocated complete religious liberty and freedom of speech.
Although Priestley celebrated freedom and was concerned to limit government intervention for the sake of individual liberty, he did not have an antagonistic opinion of the law. Good government plays an important role within Priestley’s philosophy, protecting liberty and rights but also serving as an active agent of change. Priestley’s political philosophy has a psychological foundation based on the doctrine of association. Human perfection was to be achieved along associationist lines. Good government and society was crucial to this process. Government should explore what circumstances are most conducive to progress and happiness and apply these principles, even if this means intervening or limiting freedom to some extent.
Priestley’s theology and his status as a dissenter informed much of his political work. At a political level Priestley was keen to speak on behalf of rational dissent and outline the political principles most often associated with Protestant dissent in general. Eager to inform the Anglican clergy of the political opinions to be found amongst their dissenting counterparts, Priestley writes that there is no reason to assume that dissenters are anarchists or republicans. The vast majority are peaceful, law-abiding and property-owning. He tells us that dissenters respect human authority in most matters, respect the government and support the Hanoverian succession. However, they do not recognize human authority in religion, seeing no spiritual or scriptural reason for church authority or established religion. The church has no business in civil government, and one of the many reforms required was a full separation of church and state, as well as a purging of other popish ways still left within the Church of England.
At a philosophical level, Priestley’s demands for religious liberty were often for utilitarian reasons, recognizing the need for liberty in order to foster truth and aid progress. He was skilled in illustrating these abstract arguments with numerous historical examples to consolidate his case. Priestley did believe firmly in the absolute nature of divine truth, but he argued for full toleration for dissenters, Catholics and even atheists. This was because at the root of his call for toleration was a powerful conviction that to uncover divine truth should be the ultimate aim of all human endeavors, and this needed an atmosphere of free and unrestrained debate. Rational dissent held that truth arose from the application of human reason and conversely that unnecessary intervention could be extremely harmful. If laws were in place that stifled free discussion and forced belief in superstition or falsehood, the cause of truth was left in the dark
Priestley’s Essay on the First Principles of Government went swiftly through two editions and continued to be published throughout the nineteenth century. Clearly influential at the time, the work also had significant long-term impact. Jeremy Bentham acknowledged the Essay as the inspiration for his utilitarian “greatest happiness” principle. Although Bentham’s famous words do not appear anywhere in the work of Priestley, it is fair to say that this is a significant legacy. However, in his own time, Priestley’s work was met with criticism and attack. Priestley backed the campaign for the repeal of the test and corporation acts, and this provoked a huge conservative backlash fuelled in part by heightened reactionary fears following the French revolution. In this heated atmosphere, accusations of sedition and treason were common currency, and Priestley came under serious criticism for his political and theological views. Priestley’s critics entangled religion and politics and made little attempt to identify Priestley’s own first principles. Priestley was accused of attempting to undermine the authority of the church and the government. His political philosophy seemed dangerously egalitarian and his insistence on continual progress was a dangerous threat to the old order. Priestley’s insistence on the importance of unfettered individual reason had dangerous consequences. His enemies explicitly stated that Priestley’s concern for the truth had inverted the order of things. Priestley had destroyed the necessity for a separate Clergy and attacked the sacredness of their profession. By questioning the need for obedience and asserting the authority of the individual, it seemed to nervous minds that he had inverted the whole social hierarchy.
One way this division has manifested itself is in the interesting relationship between natural law and utility as it appears in Priestley’s political philosophy. For example, both Margaret Canovan and Robert Schofield comment on the relationship as it appears in Priestley’s Essay on the First Principles of Government (Canovan 1984, Schofield 1997 209). Schofield suggests that Priestley’s brand of utilitarianism is significantly less relativist than Bentham’s. While Bentham used the happiness principle as the only guiding force of government, Priestley never doubted that there was a perfect way of governing and that it was towards this that mankind should progress. Canovan also questions the idea that Priestley was a proto-Benthamite. She says that the underlying assumptions of the two men are significantly different. Priestley firmly believed in the existence of a benign and all powerful God who presided over a well-ordered and structured universe. So it was in this realm of natural law that Priestley’s utilitarianism was supposed to operate. Priestley believed in the existence of an objective moral order so while happiness for Bentham could be whatever society or any individual decided it should be, happiness for Priestley was universal, fixed and could be evaluated in moral terms. While Bentham constructed a moral order from utilitarian grounds, Priestley simply used the principle in order to evaluate and discern moral laws. This places Priestley firmly in the natural law tradition. It allows him to use the language of rights as part of his political philosophy without compromising his utilitarianism.
