Process Philosophy

Process philosophy is a longstanding philosophical tradition that emphasizes becoming and changing over static being. Though present in many historical and cultural periods, the term “process philosophy” is primarily associated with the work of the philosophers Alfred North Whitehead (1861-1947) and Charles Hartshorne (1897-2000).

Process philosophy is characterized by an attempt to reconcile the diverse intuitions found in human experience (such as religious, scientific, and aesthetic) into a coherent holistic scheme. Process philosophy seeks a return to a neo-classical realism that avoids subjectivism. This reconciliation of the intuitions of objectivity and subjectivity, with a concern for scientific findings, produces the explicitly metaphysical speculation that the world, at its most fundamental level, is made up of momentary events of experience rather than enduring material substances. Process philosophy speculates that these momentary events, called “actual occasions” or “actual entities,” are essentially self-determining, experiential, and internally related to each other.

Actual occasions correspond to electrons and sub-atomic particles, but also to human persons. The human person is a society of billions of these occasions (that is, the body), which is organized and coordinated by a single dominant occasion (that is, the mind). Thus, process philosophy avoids a strict mind-body dualism.

Most process philosophers speculate that God is also an actual entity, though there is an internal debate among process thinkers whether God is a series of momentary actual occasions, like other worldly societies, or a single everlasting and constantly developing actual entity. Either way, process philosophy conceives of God as dipolar. God’s primordial nature is the permanent ground of value and determinacy and a storehouse for universals, or “envisaged potentialities.” God’s consequent nature, on the other hand, takes in data from the world at every instant, changing as the world changes. A considerable number of process philosophers argue that God is not a necessary element of the metaphysical system and may be excised from the process model without any loss of consistency.

Process philosophy has also been cited as a unique synthesis of classical methodology, modern concerns for scientific adequacy, and post-modern critiques of hegemony, dualism, determinism, materialism, and egocentrism. In this respect, process philosophy is sometimes called “constructive postmodernism,” alluding to its speculative method of system building with a hypothetical and fallible stance, over the alternative of deconstruction.

Table of Contents

  1. What Counts as Process Philosophy
    1. The Perennial Process Tradition
    2. The Whitehead-Hartshorne Tradition
  2. Assumptions and Method
    1. In Pursuit of a Holistic Worldview
    2. Neo-Classical Realism
    3. Speculative Metaphysics
  3. Basic Metaphysics
    1. Creativity as Ultimate
    2. Events, not Substances
    3. Internal and External Relations
    4. Rejection of Nominalism
  4. The Human Person
    1. Panexperientialism with Organizational Duality
    2. Perception and Prehension
  5. God and the World
    1. Dipolar Panentheism
    2. Freedom and the Problem of Evil
  6. Non-theistic Variations
  7. Process Philosophy as Constructive Postmodernism
  8. Conclusion
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. What Counts as Process Philosophy

a. The Perennial Process Tradition

Process philosophy argues that the language of development and change are more appropriate descriptors of reality than the language of static being. This tradition has roots in the West in the pre-Socratic Heraclitus, who likened the structure of reality to the element of fire, as change is reality and stability is illusion. Heraclitus is famous for the aphorism that one can never step in the same river twice.

In Eastern traditions, many Taoist and Buddhist doctrines can be classified as “process.” For example, the Taoist admonition that one should be spontaneously receptive to the never ending flux of yin and yang emphasizes a process worldview, as do the Buddhist notions of pratyitya-samutpada (the inter-dependent origination of events) and anatma (the denial of a substantial or enduring self).

More recently on the continent, one finds process philosophers in Hegel, who saw the history of the world as processive and dialectic unfolding of Absolute Spirit and in Gottfried Leibniz, Henri Bergson, Nikolai Berdyaev, Friedrich Nietzsche, and Pierre Teilhard de Chardin. Even David Hume (insofar as he rejected the idea of a substantial self in favor of a series of unconnected perceptual “bundles”) can be considered a process philosopher.

Process Philosophy found its most fertile ground and active development in 20th century North America. American philosophers Samuel Alexander, George Herbert Mead, John Dewey, C.S. Peirce, William James, Alfred North Whitehead, Charles Hartshorne, and others continue this tradition.

