Prodicus was a sophist and rhetorician from Iulis on the island of Ceos. He was contemporary with Democritus and Gorgias, and was a disciple of Protagoras. He flourished in the 86th Olympiad, and it is reported that his disciples included Socrates, Euripides, Theramenes, and Isocrates. His countrymen, after giving him several public jobs, sent him as ambassador to Athens. He was so well received there that he was induced to open a school of rhetoric. In his lectures on literary style he laid stress on the right use of words and the accurate discrimination between synonyms. Plato frequently satirizes him as a pedantic lecturer on the niceties of language. Plato also insinuates that the prospect of wealth prompted Prodicus to open his school, and indeed his lectures seem to have brought him much money. Philostratus also notes that Prodicus was fond of money. He used to go from one city to another displaying his eloquence, and, though he did it in a mercenary way, he nevertheless had great honors paid to him in Thebes and Lacedaemon. His charge to a pupil was fifty drachmae. Aristophanes, however, describes him as the most remarkable of the natural philosophers for wisdom and character. It is reported that people flocked to hear Prodicus, although he had an unpleasant sounding voice. It also related that Xenophon, when a prisoner in Boeotia, desiring to hear Prodicus, came up with the required bail and went and gratified his curiosity (Philostr. l. c.). None of his lectures has come down to us in its original form. His most famous work is The Choice of Hercules, and was frequently cited. The original is lost, but the substance of it is in Xenophon’s Memorabilia(2:1:21). Prodicus was put to death by the Athenians on the charge of corrupting their youth. Sextus Empiricus ranks him among the atheists, and Cicero remarks that some of his doctrines were subversive of all religion. It is said that he explained the origin of religion by the personification of natural objects.
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Last updated: April 21, 2001 | Originally published: April/21/2001
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