The real extent of Priestley’s liberalism is debated in a variety of different ways in the secondary literature. For example, Martin Fitzpatrick has highlighted that, while Priestley supported toleration whole-heartedly, this was because of his conviction that absolute truth would eventually prevail, rather than the pluralistic outlook of Richard Price (1982 18-23). Margaret Canovan has pointed out that, although Priestley is rightly remembered as a liberal, he often celebrated a paternalistic view of class relations (1983). Celebrating the bourgeois station, he stressed the importance of middle class charity to the poor, which would encourage their ambition and create useful social bonds. He also wrote that inequalities were part of God’s plan for the present, despite his general support for social mobility. Isaac Kramnick has also pointed out this ‘ominous’ side to Priestley’s liberalism, examining the new layers of authority Priestley was prepared to impose on society in the name of progress and reform. Kramnick argues that the scientifically minded Priestley viewed the state as a kind of laboratory where intervention was required to perfect humankind, and so his thought is shot-through with a regard for authority and discipline (11, 20-22).
The principle of association states that ideas are generated from external sensations. Complex ideas are made up of simple ideas. These complex ideas are formed through repeated juxtaposition or “association” over time. This means that ideas become united in the mind so that one idea will be invariably followed by the other.
Hartley tells us that this principle has not escaped the notice of writers both ancient and modern but that it was John Locke who affixed the word “association” to the theory. Locke had argued that ideas are not innate but derived from experience. In mechanistic terms he explained the ways in which simple ideas become associated in experience and therefore build up complex ideas. Locke had posited a mind blank before experience of sense impressions had made their mark. Hartley picked up this idea and added to it a physiological basis for the associationist theory, an idea that it was vibrations acting on the brain that laid down ideas and that when two vibrations occurred simultaneously over time they become associated in the mind. Hartley used Locke’s epistemology but removed Locke’s emphasis on reflection as a means to knowledge. Locke had written that all knowledge is based on sensation and then reflection. Hartley simply said that all types of ideas were derived from sensation. Priestley followed Hartley and dropped Locke’s need for reflection as a distinct source of knowledge. Priestley also read the Rev. John Gay who had used Locke’s associationist principle to argue against the innatist theory of morals of Francis Hutcheson. Gay had argued that morality and the passions were acquired through experience; as we attempt to avoid pain and seek pleasure our morals and passions are formed.
Enjoying debate and finding creativity in opposition, Priestley expounded his most coherent theory of association as an attack on the notion that innate common sense can stand above reason when it comes to religious belief. Published in 1774 Priestley’s Examination of Dr. Reid‘s Inquiry…Dr. Beattie‘s Essay…and Dr. Oswald‘s Appeal is a harsh and rigorous refutation of common sense in favor of association. Like Hartley, Priestley was keen to make association the sole basis of human understanding. Hobbes had written of association as one means that certain ideas become linked by resemblance or causality. In contrast to Hobbes, Locke was more interested in unnaturally associated ideas, or when two things that have nothing in common end up united. However, for Priestley association was the foundation and excluded all other epistemological sources. This certainly ruled out what he took to be Reid’s theory, that sensations are made into ideas by innate principles implanted by God, and it excluded the argument that sensations act on the passive matter of the brain and that innate instincts act to turn them into knowledge. Priestley writes that living is about experience. That something seems instinctive does not mean that it has not derived ultimately from external experience.
Associationism allowed Priestley to identify the general laws of human nature he was looking for and is therefore the basis for much of his metaphysical, educational and political writing, as well as informing his theology. For example, Priestley’s work on the nature of matter enabled him to add a physiological basis to the doctrine of association. Once association was understood physiologically Priestley was able to argue against Cartesian dualism, against the existence of an immaterial soul, and in favor of the material unity of body and mind. In his political and educational philosophy the doctrine of association furnished Priestley with a means by which circumstances could be understood to shape the intellectual and moral life of individuals. This allows for progress in society and in the acquisition of knowledge because it allows for controlled change through experience. It gives teachers and legislators the power to shape others through altering circumstances or environment. Association consolidated Priestley’s determinist doctrine of philosophical necessity as it allowed all actions to be traced back to motives and ideas formed entirely from experience and therefore potentially determined by Providence. Finally, association also appears in Priestley’s theology. In the Institutes of Natural and Revealed Religion (1772) Priestley explains that revealed religion has followed the same pattern historically as an individual does when learning through association. The development from the Old Testament to the New is like the process of acquiring knowledge of pain and difficulty but also love of god and the pleasures of life as an individual.