Peirce’s philosophy is process-oriented in several respects. He defines truth as the unattainable goal of a never-ending process of inquiry. Likewise, Peirce’s semiology indicates that the meaning of signs is always triangulated between an object, its sign, and the infinite series of “interpretants” or subjective impressions made by the sign upon human knowers. Thus, Peirce correlates meaning with an ongoing and indeterminate historical process interpretation. Finally, Peirce was a staunch anti-determinist and advocated tychism, the belief that the operations of the natural world were not fixed and regular, but exhibit considerable spontaneity.

James is considered a process philosopher for several reasons. He stresses that true empiricism requires that we acknowledge the continuous flow of experience (the “blooming buzzing confusion”) as our primary datum rather than individual and discrete physical objects. Also, James was a strong proponent of libertarianism (the belief in genuinely free choice, not the political ideology) and argued that determinism was not a genuine candidate for belief. James also advocated a metaphysics of “pure experience” late in his career, which puts forth the hypothesis that both mind and matter are manifestations of a more primary experiential “stuff.”

Dewey exhibited process themes in his philosophy of education and epistemology. First, Dewey’s philosophy of education criticized the rote memorization of facts, and advocated the development of critical thinking faculties and problem solving abilities, thus shifting the emphasis from the accumulation of static propositions to building capacities for appropriating new insight. Likewise, Dewey’s epistemology of transaction argues that no belief should be considered final, as human knowledge is in a constant state of revision and development. Likewise, the naming of objects is always tentative and human knowing cannot be divorced from its temporal context.

b. The Whitehead-Hartshorne Tradition

Despite these rich and varied contributions, the term “process philosophy” (as well as “process theology” and “process thought”) has become virtually synonymous with the neo-naturalist philosophical legacy left by Alfred North Whitehead (1861-1947) and Charles Hartshorne (1897-2000). This association was popularized among those theologians and philosophers of the mid-century “Chicago School.” For this reason, the remainder of this essay will primarily focus on the Whiteheadian-Hartshornean school of process philosophy. Contemporary philosophers in this school include Lewis Ford, David Ray Griffin, Robert Neville, Victor Lowe, Donald Sherburne, Donald Wayne Viney, Jude Jones, John Lango, Daniel Dombrowski, Randall Auxier, and C. Robert Mesle, among others. Notable characteristics of this variant of process philosophy are its (1) method of metaphysical speculation, (2) event (rather than substance) ontology, (3) assertion of panpsychism or panexperientialism, (4) description of “prehension” in place of perception, and (5) panentheist doctrine of God.

2. Assumptions and Method

a. In Pursuit of a Holistic Worldview

Whitehead begins the preface to his Science and the Modern World (1925) by noting that the human intuitions of science, aesthetics, ethics, and religion each make a positive contribution to the worldview of a community. In each historical period, any one or combination of these intuitions may receive emphasis and thus influence the dominant worldview of its people. It is a peculiar characteristic of the last three (now four) centuries that scientific pursuits have come to dominate the worldview of Western minds. For this reason, Whitehead seeks to establish a comprehensive cosmology—understood here in the sense of a systematic descriptive theory of the world—that does justice to all of the human intuitions and not only the scientific ones. Toward this end, Whitehead argues that philosophy is the “critic of cosmologies,” whose job it is to synthesize, scrutinize and make coherent the divergent intuitions gained through ethical, aesthetic, religious, and scientific experience. Process philosophy is frequently used as a conceptual bridge to facilitate discussions between religion, philosophy, and science.

b. Neo-Classical Realism

Process philosophy represents an aberration in the history of philosophy, as it rejects the peculiarly Modern practice of beginning with philosophical analysis of the knowing subject and moving outwards toward descriptions of the world. Since Rene Descartes, epistemology (the investigation of the origin, structure, methods and validity of knowledge) has been primary and foundational, while ontology (the study of fundamental principles of being) has been secondary and only attempted once its possibility has been established by epistemological analysis.

Process philosophers, however, tend to embrace the reverse, which was more common in classical Greek philosophy. Rather than beginning with subjectivity, process philosophy seeks to describe the world first and the subject’s place in it second. Hartshorne adopted the descriptor “neoclassical” to describe his philosophy and especially his doctrine of God. Hartshorne was neoclassical not only because his philosophy was theocentric rather than egocentric, but also because of his strong tendencies toward rationalism. (Hartshorne defended a variety of the ontological argument for the existence of God.) This neoclassical realist approach circumvents philosophical attacks on metaphysics (for example, Kant’s transcendental critique) that arose in the Modern period. It is a matter of debate between process philosophers and their critics, however, whether process philosophy is pre-modern or post-modern in this respect.