Priestley’s devotion to the doctrine of association was one of the less controversial aspects of his thought. The system was already part of a respected tradition and Priestley’s ideas were not especially innovative or shocking. However, the polemic feel of his attacks on Reid, Beattie and Oswald did provoke some sharp replies and Priestley actually issued an apology for the tone he had struck. Robert E. Schofield has argued that Priestley played a crucial role in maintaining Hartley’s ideas, especially among the utilitarians, and therefore had an important influence on the nineteenth century. While late nineteenth-century associationist psychology is often regarded as the precursor to the behaviorism of the twentieth century, studying Priestley allows us to locate the ideas considerably further back (2004 52).
Priestley wanted to elucidate a physiological theory to refute his interpretation of the Scottish “common sense” system of separate instinctive perceptions. Priestley writes that all sensations are the same. They arise from experience as vibrations in the brain. Priestley argued that this system offered a simplicity that the theory of separate and original instincts could not. An outside stimulus causes the brain to vibrate. For example, “seeing” is actually the result of vibrations of the optic nerve caused by light. Vibrations consisted of tiny movements of small particle, of the nerves and then of the brain. These movements were caused by the impressions made by external objects on any of the five senses.
Priestley tells us that all matter vibrates and that all matter can transmit these vibrations to our brains. Following Hartley, Priestley tells us that once the brain has been made to vibrate a trace of that vibration is left behind. Hartley calls this a “vibratiuncle.” Although Priestley cuts down on such technical terms the theory is the same. A “vibratiuncle” is laid down as a tendency for the brain to vibrate the same way again. If the initial vibration was strong or intense, then so too will be the vibratiuncle. If the vibration is weak or small, then the vibratiuncle too is weaker. If the vibration occurs many times, this has the same affect, strengthening the trace and increasing the tendency to vibrate. When two vibrations occur together they act on each other or modify each other so that, as they occur repeatedly together, they become associated in the brain. This association means that when one occurs the other will also occur. Vibrations can build up sets of vibratriuncles so that if only one vibrates, the others in the system will vibrate too. One occurrence triggers all of them.
This is the physiological basis of the associationist doctrine. It explains how sensations become ideas and how simple ideas can build up into complex ones through this process. While Hartley did acknowledge the parallel process between ideas and physiological vibrations, he was keen to leave room in his theory for the existence of an immaterial soul. Priestley lacked his caution and was driven to question the means by which a non-physical substance could act upon a physical one. While Hartley had left this a mystery and posited an “elementary substance” that was neither matter nor spirit but linked them both, Priestley’s answer was to abandon any kind of dualism at all. He writes that our understanding is troubled simply because of the way in which matter appears to us. Superficially it seems solid and inert. However, Priestley tells us, experiments reveal that this is not the case. Matter is far from solid or impenetrable, it is made up of atoms and particles and these are subject to forces of attraction and repulsion depending on their arrangement. It is these forces that make matter seem solid. Matter had been assumed to be incapable of thought or perception because it was solid and not affected by outside forces. It was seen as inert, sluggish even, and therefore incompatible with the capacity for sensation. Now that this assumption had been undermined, it remained entirely possible that matter could form the basis for our mind and spirit as well as physical being.
When the matter of the brain was subject to vibrations and vibratriuncles, it was engaged in thought. Priestley does not tell us how vibrations become ideas. He admitted that, although he did not know how material substances think over and above this basic supposition, he argued that the possibility remained and that this scenario seemed more likely than the existence of separate and immaterial soul. The distinction between matter and spirit was therefore unnecessary and untrue. Priestley writes that his materialism leaves fewer questions unanswered than the notion of a soul. It prevents the need for speculation about how and why the soul leaves the body and how it may return, what happens to the soul before resurrection and how a soul comes to choose a certain body to start with. Priestley claimed he had resolved the problems of Cartesian dualism and the tricky distinction that had corrupted Christianity. He had redefined the nature of matter and made the composition of the body single and uniform.
Priestley’s regard for Newtonian theory is communicated strongly in his works on matter and spirit. Robert E. Schofield has explained the ways in which Priestley’s career can be seen as dedicated to the Newtonian idea of matter (1964 291-294). At the end of principia mathematica,IsaacNewton gives us a physical explanation for the association of ideas. Unlike John Locke, who was wary of looking for a physical basis of his idea of association, Newton used a theory of vibrations to explain how perception and memory are formed. Hartley then relied on Newton’s idea of an elastic ether and the possibility for vibrating motions to occur within it. In the same way, it was Newtonian ideas about matter, that “solids” retain an impression when vibrations or forces act upon them, that allowed Priestley to explain the lasting affect of vibrations on the matter of the brain. Furthermore, it was Newton who had suggested that objects in the world cause light sensations which vibrate the optic nerve and allow us to “see,” and it was a Newtonian desire to uncover simple, universal laws of explanation that linked Priestley’s ideas on association and matter and spirit so neatly.
It is impossible to separate Priestley’s metaphysical opinions about matter and spirit from his theology. His speculations on the nature of matter provided Priestley with scientific and physiological evidence to deny the existence of the soul. Some thinkers insisted that matter was inert and animated only by a God-given soul. Priestley’s matter was different. It was not inert. Matter was complex and active. It was possible for the brain to be wholly material and also to vibrate and therefore to “think” rather than a passive vehicle moved by an immaterial soul. When Priestley examined the atheism of Baron d’Holbach he stated that it was one of the most convincing arguments he had come across. This was because d’Holbach shared some of his ideas on the nature of matter. However, d’Holbach held that forces of attraction and repulsion, gravity and electricity were simply the “energy of nature.” Priestley said that this was another name for God, an energy which should be acknowledged as having intelligence and design. His continued faith meant that Priestley never relinquished scriptural study and examined the Bible in relation to his understanding of matter.
Priestley’s reading of scripture convinced him that the idea of soul was actually a “corruption” of Christianity and that resurrection, when it occurred, was of a physical and not a spiritual nature. He attacked the dualism of Descartes but argued that the idea of an immaterial mind and soul was actually of ancient pagan origin, having crept into Christian belief and undermined “monist” Hebrew doctrines. His opinion on the material nature of the soul allowed him to explain the resurrection of matter and spirit as a single, material event. Priestley argues from scripture alongside his exploration of matter. He writes that the idea of the soul only appears in some badly interpreted and unconnected passages of the bible and that, if such duality had actually been part of God’s design, it would have been revealed with clarity. Priestley insisted that removing this corruption from our understanding of scripture would strengthen the foundations of revealed religion and lead to stronger, rational, belief. While the notion of the soul had debased the whole idea of resurrection, Priestley believed his materialist ideas explained the process by which the body would die and decompose, only to be recomposed and physically restored to immortality through the power of the divine.
Robert E. Schofield has shown evidence that Michael Faraday had read Priestley and claims that British scientists showed so much interest in Boscovichian atomism because Priestley had advocated his ideas (2004 71-72). Boscovich’s own reaction was more typical. He was absolutely furious that Priestley had reduced his ideas to materialism. Other commentators were similarly outraged. Priestley’s edition of Hartley came under severe criticism and his further publications on the subject heightened the controversy. Materialism was feared by many; it could easily slip into atheism. The theological speculations that accompanied Priestley’s metaphysics were regarded with suspicion and met with outright anger.
Joseph Berington, a Roman Catholic, and the Anglican Bishop Samuel Horsley both penned fierce refutations of Priestley’s works on the nature of matter and spirit. His ideas provoked vitriol from a wide variety of believers. A respectful debate with Richard Price reveals the extent to which Priestley’s ideas were a challenge even to other rational dissenters. Price refused to agree that matter was not inert. For him, matter was solid and could not be imbued with sensation or perception. Matter was subject to forces such as gravity but only because God had added these properties onto matter; they were not innate. Price argued strongly in favor of the existence of the soul. He said that although he did not see the body as something corrupt and something that trapped the soul, he did think that there was an immaterial part of the body and that this needed a link to the physical body in order to exercise certain powers. He saw two separate substances connected and dependent but distinct. Priestley’s engagement with such a diverse selection of critics served to ensure that his views on matter and spirit would become infamous and added to his reputation as an idiosyncratic, controversial and even dangerous figure.