c. Speculative Metaphysics

Process philosophy as a whole employs three methodologies, usually simultaneously: empiricism (knowledge from experience), rationalism (knowledge from deduction), and speculation (knowledge from imagination). Whitehead’s famous metaphor for philosophy from the opening pages of his opus Process and Reality (1929) is that of a short airplane flight. Philosophy begins on the ground with the concrete reality of lived experience. Experience provides us with the raw data for our theories. Then, our thought takes off, losing contact with the ground and soaring into heights of imaginative speculation. During speculation, we use rational criteria and imagination to synthesize facts into a (relatively) systematic worldview. In the end, however, our theories must eventually land and once again make contact with the ground—our speculations and hypotheses must ultimately answer once again to the authority of experience. Though one of Whitehead’s more infamous aphorisms is that “it is more important that an idea be interesting than true,” he insists that speculative theories be both coherent and adequate to the facts of experience. By taking this airplane flight as a model for speculative metaphysics, Whitehead envisions the process of metaphysics to consist in an unending series of “test flights,” as our metaphysical conclusions are never final and always hypothetical. The process of adjusting our metaphysics to meet the demands of experience is a task with no end in sight, as experience continually provides the philosopher with new facts. Thus, process metaphysics regards the status of its own claims as contingent and tentative. This differs significantly from classical metaphysical systems, which are regarded as final, authoritative, and necessary.

3. Basic Metaphysics

a. Creativity as Ultimate

Whitehead argues that the best description of ultimate reality is through the principle of creativity. Creativity is the universal of universals—that which is only actual in virtue of its accidents or instances. Thus, creativity is frequently compared to the notions of Aristotle’s “being qua being,” Martin Heidegger’s “Being itself” (more appropriately “Becoming itself”), or even the material cause of all events. Creativity is the most general notion at the base of all that actually exists. Thus, all actual entities, even God, are in a sense “creatures” of creativity.

Whitehead also characterizes creativity as the principle of novelty. The events of the past are ceaselessly synthesized into a new and unique event, which becomes data for future events. “The many become one, and are increased by one,” (Whitehead, Process and Reality, 20). This focus on oscillation between one and many forms the foundation of the process metaphysic.

b. Events, not Substances

The most counter-intuitive doctrine of process philosophy is its sharp break from the Aristotelian metaphysics of substance, that actuality is not made up of inert substances that are extended in space and time and only externally related to each other. Process thought instead states that actuality is made up of atomic or momentary events. These events, called actual entities or actual occasions, are “the final real things of which the world is made up,” (Whitehead, Process and Reality, 18). They occur very briefly and are characterized by the power of self-determination and subjective immediacy (though not necessarily conscious experience). In many ways, actual occasions are similar to Leibniz’s monads [link], except that occasions are internally related to each other.

The enduring objects one perceives with the senses (for example, rocks, trees, persons, etc.) are made up of serially ordered “societies,” or strings of momentary actual occasions, each flowing into the next and giving the illusion of an object that is continuously extended in time, much like the rapid succession of individual frames in a film that appear as a continuous picture. Contemporary commentators on process thought suggest that individual actual occasions vary in spatio-temporal “size” and can correspond to the phenomena of sub-atomic particles, atoms, molecules, cells, and human persons (that is, souls). Likewise, these individuals may aggregate together to form larger societies (for example, rocks, trees, animal bodies). According to this model, a single electron would be a series of momentary electron-occasions. Likewise, the human subject would be a series of single occasions that coordinates and organizes many of the billions of other actual occasions that make up the subject’s “physical” body.

Where substance metaphysics and modern science have posited that the world is made up of material objects, Whitehead argues that “organism” is a better term for things that exist. Whereas matter is self-sustaining, externally related, valueless, passive, and without an intrinsic principle of motion; organisms are interdependent, internally and externally related, value-laden, active, and intrinsically active.

c. Internal and External Relations

Process philosophy rejects the doctrine of scientific materialism and substance-based metaphysics that entities can only influence each other by means of external relations. In a metaphysic of material substance, solid bodies are only able to influence other solid bodies by making physical contact with them or exerting some force on them. Although these interaction produce change, they do not affect the intrinsic constitution of the bodies acted upon. As a result, the actualities of materialist metaphysics are able to endure interaction without any changes to their constitution.