Priestley writes that he published his principle work on philosophical necessity out of concern for the ambiguous definitions of liberty and necessity. He tightened the meaning of these words and argued that, under the system of philosophical necessity, everyone is free; everyone is entirely at liberty to do anything they will as long as there are no external constraints. So all people can think whatever they chose and act however they chose. However, everyone is also operating under divine necessity. Everyone is bound by causal laws fixed by God and directed by him for the ultimate good of all humanity. This means that there is no way that two different events, decisions or acts can occur when the circumstances are exactly identical. Provided the circumstances are identical, there is only one possible outcome. This removes any possibility for random occurrences and eliminates all chance. No room is left for the possibility of variation. Everything becomes part of an entirely determined chain of causes and effects.
Priestley asserts that when most people examine their views on free will, they will see that those ideas actually fit better into his system of philosophical necessity than they immediately realize. Once liberty and necessity are properly understood, he writes, they are actually compatible with each other. It is chance or randomness that is incompatible with freedom or voluntary action. Priestley puts it in terms of motives for acting. He says that throughout nature there are fixed, unalterable laws. David Hume had said that every cause and effect is just a conjunction; the connection could be arbitrary. The cause and effect may appear to be linked, but there is no way of knowing for sure that they are. Priestley, on the other hand, was keen to refute Hume. He said there is an invariable connection between cause and effect. Furthermore, in the case of human choice and action, the cause is often a motive. If one has a state of mind and then acts, the same action will occur again if the state of mind is unaltered. The choice made is voluntary, but the motives that led to that choice form part of an unbroken necessary chain of causes and events.
Priestley also discusses the role of God within this system in more detail. He tells us that God knows everything, but he would not be able to foresee contingent events–this alone eradicates the possibility of contingency and consolidates Priestley’s determinist position. Aware of the controversial conclusions of this position, Priestley admits that this means that God is the author of sin. However, as God determines everything for the ultimate good, vice and bad behavior are in fact part of a greater divine plan to bring humankind to perfection. Priestley was careful to distinguish this system of necessity from the predestination of Calvinism. Calvinists held that God uses supernatural methods in order to bring about change and chooses an elect few for salvation. Priestley’s God worked naturally through a string of necessary causes and effects only, and although sinners would be punished, Providence did not allow for eternal damnation.
Priestley’s ideas on determinism and providence were not new. He cites Hobbes and Hartley as major influences, as well as drawing from Locke and Hume. What is more interesting here is the extent to which these ideas were part of a personal journey for Priestley. He tells us that it is his happiness to find a resolution to his anxieties that motivated him to publish on the subject. The security and satisfaction that comes from contemplating every event as part of the divine plan of Providence gave Priestley his characteristic optimism and self-assurance. It was this that he was keen to make known to the public.
Philosophical necessity works well with Priestley’s idea of matter. Priestley had insisted that the human body and spirit were both physical. As matter is subject to the universal or unchanging laws of nature, it follows that no decision in the mind or act in the body can be random or spontaneous.
Philosophical necessity and the association of ideas are also closely related. Priestley acknowledged the importance of human will and the sense that this was free. Association explained how the will was created. All motives were part of a causal chain of associated ideas. Basil Willey has argued that it is the associationist foundation of philosophical necessity that means it promotes moral behavior (171-174). Priestley posited a universe created by God in which vice is less attractive than virtue in terms of the rewards it brings. Although physical pleasure and sin bring short term benefits, it is more compelling in the long term to follow a virtuous path. According to his system, it is possible for people to change their motives and their circumstances and therefore to alter their behavior for the positive. This suffuses the necessarian doctrine with human agency. It means that humankind cannot simply sit back and let Providence take its course. We may be instruments of God, but in understanding that our own motives and choices are part of a chain of cause and effect, we can act to alter them and become more virtuous. Although all events are determined and God is the ultimate author of sin, on a day-to-day level we have freedom to shun vice and chose virtue. Unlike God, humankind does not have the power to use sin and wrongdoing for the sake of good, and therefore we must chose to live virtuous lives.
Finally, understanding philosophical necessity is important in order to get to grips with Priestley’s notions of reward and punishment. Priestley spends a lot of time writing about the ways in which necessity is the only system that allows punishment to make rational sense. A person acts because of a set of motives, these are caused by circumstances. Therefore circumstances and motives can be altered. There is no reason to punish behavior is if it not caused and not based on a rational intention
Priestley entered into a number of debates concerning his determinism including a long and respectful debate with Richard Price. Price argued that free-will was essential in order to ensure that we take responsibility for our choices and actions before God. He added that a determined system was less of an achievement of creation than the reality of human freedom God had granted. Priestley was aware of the accusation that the system of philosophical necessity removed any imperative towards moral behavior. Although he tried to address this by arguing that on an everyday level all people can chose to act or not to act. He used his associationist theory to explain that people could actively change their circumstances in order to alter their motives over time. Most contemporary and modern commentators have pointed out that this has the feeling of a clever paradox. Robert E. Schofield calls it “sophistry” and Basil Willey has pointed out that the liberty granted to humankind under Priestley’s system of philosophical necessity is free will under a different name (Willey 171-174, Schofield 2004 79).
In his educational works, Priestley tells us that the education provided at dissenting academies and universities is often ill-suited to the young men in attendance. The curriculum provided did not prepare them for a civil and active life. He emphasized that the traditional subjects, such as philosophy, mathematics and logic, were important but could not alone fit a young mind for work in anything but the clergy and learned professions. Instead he wanted to educate a generation that was destined for a life of commerce and for magistrates, lawyers, powerful merchants, statesmen and even the landed. The broad liberal education that Priestley recommended was to turn out useful liberal minds from among the middle classes and included modern history, law, economics and the arts. He also turned his attention to women, refuting the notion that they were intellectually inferior and arguing that many women would need to subsist alone and should be given the tools to do so. Women were moral creatures just like men, and as education was the basis of morality their exclusion was counter to Priestley’s hopes of progress and perfection. Priestley’s attitude to the education of the poor was less enthusiastic. His liberalism meant that he stood against state education but did not extend his interest in a more positive direction.
Priestley’s educational philosophy was based on his metaphysics. It is a fine example of the ways in which he brought associationism, materialism and philosophical necessity together in practical ways. Priestley thought that all knowledge, intellect, perception and memory were acquired through sensory experience and that simple ideas combined into complex ideas through association. This mechanism was entirely material and therefore based on necessary causal laws which could be identified and manipulated. It was important because any two ideas could be associated together to control the environment of children so that they were exposed to the most useful and virtuous associations. Denying any chance that knowledge or morality is innate put extra emphasis on the importance of environment, especially when minds were young and malleable and the potential for progress and perfection was at its peak. Priestley’s optimism now had a practical outlet. It was up to the educator, whose actions had a sole and necessary effect on children, to prepare the next generation for virtue and improvement that could be unlimited.
Priestley was careful to prepare a curriculum which would optimize healthy physical, moral and intellectual development, and this meant using the theory of association to design learning aids and make practical recommendations. Association meant that the most useful learning involved natural discussions and digressions and that experience rather than theory was always to be more memorable. Priestley’s ideal lessons involved question and answer sessions and group discussions. Both sides of a controversy were to be understood and all queries and objections brought to light. Priestley was keen on the use of mechanical aids in teaching, such as his successful charts of history and biography. He wanted to convey knowledge in an ordered and regular manner so that it was easily learned and remembered.
Priestley made significant contribution to the development of a modern curriculum. His philosophical work was enriched by his experience as a teacher. Priestley put together a philosophy of history and a linguistic theory while preparing lectures for publication. For Priestley, history was a useful practical tool. It appealed to him because it could be used to demonstrate God’s divine purpose and could be observed in order to understand political and economic developments more fully. Priestley writes that history is like the experiments made by the air pump or electrical machine. It demonstrates the workings of nature and God and therefore provides the foundations for theoretical speculation. Like personal experience, history was a swifter teacher than abstract ideas. It allowed one to assemble the evidences of the divine plan and unveiled the plans of Providence. History could increase our understanding of God and the ways in which he used short-term suffering for the greater good; that which appeared evil was actually essential for progress and would terminate in the perfection of humanity.