Process philosophy asserts that actual occasions influence each other by internal and external relations. When one actual occasion is internally related to another, the past occasions participate in and contribute to the intrinsic character of the present. The primary vehicle for internal relatedness is Whitehead’s notion of prehension. Prehension is the experiential activity of an actual occasion by which characteristics of one occasion come to be present in another. Thus, one occasion may prehend certain qualities of an occasion in its past (for example, a shade of red or a certain proposition). By means of prehension, a past occasion comes to be constitutively present in the contemporary occasion and contributes to its intrinsic character. All actualities prehend. This is not a voluntary or a necessarily conscious activity.

One important consequence of this doctrine is the principle of relativity, which states that every actual occasion is internally related to every other actual occasion in its past (that is, the entire past history of the universe), though the efficacy each past occasion exerts upon the present occasion may vary widely. Thus process philosophers describe the world as a vast and tangled web of relationalty and interdependence.

d. Rejection of Nominalism

Whitehead, who famously asserts that the history of philosophy is safely characterized as “a series of footnotes to Plato” (Whitehead, Process and Reality, 39), resurrects the Platonic notion that the qualities of objects exist independently of any perceiver. This position arises from the need for the actual occasions to take on “forms of definiteness” as they assimilate the data of the past into the particularity of the present. Because Whitehead argues that anything that exerts causal efficacy upon the world must be an actual entity (his “ontological principle”), he denies that universals are free-floating, independently real entities like the Platonic Forms. Instead, Whitehead calls the universals “eternal objects” and locates them in the mind of God, who is an actual entity. The divine actuality, according to Whitehead, primordially envisages and orders the eternal objects into an ideal pattern(s). Eternal objects are tiered in complexity. Several simple eternal objects can be ordered into a single complex eternal object, which would be an ordered arrangement of simpler eternal objects. So a particular shade of green is a relatively simple eternal object, while “green life form” is a more complex eternal object and “vegetable” would be even more complex.

Thus, eternal objects are relevant novel possibilities that are presented to and “ingress” into every actual occasion. The divine actuality mediates eternal objects—both simple and complex—to other actual occasions by means of prehension. These eternal objects make their way into the concrescing (developing) actual occasions when an occasion “feels” them in a past actual occasion or in the divine actuality. A person who experiences a musty smell feels that datum as a complex eternal object that was present in the occasions that make up the moldy book. The direct transmission of eternal objects from the divine actuality to worldly actual occasions is the chief source of novelty in the world.

Though Whitehead and Hartshorne share many metaphysical commitments, Whitehead’s doctrine of eternal objects is one source of significant disagreement between the two process philosophers. Hartshorne argues that although there is a meaningful sense in which specific qualities of phenomena are objectively real, he does not agree that they are “haunting reality from all eternity, as it were, begging for instantiation, nor that God primordially envisages a complete set of such qualities,” (Hartshorne, Creative Synthesis, 59). For example, Hartshorne uses the example that the quality of “being like Shakespeare” could not have existed, even in God’s mind, before Shakespeare’s actual existence.

Hartshorne contends that Whitehead has obscured or overlooked the distinction between what is determinable and what is determinate. The former consists in unactualized possibility that is in no way settled beforehand. Hartshorne asks us to consider the advance possibilities of a painter creating a painting. Certainly the possible outcomes are partially definite. There are only so many pigments in existence and the perceptual range of human vision is fixed, but the precise outcome of this creative act is not pre-existent as an eternal object. Not even God, claims Hartshorne, can anticipate the products of human creativity. Prior to completion, the finished painting is determinable, but not determinate. The process of becoming for Hartshorne is more than the temporally ordered actualization of antecedently (or eternally) present forms—a “vast sum of determinates”—but rather the essentially creative emergence of genuinely novel forms and patterns of infinite range.

Hartshorne, however, does not endorse nominalism, which he defines as the denial of a genuine distinction between the universal and the particular. (Nominalists either deny ontological status to all universals or to all particulars.) In this sense, Hartshorne is a realist, just not as robustly realist as Whitehead. He allows that some universals are eternal (for example, the necessary aspect of deity and numbers), but most are emergent and contingent upon the temporal flow of actual events.

4. The Human Person

a. Panexperientialism with Organizational Duality

Process metaphysics doctrine of panpsychism or panexperientialism state that all individual actual entities—from electrons to human persons—are essentially self-determining and possess the ability to experience the world around them. Although actual entities possess experience, it is not necessarily conscious experience. Whitehead argues that consciousness presupposes experience and not vice versa.