Priestley hoped that to view history in this way would increase virtue and piety in the minds of his pupils and infuse all with a sense of optimism. He also wanted to encourage his students to see history as a laboratory, where all manner of political systems had been tried and tested. It provided the data needed for sound political philosophy. A liberal government, unfettered thought and belief and free trade could be seen historically to stimulate progress. Furthermore, accurate study of all aspects of the past, from domestic lives to warfare, would increase knowledge of humanity and therefore help future advancements. This meant that Priestley advocated the study of modern history including arts, language, food, clothing, manners and sentiments. He extended the number of sources traditionally seen as relevant to historical study to include material evidence such as coins, medals, inscriptions, fortifications and town plans.
Alongside history Priestley had a long standing fascination with linguistics, and over the course of life as a teacher developed a coherent philosophy of language. He stressed the importance to teaching language and insisted his student be well educated in the vernacular. He tells us that English is as vital as Latin, adding that it is a serious defect in any gentleman not to be able to read and write well in his own language. Priestley made a number of contributions to the study of English grammar, and his influence in the field extended well into the nineteenth century. As part of his grammatical work, Priestley highlighted the importance of understanding that language is in a continual process of development and that the only really useful standard by which to establish rules of language was to look at custom and usage.
These observations were part of a broader theory of language development. Priestley tells us that language is human, not a direct gift from God. It grows up slowly as words gain meaning through association, first simple words and then more complicated constructs. It develops slowly and irregularly and its symbols are arbitrary and often subject to changes of use and meaning. This means that, in order to translate accurately and fully understand the languages of the past, careful cultural study is needed in order to furnish us with enough information to understand meaning and usage. Individual language acquisition to some extent mirrors this process. Young children grasp the meaning of words through constant association between object and word. Furthermore, Priestley tells us that the association of ideas is important for understanding the impact of language, especially figurative language, on the mind. Words can trigger whole strings of associations based on both cultural and individual experience.
Priestley’s publications on education were generally well received at the time and ran into many editions. Modern commentators, however, have highlighted concern that Priestley used his status as a historian and educator to propagate his Unitarian theology. Arthur Sheps says that history was often written for “pugnacious and apologetic” reasons and that being a historian was a way of gaining moral authority. Priestley gained a historical reputation and was then able to use it to provide evidence for his scriptural exegesis (Belleguic 149). John McLachlan goes even further. He sees Priestley as someone whose religious belief overruled his more rational pursuits. He let a hopeful optimism in the workings of Providence get in the way of careful historical thinking (260).
Priestley’s first religious publications grew out of his role as a teacher of youth while employed as a minister at Leeds. In 1767 he published A Catechism for Children and Young Persons and followed this in 1772 with A Scripture Catechism, consisting of a Series of Questions, with References to the Scriptures instead of Answers. Although these early works were intended to lay down the basics rather than spark doctrinal controversy, hints of Priestley’s unorthodox views creep through the conventional veneer. In 1772 Priestley published his Institutes of Natural and Revealed Religion, a long and detailed exposition of the central beliefs of rational dissent, drawn from a variety of rational and liberal theologians. Many of Priestley’s works contain a similar emphasis on summarizing and streamlining the views of other thinkers, such as A Free Address to Protestant Dissenters on the Subject of the Lord‘s Supper (1768) and Considerations on Differences of Opinion among Christians (1769).These formed part of a plethora of publications answering his already fierce critics, and Priestley continued to court controversy when he published An Appeal to the Serious and Candid professors of Christianity in 1770. Many answers and many replies followed, and the same opinions were repeated in Familiar Illustration (1772).
In 1768 Priestley established the Theological Repository,a theological journal with lofty aims to further truth through unfettered and candid debate. This allowed Priestley to rewrite some of his now familiar arguments under a variety of pseudonyms, while his long-running series of Letters to a Philosophical Unbeliever gave him space to challenge the views of those whose faith had been lost through the reading of modern philosophers. With strong leaning towards historical modes of arguments and an interest in the history of early Christianity, Priestley published his 1777 A Harmony of the Evangelists, in Greek,followed by a version in English in 1780. Other important historical studies include Priestley’s History of the Corruptions of Christianity,first published in 1782, and An History of Early Opinions concerning Jesus Christ in 1786. In the 1790s and following his emigration, Priestley continued to defend his heterodox opinions on the Trinity with his Defences of Unitarianism series and the 1795 Unitarianism Explained and Defended, and he showed an increasing interest in biblical prophecy and the impending millennium, for example in his 1794 The Present State of Europe Compared with Antient Prophecies.