Panexperientialism is another significant departure from the dominant metaphysical theories of idealism (all is mind), dualism (mind and matter are equally fundamental), or materialism (all is matter). Whitehead’s metaphysic is a monistic one. Everything that is actual is composed of actual occasions. Actual occasions are themselves diverse; they vary in size and complexity. Electronic occasions have limited freedom and opportunities, while human persons are capable of incredibly rich experiences. Despite the great range of complexity, these differences are differences of degree, not of kind. Thus, the traditional problems of mind-body interaction are not present in process metaphysics because reality, at its base, is not purely mental or physical. Actual entities, as events, are at their foundation experiential and one can have physical experiences and mental experiences.

Although the system is a monistic one, which is characterized by experience going “all the way down” to the simplest and most basic actualities, there is a duality between the types of organizational patterns to which societies of actual occasions might conform. In some instances, actual occasions will come together and give rise to a “regnant” or dominant society of occasions. The most obvious example of this is when the molecule-occasions and cell-occasions in a body produce, by means of a central nervous system, a mind or soul. This mind or soul prehends all the feeling and experience of the billions of other bodily occasions and coordinates and integrates them into higher and more complex forms of experience. The entire society that supports and includes a dominant member is, to use Hartshorne’s term, a compound individual.

Other times, however, a bodily society of occasions lacks a dominant member to organize and integrate the experiences of others. Rocks, trees, and other non-sentient objects are examples of these aggregate or corpuscular societies. In this case, the diverse experiences of the multitude of actual occasions conflict, compete, and are for the most part lost and cancel each other out. Whereas the society of occasions that comprises a compound individual is a monarchy, Whitehead describes corpuscular societies as “democracies.” This duality accounts for how, at the macroscopic phenomenal level, we experience a duality between the mental and physical despite the fundamentally and uniformly experiential nature of reality. Those things that seem to be purely physical are corpuscular societies of occasions, while those objects that seem to possess consciousness, intelligence, or subjectivity are compound individuals.

b. Perception and Prehension

Every actual occasion receives data from every other actual occasion in its past by means of prehension. Whitehead calls the process of integrating this data by proceeding from indeterminacy to determinacy “concrescence.” Concrescence typically consists of an occasion feeling the entirety of its past actual world, filtering and selecting some data for relevance, and integrating, combining, and contrasting that original data with novel data (provided by the divine occasion) in increasingly complex stages of “feeling” until the occasion reaches “satisfaction” and has become fully actual. Because this process of synthesis involves distilling the entire past universe down into a single moment of particular experience, Whitehead calls a completed actual occasion “superject” or “subject-superject.” After an occasion reaches satisfaction, it becomes an objectively immortal datum for all future occasions.

In human beings (and all other sufficiently complex animals), the concrescing structure of the dominant occasions entails that consciousness is a derivative form of experience that only appears in the latest stage of concrescence. “Consciousness flickers; and even at its brightest, there is a small focal region of clear illumination, and a large penumbral region of experience which tells of intense experience in dim apprehension. The simplicity of clear consciousness is no measure of the complexity of complete experience,” (Whitehead, Process and Reality, 267). Thus, sense perception, because it is conscious, is considered by Whitehead to be a relatively superficial mode of perception. In fact, Whitehead argues that human beings perceive in three modes, of which sensory perception is only one.

Perception in the mode of causal efficacy is Whitehead’s term for the initial prehension by an actual occasion of its entire past world. Whitehead describes the data of the past world coming to bear upon the occasion as “brute fact.” Thus, the occasions of the past exert efficient causation upon the concrescing occasion. Whitehead argues that all actualities experience perception in the mode of causal efficacy, and it is by far the most significant and fundamental mode of causation. Thus, contrary to Hume, we do perceive the causal influence of other actualities, although not always consciously.

Perception in the mode of presentational immediacy is the manifestation of causal efficacy as it “bubbles up” into consciousness. Some examples include uninterpreted blotches of color that one sees or the experience of an audible tone, without comparison to those tones that have already been heard. Presentational immediacy provides the subject with information about the durational present, but not the past or future.

These two “pure” modes of perception—causal efficacy and perceptual immediacy—are combined in the third “impure” mode of perception: symbolic reference. Perception in the mode of symbolic reference is the process by which we identify and correlate those phenomena in causal efficacy with the causally efficacious occasions in our past. Symbolic reference is the conscious (or liminally conscious) activity of assigning referential relations between immediate sensory phenomena and past actualities “out there” in the world. Process philosophy diverges from the skepticism about the world-in-itself engendered by Hume and Imannuel Kant. Human beings are able to perceive causal relations and can correlate noumena and phenomena by means of symbolic reference.

5. God and the World

a. Dipolar Panentheism

In his metaphysical works, Whitehead notes that, given the virtually unlimited number of “forms of definiteness” (that is, eternal objects) available, the “creative advance” of the occasions in the universe would not be possible if there were not some “principle of concretion or limitation” placed upon actuality. This principle must determine which forms are available for instantiation in each object and introduce contraries, grades, and oppositions among those values. The metaphysical system requires a reason that actual occasions take on only a very specific selection of the eternal objects that are available. Thus, God is introduced into the system as the principle of limitation, which actual occasions require. In Whitehead’s system, only actual entities can have causal efficacy. Thus, a divine actual entity was posited. Though Whitehead’s philosophy has inspired an entire tradition of process theology, the doctrine of God at this point (especially in Science and the Modern World) is very thin, theologically speaking. Whitehead was initially a reluctant theist. God appears as a metaphysical necessity—the evaluator and purveyor of universals—and little more.

It is important to note that although God’s envisagement of the eternal objects is “eternal” (that is, causally outside of the temporal flow), God’s own being is that of an everlasting actual entity (Whitehead) or an everlasting society of discrete actual occasions (Hartshorne). Process philosophy’s dedication to naturalism prohibits the postulation of any entities that are exempt from metaphysical principles, especially God, who should be the chief exemplification of the world’s metaphysical principles rather than their sole exception. The tension in the process conception of God between an eternal and unchanging evaluation of eternal objects and a temporal entity internally related to every other actuality has led to Whitehead’s “dipolar” doctrine of God. It is useful to think about God’s being by means of two abstractions: God’s primordial nature and God’s consequent nature. The primordial nature envisages and orders the eternal objects into a single unimaginably complex ideal. The consequent nature of God interacts with the world, prehending fully every single actual occasion in the world upon its concrescence and, thus, preserving the past. This consequent nature of God is the aspect of God that is continuously changing as the world changes and feels every experience in the world with subjective immediacy.

Process philosophers also characterize God’s relation to the world as one of mutual transcendence, mutual immanence, and mutual creation. For example, God transcends the world insofar as God is able to fully synthesize and integrate every occasion in the world and compare that world with the primordial envisagement of ideals. The world transcends God insofar as it is not subject to divine fiat and can disregard God’s lures or presentation of novel possibilities. Likewise, God is the creator of the world in the sense that an orchestra conductor or a poet is a creator—organizing and directing elements that frequently surprise or misinterpret. The world creates God in the sense that the data from the world are internally related and constitutive of God’s being.

The doctrine of God established by process philosophy is a significant departure from previous models of the God-World relation. Process philosophy does not endorse classical theism, understood as the doctrine that God is completely transcendent, supernatural, beyond time and space, simple, and unchanging. Nor does process philosophy endorse pure immanence or pantheism, the doctrine that the world and God are identical and that God is nothing more than the sum of entities in the world. Instead, process philosophy endorses panentheism, the belief that all is in God and God is immanent everywhere in the universe, but is more than the universe. A frequently used analogy here is that the universe is God’s body and God is the consciousness that directs and interacts with that body. God is the divine subject of all experience.

b. Freedom and the Problem of Evil

Because every actual entity, including God, is an instance of creativity and is therefore experiential and self-determining, God is incapable of overriding the self-determination of the creaturely occasions. To exist at all is to be composed of creativity and this necessarily implies both an element of self-determination and a particular pattern of causal relation with all other entities. God is not to be treated as an exception to all metaphysical principles, invoked to save their collapse. God is their chief exemplification. (Process and Reality, 343). God prehends and is prehended just as billions of other actualities are prehended. Ultimately, the syntheses of these data (including divine data) are determined by the concrescing entity, whether that entity is an atmospheric molecule or a human being. God’s power over the world is described as persuasive rather than coercive. God cannot override the self-directed integrations of feeling present in the concrescence of any occasion—God cannot force human beings to make any particular decision and cannot supernaturally intervene in natural processes. God’s power is that of presenting novel eternal objects (possibilities) as a “lure” to the creaturely occasions. For this reason, the God of process philosophy is not omnipotent, if one’s definition of omnipotence includes the ability to perform any conceivable action.

This denial of omnipotence (see Charles Hartshorne’s Omnipotence and Other Theological Mistakes) is process philosophy’s solution to the problem of evil. Because the power of self-determination is a quality of Becoming itself, anything that exists must necessarily possess self-determination. God’s benevolence is not at odds with the existence of moral and natural evils in the world because God’s power cannot prevent creaturely occasions from ignoring the divine lures and acting in a less-than-ideal fashion.

6. Non-theistic Variations

Some later process philosophers (for example, Donald Sherburne, Robert C. Mesle) dispute whether God is truly necessary to Whitehead’s system. They argue that a non-theistic or “naturalistic” version of process philosophy is more useful and coherent. This movement, classically expressed by Donald Sherburne’s 1971 article “Whitehead without God,” observes that Whitehead believes that God is metaphysically necessary because God (a) preserves the past; (b) is the ontological ground, or “somewhere” of the eternal objects; and (c) is the source of order, novelty, and limitation in worldly occasions. Sherburne argues that these roles for God are inconsistent with the metaphysical principles of Whitehead’s system and are superfluous. According to Whitehead’s own principles, God cannot be the ground for the givenness of the past. Likewise, the eternal objects need not be located in an everlasting divine actuality—a rather Platonic formulation—but could be inchoate in the flux of worldly actualities themselves—a more Aristotelian view. Finally, Sherburne points out that a principle of limitation can arise from the naturally ordered causal relevance of the past rather than God. A concrescing occasion is most heavily influenced by the preceding occasion in its immediate past and the determinate character of this occasion limits the possibilities of the present.

7. Process Philosophy as Constructive Postmodernism

“Modernity” in itself is a rather diffuse term, which means many things to many people, and especially varies depending on the disciplinary context. The term “postmodern” is even more ambiguous (and abused). Process philosophy’s place in the history of philosophy is somewhat of an enigma, due to its ambivalent relationship with modernity. In some ways, process philosophy seems pre-modern by virtue of its neo-classicism and unapologetic metaphysical speculation. Process philosophy also embraces modernity in its dedication to the importance of natural science and its metaphysical realism. It is also post-modern in its rejection of both substance metaphysics and the notion of an enduring self.

Many process philosophers, following the lead of David Ray Griffin, refer to their own work as “constructive postmodernism” in order to differentiate it from the deconstruction program of Jacques Derrida, Jean-François Lyotard, Michel Foucault, and others. The latter movements seek to dismantle the notions of system, self, God, purpose, meaning, reality, and truth in order to prevent, among other things, oppressive totalities and hegemonic narratives that arose in the Modern period. Constructive postmodernism, on the other hand, seeks emancipation from the negative aspects of modernity through revision rather than elimination. Constructive postmodernism seeks to revise and re-synthesize the insights and positive features of Modernity into a post-anthropocentric, post-individualistic, post-materialist, post-nationalist, post-patriarchal, and post-consumerist worldview. For example, modernity’s worship of scientific achievement, combined with lingering Aristotelian doctrines of substance and efficient causation may have led to a mechanistic materialist worldview. Deconstructive postmodernism would combat this worldview by undermining the efficacy of science, claiming that all observational statements are actually about our own culturally-constituted conceptual scheme, not about an independently real world. Constructive postmodernism seeks instead to leave natural science intact, because empirical observation itself produces evidence against mechanism and materialism when it takes in a sufficiently broad data set (that is, all of human experience, and not just experience of “physical” objects).

8. Conclusion

Many thinkers have found process philosophy to be most useful because of this ambivalent stance. Whitehead’s own method for resolving philosophical difficulties was to see the polar oppositions present in any philosophical debate (idealism vs. materialism; libertarianism vs. determinism) as two exaggerated positions that arise from an inappropriately narrow selection of data and evidence. Solutions to problems, for process philosophy, are always to be found in novel syntheses of the past judgments.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Bergson, Henri. Creative Evolution (Kessinger Publications, 2003).
  • Bergson, Henri. The Creative Mind: An Introduction to Metaphysics (Citadel Press, 1992).
  • Browning, Douglas and William T. Myers, eds. Philosophers of Process (New York: Fordham, 1998).
    • This anthology collects important essays from the broader tradition of process philosophy—C.S. Peirce, William James, Friedrich Nietzsche, Samuel Alexander, Henri Bergson, John Dewey, A.N. Whitehead, George Herbert Mead, and Charles Hartshorne.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. Creative Synthesis and Philosophic Method (Chicago: Open Court, 1970).
    • Hartshorne tackles classical issues in philosophy: proofs for theism, metaphysics and language, a priori knowledge, aesthetic value, and the nature of reality.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. Insights and Oversights of Great Thinkers (Albany: SUNY Press, 1983).
    • Hartshorne presents his own systematic philosophical views by commenting on the major figures in the history of philosophy from the Pre-Socratics to Merleau-Ponty and Sartre.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. Creativity in American Philosophy (Albany: SUNY Press, 1984).
    • Hartshorne comments on the major figures in American philosophy, focusing on their metaphysical commitments, and treatment of “creativity.”
  • Hartshorne, Charles. Omnipotence and Other Theological Mistakes (Albany: SUNY Press, 1984).
    • This short, simple, and lucid work summarizes Hartshorne’s doctrine of God and related philosophical theology.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. The Zero Fallacy (Chicago: Open Court, 1997).
    • This anthology presents diverse essays by Hartshorne on classical theism, democracy, the logic of contrasts, the nature of metaphysics, the mind-body problem, and even ornithology.
  • Whitehead, Alfred North. Science and the Modern World (New York: The Free Press, 1925).
    • By arguing that the rise of modern science is a contingent and idiosyncratic cultural fluke, rather than an inevitable intellectual achievement, Whitehead establishes the framework for his own holistic metaphysical system.
  • Whitehead, Alfred North. Religion in the Making (New York: Fordham, 1926).
    • By examining the history, phenomenology, and sociology of religion, Whitehead discusses the important interrelation of religious experience, scientific experience, and metaphysical philosophy.
  • Whitehead, Alfred North. Process and Reality (New York: The Free Press, 1929).
    • In his highly technical and dense opus, Whitehead systematically describes his unique “philosophy of organism.”
  • Whitehead, Alfred North. Adventures of Ideas (New York: The Free Press, 1933).
    • By examining the history of civilization, Whitehead explores the notions of widescale moral progress of civilization, the infusion of values and ideals in the world, the God-world relation, and the importance of novelty and adventure for human inquiry.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Cobb, John B., Jr. and Griffin, David Ray. Process Theology: An Introductory Exposition (Philadelphia: Westminster Press, 1976).
    • This book applies the metaphysics of Whitehead and Hartshorne to explicitly theological problems.
  • Cobb, John B., Jr. and Griffin, David Ray. Postmodernism and Public Policy: Reframing Religion, Culture, Education, Sexuality, Class, Race, Politics, and the Economy (Albany: SUNY Press, 2001).
    • John B. Cobb, Jr. uses a Whiteheadian perspective to address matters of public policy and social justice.
  • Cloots, Andre, and Robinson, Keith A.. Deleuze, Whitehead, and the Transformation of Metaphysics (Brussels: Flämische Akademie der Wissenschaften, 2005).
    • This work places Whitehead in conversation with French poststructuralist Gilles Deleuze.
  • Dombrowski, Daniel. A Platonic Philosophy of Religion (Albany: SUNY Press, 2006).
    • This work’s interpretive framework derives from the application of process philosophy and discusses the continuation of Plato’s thought in the works of Hartshorne and Whitehead.
  • Griffin, David Ray. God, Power, and Evil: A Process Theodicy (Philadelphia, Westminster, 1976).
    • This work compares traditional theodicies with the Whiteheadian-Hartshornean solution to the problem of evil.
  • Griffin, David Ray. Reenchantment without Supernaturalism: A Process Philosophy of Religion (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 2001).
    • This book uses process philosophy as an explanatory scheme for major issues in the philosophy of religion—religious language, religious experience and perception, freedom, evil, and morality.
  • Griffin, David Ray et al. Founders of Constructive Postmodern Philosophy: Peirce, James, Bergson, Whitehead, and Hartshorne. (Albany: SUNY Press, 1993).
    • This volume discusses process philosophy as a distinctively postmodern trajectory of thought.
  • Jones, Judith. Intensity: An Essay in Whiteheadian Ontology (Nashville: Vanderbilt University Press, 1998).
  • Keller, Catherine and Anne Daniell, eds. Process and Difference: Between Cosmological and Poststructuralist Postmodernisms (Albany: SUNY Press, 2002).
    • This collection of essays engages the process philosophical tradition with the poststructuralist movements.
  • LeClerc, Ivor. Whitehead’s Metaphysics (New Jersey: Humanities Press, 1958).

Author Information

J. R. Hustwit
Methodist University
U. S. A.

Categories: Metaphysics