In 1768 Priestley published his Essay on the First Principles of Government. Widely read and well regarded, the Essay was Priestley’s first political publication. The following year Priestley published a pamphlet, The Present State of Liberty in Great Britain and her colonies, which reiterated many of the concerns grappled with in the Essay. 1769 also saw the publication of three works dealing with Protestant dissent, each addressed to liberal dissenters themselves or intended to inform others about their principles. In 1787 Priestley again entered political terrain with An Account of a Society for encouraging the Industrious Poor,in which his liberal individualism was more than obvious. Many of Priestley’s political publications are evidence of the close link between his politics and theology. In 1769 he published Considerations on Church Authority, A View of the Principles and Conduct of Protestant Dissenters and A Free Address to Protestant Dissenters as such,all of which highlight the influence of Priestley’s theology on his political philosophy. Priestley also wrote on religious liberty in An Address to Protestant Dissenters… on the Approaching Election of Members of Parliament and overviewed current arguments in favor of toleration for his patron Lord Shelburne in 1773. In 1780 Priestley controversially came out in favor of toleration for Roman Catholics, and again stirred up trouble a decade later by entering the vitriolic debate on the repeal of the Test and Corporation Acts, with letters to Pitt and Burke and a defense of his opinions addressed to the people of Birmingham.
We first encounter Priestley’s associationist opinions in his Institutes of Natural and Revealed Religion, which he began writing while still at Daventry and published in three volumes between 1772 and 1774. The Institutes and a number of later publications on the same topicinclude an attack on the principles of the common sense philosophy of Oswald, Reid and Beattie. The theme is continued in Priestley’s edition of Hartley’s Observations on Man in 1775, where Priestley cut out much of Hartley’s work on physiology and theology in order to concentrate solely on expounding the doctrine of associationism.
David Hartley had vigorously denied accusations of materialism, but Priestley’s own monist views emerged first in his edition of Hartley’s Observations on Man in 1775. Although he removed some of Hartley’s physiological exploration and theological concerns, Priestley appended a number of essays to his edition of the work that took Hartley’s doctrine of vibrations and its materialist implications much further than the author would have liked. In 1777 Priestley set out to elucidate and defend his ideas on the unity of body and soul in his Disquisitions relating to Matter and Spirit,causing further offense and controversy. The following year, Priestley engaged in an exchange with Richard Price in which he defended his view of matter as capable of thought and perception and his disbelief in the existence of a nonphysical soul.
Priestley’s interest in the determinist philosophy he called “philosophical necessity” emerges first in his Institutes of Natural and Revealed Religion,where Priestley’s utilitarianism entails the direct intervention of a divine Providence in order to ensure that all suffering is ultimate good and the unhappiness of a few will always benefit the majority. The doctrine also plays a crucial part in his Examination of the Scottish common sense philosophers and his Disquisitions…. In 1777 Priestley outlined and defined these ideas in a work dedicated to the system, the Doctrine of Philosophical Necessity Illustrated.
Priestley’s ideas on education emerge first in his Essay on the First Principles of Government, which actually took form out of his remarks on a well known code of education. In 1765, while working as a tutor at Warrington, he published a major work, the Essay on a Course of Liberal Education. In 1778 the Miscellaneous Observations Relating to Education outlined this syllabus in detail. In his 1788 Lectures on History and General Policy,Priestley’s thoughts on education are elucidated with clarity and, along with his published syllabuses, lectures and teaching aids, the work allow us valuable insight into his educational philosophy. Priestley also produced teaching aids: a Chart of Biography in 1765 and New Chart of History in 1769, which used timelines to illustrate the major figures and time periods in history. Some of Priestley’s earliest publications were about language and grew from his post as tutor of languages and belles-lettres at Warrington. In 1761 Priestley published The Rudiments of English Grammar,and this was followed a year later by A Course of Lectures on the Theory of Language and Universal Grammar. Priestley was an influential grammarian, and his publications were widely read and well received; he is notable for his emphasis on custom and usage as the most useful standards by which to assess correct language. In 1777 his Course of Lectures on Oratory and Criticism explored rhetoric, style and taste, introducing the importance of psychology and human nature as the means by which to understand these aspects of language.
University of Sussex, Great Britain
Last updated: August 11, 2008 | Originally published: