A stone, a bag of sugar and a guinea pig all weigh one kilogram. A lily, a cloud and a sample of copper sulphate are white. A statue, a dance and a mathematical equation are beautiful. The fact that distinct particular things can be the same as each other and yet different has been the source of a great deal of philosophical discussion, and in contemporary philosophy we would usually say that what makes distinct particulars qualitatively the same as each other is that they have properties in common. The stone, the sugar and the guinea pig all instantiate the property of weighing one kilogram, while the lily, the cloud and the copper sulphate all instantiate the property of being white. The distribution of properties determines qualitative sameness and difference.

At this point, the consensus ends and a variety of philosophical questions arise about the nature of properties and their relationship to other entities and each other. Is the category of properties a fundamental one, or is the existence of properties determined by the existence of something else? Are some properties more fundamental than others? What is the relationship between properties and causation, and causal laws? What is the relationship between properties and meaning? Do properties determine what could and what could not happen? Do they determine which natural kinds there are? Do properties exist independent of the mind?

Table of Contents

  1. What Are Properties? Ontological Questions
    1. The Ontological Basis of Properties
    2. Nominalism versus Realism
  2. The Identity and Individuation of Properties
    1. Extensional Criteria
    2. A Revised Extensional Criterion: The Modal Criterion
    3. Hyperintensional Criteria
    4. Dualism about Properties and Concepts
    5. The Causal Criterion
    6. Quiddities
  3. Which Properties Are There?
    1. Families of Properties
    2. Maximalism versus Minimalism
  4. Problems with Instantiation
    1. The Instantiation Regress
    2. The Paradox of Self-Instantiation
  5. Categorical and Dispositional Properties
    1. Do Dispositional Properties Depend upon Categorical Ones?
    2. Dispositional Properties from Categorical Ones
    3. Dispositional versus Categorical Properties
    4. Explanatory Uses for Dispositional Properties in Metaphysics: Laws and Modality
    5. Problems with Pan-Dispositionalism
  6. Properties and Natural Kinds
  7. Different Types of Properties
    1. Intrinsic and Extrinsic Properties
    2. Accidental and Essential Properties
    3. Monadic and Polyadic Properties
    4. Determinable and Determinate Properties
    5. Qualitative and Non-Qualitative Properties
    6. Technical Terms for Property Types
  8. Realism about Properties: Do Properties Exist?
  9. Properties in the History of Philosophy
    1. Ancient Theories of Properties
    2. Medieval Theories of Properties
    3. Properties and Enlightenment Science
  10. References and Further Reading

1. What Are Properties? Ontological Questions

a. The Ontological Basis of Properties

Properties are also known as ‘attributes’, ‘characteristics’, ‘features’, ‘types’ and ‘qualities’. The question of whether properties are a fundamental category of entities or whether qualitative similarity and difference is determined by the existence of something else has been a feature of philosophical debates since ancient times. (See Section 9.)

In contemporary philosophy, there are four main accounts of the ontological basis of such entities: universals, tropes, natural classes and resemblance classes. The alternative to any of these accounts is to treat properties as ungrounded entities which require neither further explanation nor ontological grounding. To see the difference between the different accounts of the ontological basis of properties, let us consider three instances of being white: the lily, the cloud and the sample of copper sulphate. The universals theorist maintains that each of these instances of white are instances of universal whiteness, an entity which is either transcendent, in that it exists whether or not it is ever instantiated, or immanent, in that it is wholly present in each of its instances. In the latter case, universals exist as part of the spatio-temporal world, whereas in the former they are abstract.

The trope theorist regards each instance of whiteness as an individual quality, not simply in the case of different types of white particulars such as the lily, the cloud and the copper sulphate, but also across particulars of the same type: the whiteness of each sample of copper sulphate is a distinct trope. Tropes are particular, unrepeatable entities, but this ontology of individual qualities must also have the resources to ground resemblance between tropes. The trope theorist wants to be able to say, for example, that the individual white tropes in a bunch of lilies resemble each other, but the nature of this resemblance is a matter of contention. Some theorists hold that trope similarity is primitive, a matter of unanalysable fact (Maurin 2002), while others maintain that tropes fall into resemblance classes or natural classes (Ehring 2011). Whatever the details of the formulation, it is crucial for a viable theory of properties that some such similarity between tropes obtains, because without it the ontology of tropes is one of bare particulars. In the latter case, the individual white tropes possessed by each lily would be no more similar nor different to each other than the red of the stoplight, the taste of the chocolate bar or the texture of the lizard, and that fails the very first demand of what we want a property theory to do. Similarity or resemblance between tropes is required alongside the mere existence of individual qualities themselves.

In the third and fourth accounts of qualitative similarity and difference, particulars are of the type they are by virtue of being members of sets of particulars: the lily, the cloud and the copper sulphate are all members of the set of white things, and it is in virtue of this that these particulars are white. If set membership is all that is required to be a property, then this view yields a super-abundant, over-populated ontology of properties: anything is a member of infinitely many sets with other things, but not all of these collections mark objective similarities. In order to deal with this over-population problem, the set-theoretic account of properties might add that some of this infinite collection of sets are more natural than others, making the account of properties one of natural classes of particulars (Lewis 1983a, 1986). The resemblance class theorist postulates a less abundant range of properties by maintaining that particulars belong to the classes they do because of primitive resemblance relations between them (Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002). Strictly speaking, however, although the natural and resemblance class theories give an account of qualitative similarity and difference, they may not all count as property theories; whether they do or not depends upon whether one opts to identify the classes of particulars with properties or not.

b. Nominalism versus Realism

A key factor which influences the decision about which ontological account of properties to accept is the question of whether general, repeatable or universal entities exist, or whether the entities which exist in the world are all particulars.

This debate is usually described as one between nominalism and realism, although care is needed here because these terms have other philosophical meanings as well. Within the discussion of properties, nominalism is taken to mean denying the existence of general or repeatable entities such as universals, in favour of an ontology of particulars; however, it is also used to mean ‘denying the existence of abstract objects’ as well. These positions are independent of each other and, in the case of property theories, it is possible to be a nominalist in the sense of denying the existence of abstract objects while accepting the existence of universals (and, conversely, to deny the existence of universals while accepting abstract objects as some resemblance nominalists do). For instance, David Armstrong’s account of properties as immanent universals is consistent with denying the existence of abstract objects while accepting the existence of repeatable, universal entities (Armstrong 1978a, 1978b). From now on, ‘nominalism’ is reserved for the denial that general, repeatable or universal entities exist.

Similarly, the term ‘realism’ is also ambiguous, this time within the study of properties: one might be a realist in the sense of being a realist about universals or repeatable entities; or, more broadly, one might be a realist about the existence of properties. This section considers realism in the former sense and postpones discussion about the existence of properties until Section 8.

In the context of theories of properties, we can distinguish realism, which accepts the existence of universals (either immanent or abstract) or which treats properties as a fundamental category of entities, from two versions of nominalism. The first, moderate nominalism accepts that individual qualities or properties exist in the form of tropes, while the view which is sometimes described as extreme nominalism denies the existence of any fine-grained qualities or property-like entities at all. The appearance of objective similarity and difference in nature must, for the extreme nominalist, be accounted for in terms of sets of concrete particulars (where set membership is not, on pain of circularity, determined by the properties which the particulars have) or in virtue of the particulars falling under a certain concept or a certain predicate applying to them. The former is known as set or class nominalism if no further account is given of why particulars belong to the classes which they do, although some sets may be considered to be more natural than others (see 3b); however, some proponents of this set-theoretic version of extreme nominalism maintain that particulars belong to the classes which they do in virtue of the particulars resembling each other (Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002).

Alternative versions of extreme nominalism refuse to give any reductive account of why distinct particulars are qualitatively similar to each other, dismissing this phenomenon (which gives rise to the debate between nominalists and realists in the first place) as not needing explanation. In this view, which is associated with Quine (1948), the One Over Many Problem is not a genuine philosophical problem: we can give an account of why ‘b is F’ and ‘c is F’ are true in terms of the particulars b and c existing and the predicate F applying to them. We do not require anything more than this semantic theory of predication, according to this version of extreme nominalism; and so not only do we not need to postulate universals, we do not need to postulate an alternative ontological category of particulars such as tropes, nor to give a reductive account of properties in terms of predicates or concepts of the kind which other extreme nominalists might support. This denial of the problem is disparagingly called ‘Ostrich Nominalism’ by Armstrong (1978a, 16) because of the ostrich’s habit of putting its head in the sand in the face of danger, but Quine’s view is defended from this charge by Devitt (1980). (See also Armstrong’s response to Devitt, 1980.)

The extreme nominalist position is usually motivated by suspicion about the ontological nature of universals since these must either be abstract objects, with the particulars which have them participating in or instantiating these abstract entities, or immanent universals which are wholly present at each instantiation. In both cases, one might be concerned that we do not have an account of the relationship between particulars and the universals which they instantiate: that is, what instantiation is. Moreover, if instantiation is itself a relation, its existence may lead to an infinite regress (see Section 4a). One might also be concerned about whether we can understand how immanent universals can be wholly present at many locations at once. In the apparent absence of strict criteria of identity or individuation for universals, which might shed light upon what being a universal amounts to, the extreme nominalist suggests that we should avoid ontological commitment to such entities on the grounds that they are ontologically mysterious (Devitt 1980).

On the other hand, the realist about universals complains that the extreme nominalist’s view is unexplanatory or that she has the direction of explanation the wrong way around. For instance, the extreme nominalist who accounts for qualitative similarity in terms of predicates (sometimes called a ‘predicate nominalist’) explains that distinct particulars are red because the predicate ‘is red’ applies to them; but, the realist urges, the more coherent explanation is that the predicate ‘is red’ applies to the particulars because each of the particulars has the property of being red. In short, it is more coherent to explain why predicates apply to particulars in terms of the properties which they have, rather than the other way around. The same criticism would apply to other forms of extreme nominalism which characterise qualitative similarity between particulars as being a matter of their belonging to the same set or their being subsumed under the same concept. According to Armstrong, the extreme nominalist is either ‘failing to answer a compulsory question in the examination paper’ (1978a, 17) by rejecting the One Over Many Problem, or is getting the answer to that question wrong.

The moderate nominalists, who attempt to occupy the middle position between the realists and extreme nominalists, accept that there is a fine-grained ontological category of qualitative entities, but they insist that these are particular qualities rather than general, repeatable or universal entities. The initial complaint from the realist about these moderate forms of nominalism, such as trope theory, is that if tropes are individual qualities with no relations of similarity or difference between them, then they are each as unlike each other as they are alike and so they fail to satisfy the primary desideratum of a theory of properties because we still have no account of what qualitative similarity is. However, it is crucial to note that this criticism is only effective against naïve accounts of trope theory. As was noted above, more sophisticated forms of trope theory remedy this difficulty by giving an account of similarity between tropes, either by postulating primitive resemblance relations between tropes or by postulating versions of class or resemblance nominalism where tropes are the members of natural or resemblance classes, rather than particulars. Thus, such trope theorists cannot be charged with failing to provide a coherent ontological basis for qualitative similarity.

Despite this, however, the dispute between realists and moderate nominalists lingers on, with the former claiming to have the simpler ontology in comparison with trope theory, and accusing the versions of trope theory which treat resemblance between tropes as primitive of accepting too much as unanalysable brute fact. The trope theorists counter by repeating their complaints about the mysteriousness of universals, and as yet there is no clear winner in this debate. Even Armstrong (1992), who was committed to grounding similarity in immanent universals, admits that

trope theory has comparable explanatory power to his favoured universals theory.

It would be easy to spend the remainder of this article evaluating these alternative accounts of the

ontological basis of properties and the respective benefits of realism or nominalism. However, since each of the theories covered by both realism and moderate nominalism provides a workable property theory which gives an account of qualitative similarity and difference, this project would be superfluous to current requirements. Moreover, although each of these views has its committed proponents, some philosophers have suggested that a principled decision between the options is one which cannot be made in isolation from other, broader philosophical commitments such as those concerning the nature of modality or the existence of abstract objects (Allen 2016), or, if not, then it is a choice which is not of great philosophical significance (Hirsch 1993). With these additional difficulties in mind, the question of whether nominalism or realism is preferable, and the more specific matter concerning which nominalist or realist theory is the best, will not be pursued further.

2. The Identity and Individuation of Properties

It is at least useful—or, some philosophers would argue, imperative (Frege 1884, Quine 1948)—for there to be an account of identity and individuation for each category of entities. If we do not have an account of what determines whether an entity E is exactly the same entity as a member F of the same ontological category as E, or what makes E and F distinct from each other, we do not have a clear conception of what kinds of entities E and F are. To put the point simply: what determines that E = F, or what individuates E from F? The identity and individuation criteria required are constitutive, rather than epistemic, so we need not know (nor even be able to know) whether one property is the same as another in every particular case; it is the question of what makes it the case that one property is the same as another which is at issue.

This requirement for identity and individuation criteria for each category is a general one in metaphysics—applying equally to other categories such as sets, objects and persons—but it is one which has proved problematic in the case of properties because it is a difficult requirement for the property theorist to satisfy. Thus, those who treat the provision of identity criteria as mandatory for a category of entities to be legitimate go as far as rejecting the objective existence of properties, qualities, attributes and such in favour of versions of nominalism which rely on predicates or sets of concrete individuals instead (see Section 1b).

a. Extensional Criteria

The initial problem is that properties cannot be identified by their spatio-temporal location alone (as we might do with particular objects) because many distinct properties can be co-located. Nor do properties satisfy extensional identity criteria like sets do; that is, a property cannot be identified by the set of individuals which instantiates it, at least if we just take actual individuals into account. Purely by accident, all individuals with a property P might also have property Q and so the set of all P individuals will be identical with the set of all Q individuals. If we accept a set-theoretic extensional account of property identity, then P = Q. For example, we can imagine a world in which everything which has the mass of exactly one gram is also a sphere, and that nothing else in that world is a sphere. In such a world, being a sphere = having mass 1g because the set of individuals which instantiates being a sphere is the same set as that which instantiates having mass 1g, since sets are identified by the elements they contain. But it is utterly counterintuitive to identify these properties: it seems possible that something which is not a sphere could have a mass of 1g, or that a sphere could have a mass other than 1g. This is known as the problem of accidental coextension.

With the obvious candidates rejected, the search for identity criteria for properties must look elsewhere. Part of the difficulty with how to proceed at this point arises because we need at least a rough picture of how many properties there are in order to ascertain whether a proposed criterion matches our intuitions about properties or not. The question of the number of properties which there are might, in turn, be affected by what one thinks that properties do: are properties causal entities, such as causes and effects, or entities which determine natural laws or regularities in nature? Are they semantic values; that is, do they determine what the predicates of our language mean? Or, are they something else besides?

Some of these options will be discussed below, but for now it is enough to note that the interconnections between these issues make it difficult to give a unique and plausible account of property identity in the abstract. Nevertheless, there are some viable candidates for such a criterion.

b. A Revised Extensional Criterion: The Modal Criterion

First, one could take seriously the intuition that the set-theoretic account of property identity, which was rejected above on the grounds of accidental coextension, might be acceptable if we considered all the possible individuals which instantiate a property, rather than just all the actual individuals which instantiate it. The problem with accidental coextension is that the same set of individuals happen to instantiate apparently distinct properties P and Q, although it seems plausible to think that an individual could exist which instantiated P without instantiating Q. But that problem will be alleviated if we include such possible individuals in the set in the first place. However, in order to do this, possible individuals must exist in the same sense as actual ones and so, following David Lewis, we must accept that modal realism is true (Lewis 1986). If we do, there is a constitutive, modal criterion of property identity based on the necessary coextension of identical properties; equivalently, for the modal realist, properties are identical if they are instantiated by the same set of possible and actual individuals.

One might object that Lewis’s modal criterion does not individuate properties finely enough, however. For instance, some distinct properties appear to be necessarily coextensive in his view: being a triangle and being a closed three-sided shape are instantiated by all the same actual and possible individuals but, one might argue, they are not the same property and so we do not want to identify them as Lewis’s criterion would do. At this point, the supporter of the modal criterion has a choice of two responses: first, he might deny the objector’s intuition that being a triangle and being a closed, three-sided shape are distinct properties. Or he might question the example in another way by arguing that such properties are not coextensive anyway, either because they are instantiated by distinct individuals or else because they are relations between different parts of the same individuals. Being a triangle and being a closed three-sided shape involve angles and sides respectively, regardless of whether broadly speaking they are instantiated by the same individual things (Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002, 100). However, a consequence of this move is that we cannot rely upon our intuitions about whether a property is monadic or polyadic (see 7c for more on this distinction).

Alternatively, if one decides to identify necessarily coextensive properties to preserve the modal criterion, there are also difficulties. First, it seems plausible that someone might have contradictory beliefs about a property: Sam believes that he has drawn a triangle, but Sam does not believe that he has drawn a closed three-sided shape. If we want properties to ground the distinction between these beliefs, or between propositional attitudes in general, then there will have to be a finer-grained distinction between properties. This matter is particularly pressing if one hopes for a property theory which helps to account for meaning or representation.

Secondly, the modal criterion identifies all indiscriminately necessary properties—properties which trivially apply to everything (see 7f)—since these too are necessarily coextensive. Properties such as being such that the number thirty-seven exists, being such that 2 + 2 = 4, and is dancing or not dancing apply to every possible individual and so all turn out to be identical with each other. One might regard this as an advantage on the basis that indiscriminately necessary properties are a dubious family of properties, although there do seem to be cases in which we are intuitively prone to distinguish them, such as when Sam believes that he is such that 2 + 2 = 4, but Sam does not believe that he is such that Fermat’s last theorem is true. If properties directly determine mental content, Sam cannot have both a true and a false belief about the same property.

c. Hyperintensional Criteria

In order to deal with these problems, we seem to require a finer-grained, hyperintensional criterion of property identity that can distinguish between properties which are necessarily coextensive. There is not much consensus about what the basis of such a criterion would be: one might think that properties are individuated linguistically or formally, so the property of being triangular and red would be distinct from being red and triangular. Perhaps this individuates properties too finely, at least for many of the roles we have presumed that properties play. Alternative hyperintensional accounts identify properties with objectively existing concepts (Bealer 1982) or with abstract objects (Zalta 1983, 1988). Alternatively, one might turn to the quiddistic criterion of property identity discussed below.

d. Dualism about Properties and Concepts

The main problems for the modal criterion seem to arise when we are trying to employ properties to give an account of mental representation, or to capture differences between someone’s psychological states. If this is the case, one might argue that we could supplement the ontology of properties—identified and individuated according the possible and actual individuals which instantiate them—with a finer-grained ontology of concepts or linguistic entities. Properties could be coarser grained, perhaps identified and individuated according to the modal criterion, while predicates or concepts could be employed in the explanation of psychological states. (Bealer 1982. See Nolan 2014 for criticism of this strategy.)

e. The Causal Criterion

An alternative, and potentially much more coarse-grained, account of property identity is proposed by Shoemaker (1980) who suggests that properties can be identified and individuated in virtue of their causal roles. Thus, property P is identical with property Q if and only if P and Q have all the same causes and effects. Such a criterion exploits the fact that properties are causally related to each other and, furthermore, many properties appear to enter into these causal relations essentially: having mass of 1kg is having whatever it is that requires 1N force to accelerate at 1m/s2 in a frictionless environment, and which will create 9 x 1016 Joules of energy when the 1kg mass is destroyed. Because the causal relations in question are usually general causal relations, versions of this criterion are sometimes characterised as identifying and individuating properties in terms of their nomological or nomic role: that is, the role which the respective properties play in laws of nature, whether causal or structural (Swoyer 1982; Kistler 2002). The causal and nomological role criteria are sometimes grouped together as structuralist accounts of property identity and individuation, since what is essential to a property is its relations to other properties (and perhaps also to other entities).

The utility of the causal criterion might be restricted, however: if any properties do not enter into causal relations—that is, if they are uncaused and also causally inert—the causal criterion will not apply to them. Also, properties which are epiphenomenal (if any exist) will also be omitted, unless these can be identified and individuated on the basis of their causes alone. Spatio-temporal properties and properties of abstract objects (if there are any) are particularly problematic in this regard. Given these problems, one might maintain that the ontology of properties is mixed, with some which are essentially causal properties and others which are not. If so, however, the causal criterion is not a general criterion of what makes properties the same as each other or different, and thus it does not illuminate what in general a property is. Nevertheless, as the causal conception of properties has become more popular, more research has been done to explain how properties which do not appear to be essentially causal are essentially causal after all (Mumford 2004; Bird 2017; Williams 2017).

At this point, it is worth noting a metaphysical distinction between two closely related views which are consistent with property structuralism: one can take the causal relations which a property enters into as its constitutive identity criteria, or one can take properties to have an essentially causal nature which then determines the respective relations which each property enters into. In the former view, the nature of a property is determined by the relations in which it stands, whereas in the latter, the nature of a property determines the relations in which it stands. If one cares about there being strict identity criteria for each category of entities (Quine 1948), then the former provides non-circular identity criteria for properties (on the assumption that the nature of the relations into which a property enters is not determined by the nature of the property), whereas the latter view does not. Rather, the latter view asserts that each property has or consists of an intrinsic causal (or nomological) nature which serves to identify and individuate it. Although this move will not satisfy those who require strict identity criteria, it is argued that assuming that properties have intrinsic, essentially causal natures can facilitate a rich and fruitful theory of causation, laws, modality and perhaps more, and thus that it is worth abandoning methodological scruples for metaphysical benefits. These theories are discussed in Section 5.

If either of these structuralist conceptions of properties is correct, then a property could not have different causes and effects from those it has, because the causal relations which it enters into are constitutive of its nature (or else its nature determines which causal relations it enters into). Each property has its causal or nomological role necessarily. (A property might have different causes and effects in different background conditions, or in conjunction with different properties, but that is different.) One argument given in favour of this conception of properties is how well it fits with our understanding of fundamental properties via the physical sciences: in keeping with the example at the beginning of this section, we can empirically determine what properties can do whereas it is not obvious that we have the same epistemic access to what their qualitative nature is (for exceptions, see the next section). It would be parsimonious, as well as convenient, to think that there is nothing more to being a property than its contribution to causal or nomological processes.

f. Quiddities

Against the structuralist conceptions of properties discussed in the previous section, one might be concerned that there is more to a property than its causal or nomological role; or, going further, that the nature of a property is only contingently related to the role it plays in causation or laws. If this is the case, the nomological role R played by a property P in the actual world could be played by Q in another possible situation; and furthermore, P (which has actual role R) could have nomological role S in another possible situation. Moreover, one might worry that the causal or nomological criteria try to characterise properties in terms of their relations to other things, rather than as they themselves are internally. For instance, Armstrong notes that ‘properties are self-contained things, keeping themselves to themselves, not pointing beyond themselves to further effects brought about in virtue of such properties’ (Armstrong 1997, 80). If one takes this view, then what are properties and how are they identified? One might suggest that each property has a unique intrinsic qualitative nature known as a quiddity.

Some philosophers have complained that quiddities are obscure entities, distinguished by brute, unanalysable qualitative differences between them. Moreover, they imply a primitive account of transworld identity for properties; that is to say that what makes an entity the same property in different situations is nothing to do with the nomological, causal or other theoretical role that it plays, but simply to do with it having or being the same quiddity (Black 2000). A property Q which makes things appear blue to the human eye in normal light in the actual world could make things taste of chocolate in another. What makes property Q be Q in that counterfactual situation is that it has the same quiddity. The primitive qualitative ‘this-ness’ which quiddities impart to properties makes them analogous to haecceities, whatever it is which makes a particular the particular which it is (over and above the properties it instantiates). (See Schaffer 2005 for some disanalogies between quidditism and haecceitism.)

The postulation of quiddities presents epistemic challenges which Lewis (2009) notes, since it is not clear how we are able to acquire knowledge about quiddities if any effect that they could have upon us is associated with a specific quiddity only contingently. Furthermore, one might recall the parsimony argument of the previous section, presented in favour of forms of property structuralism: science does not appear to require the postulation of quiddities and can deal with properties entirely in terms of their causal or nomological role. If we do not need to postulate quiddities, why bother?

The supporter of quiddities has at least three responses available here as well as another way of side-stepping the worst of the criticism without reconciling with the structuralist. The first response is the most direct, arguing that we do have epistemic access to the qualitative nature of properties in our conscious experience (Heil 2003, who does not support a quiddistic conception of properties but one in which properties are both essentially causal and qualitative). The main difficulties for this response is to maintain the analogy between qualia and quiddities, and to argue that our conscious experience is broad enough to support a general argument for the existence of quiddities of properties which do not appear to us in conscious experience.

Secondly, one might argue that although quiddities are obscure when considered to be distinct, or partially distinct, entities from the properties which they individuate, they are not so obscure when regarded as being the properties themselves (Locke 2012). This latter conception of properties does not treat them as having internal qualitative natures in virtue of which they are individuated but as being those natures; in this view, properties are individuated in a primitive way simply by being numerically either the same property or a different one. Although this alternative conception gets rid of quiddities, and so placates the proponent of the parsimony argument, it does not advance our understanding of the individuation of properties beyond there being primitive qualitative differences between them.

The third response could take the form of a tu quoque argument against the supporters of a structuralist conception of properties, since there are epistemic challenges for them too; even if we identify and individuate properties in virtue of their causal roles, it is not obvious that empirical investigation will permit us to determine which properties exist (Allen 2002). Finally, one could argue that we do not need to accept quidditism in order to treat the causal roles of properties as being contingent, since there could be counterparts of actual, world-bound properties which play a different nomological or causal role. (See Black 2000; Hawthorne 2001; and Schaffer 2005 (who does not recommend this position).)

3. Which Properties Are There?

a. Families of Properties

There are not only many different properties, but many different families of properties: moral properties, such as good and bad; mathematical ones, such as being prime or being a convergent series; aesthetic ones, such as being beautiful; psychological ones, such as believing in poltergeists or wanting a drink; properties from the social sciences; and properties from the physical sciences. Every subject area about which we can think or speak about has properties associated with it; and there are perhaps many more besides. This leads to questions about whether all these families of properties exist in the same sense as each other, and whether one family is dependent upon or determined by another. We might also consider how different properties within a family of properties are related. (For a selection of metaphysical distinctions between properties, see Sections 6 and 7.)

Some varieties of properties may be mind- or theory-independent—that is, they would exist whether or not humans (or other conscious beings) had ever existed to discover them—while others might be mind- or theory-dependent. The latter are classifications which depend for their existence at least partially upon the existence of conscious subjects to be the classifiers. One might, for example, consider physical or natural properties to exist mind-independently, and aesthetic properties to be mind-dependent. Another distinction between families of properties might come about due to differences in the entities which instantiate them. For instance, some properties such as mathematical ones might be instantiated by abstract objects, while others are possessed by spatio-temporal entities.

Despite the prima facie differences, one might think that these families of properties are related to one another. Perhaps one family of properties is entirely determined by the existence of another family. For instance, psychological, moral or ethical properties might be entirely determined by (broadly speaking) physical ones by a relation such as supervenience, realisation or grounding. Furthermore, while some accounts of supervenience relate facts rather than properties, properties still play a crucial role as constituents in facts or states of affairs. Mathematical properties might be thought to be determined by logical properties, but in that case the relation of determination is one of logical entailment rather than ontological priority. (See Frege and Russell.)

The question of which families of properties exist mind-independently and which do not, and whether interesting relations exist between families of properties, can be clarified only by examining specific features of the different subject areas associated with them, a much larger task than can be accomplished here. Furthermore, although it makes intuitive sense to divide properties into families such as the physical, the psychological and so on, further philosophical consideration reveals difficulties in clarifying such distinctions and making them philosophically rigorous while retaining an interesting account of the relationship between them. There is, for instance, not much philosophical substance to a distinction between physical properties and mental ones if these families can be defined only in opposition to each other.

Finally, one might be interested in whether some properties within a family are dependent upon others of the same family, making some individual properties more fundamental than others. For example, one might think that all ethical properties are determined by one or two fundamental ones—being good or being just, for instance—or one might maintain that mathematical properties are entirely determined by the properties of natural numbers. Again, it is the task of the different areas of philosophy concerned, such as Moral Philosophy or the Philosophy of Mathematics in these cases, to work out whether these dependencies are viable.

b. Maximalism versus Minimalism

The question of whether some properties are more fundamental than others, in the sense of their determining the existence of other properties, is also of more general metaphysical interest when we overlook the boundaries between different families of properties, since it is related to the question of how many properties there are. Does every possible property exist? Does every predicate pick out a property? Or are a few properties the ‘real’ or genuine ones, with the others which we appear to refer to either being ontologically determined by the genuine ones or being linguistic or conceptual entities?

The answers to these questions lie somewhere on a continuum between minimalism on the one hand, which maintains that a very sparse population of properties exists, to maximalism on the other, which asserts the existence of every possible property (and perhaps even some impossible ones). This contrast between the minimalist and maximalist ends of the continuum is also captured by two conceptions of properties as being sparse and abundant (Lewis 1983a). How we decide which point on this continuum is the most plausible depends in part upon the role we think that properties play in the world and also upon the identity conditions which we think properties have: that is, upon what makes one property the same as or different from another. Furthermore, it may turn out that there are different conceptions of properties in play, intended to fulfil different metaphysical roles, which may be able to coexist alongside each other. Thus, a dualist account of properties is also a possibility, or else one might find some way in which the sparse properties and the abundant ones are connected.

The minimalist maintains that the properties which exist are sparse or few in number, a set of properties which (may) determine the behaviour of the rest. From a physicalist standpoint, the properties of fundamental physics are the most promising candidates for being members of the minimal set of sparse properties: properties of quarks, such as charge and spin, as opposed to properties such as being made of angora, liking chocolate or being green. Some sparse properties may exist which we have yet to discover, and which we may never discover; their existence is in no way tied to our language use or what we have the ability to pick out. Although there are few sparse properties, this is a comparative claim: there may still be infinitely many of them if we consider determinate properties such as specific masses—such as having mass of 1.4 grams—to be more fundamental than the determinable property mass.

The maximalist, on the other hand, obeys a principle of plenitude with respect to which properties exist. At the extreme, every property which could exist does exist, although the range of properties which this principle permits depends upon how the ‘could’ in ‘could exist’ is understood. Perhaps one of the most abundant population of properties is postulated by Lewis (and quickly rejected for not being metaphysically useful), who regards qualitative similarity and difference to be determined by membership in sets of actual and possible individuals. In the least discriminating understanding of this account of properties, any set of actual or possible individuals counts as a property, making the collection of properties into a super-abundant transfinite collection which far outruns our ability to name them. But, as Lewis quickly notes, there are simply too many of these properties to be useful—‘If it’s distinctions we want, too much structure is no better than none’ (1983a, 346)—and so he abandons this extreme maximalism in favour of an account of properties which is discussed below.

One could also retain a broad range of possible properties in a different way to Lewis’s sets of possible and actual individuals, perhaps by accepting the existence of transcendent universals, including universals which exist even though they are never instantiated by any actual individual. Such entities might even range beyond the possible to include universals which can never be instantiated, or which could be instantiated only if the laws of logic were non-classical, such as universals corresponding to the properties of being a round square or being a true contradiction.

A prima facie less abundant form of maximalism considers properties to be the semantic values of predicates, thus entities which either determine the meaning of any actual predicate in a human language or determine any meaning which there is or could be. (Whether this second maximal account of properties is only prima facie less abundant than the previous suggestion or is genuinely less abundant depends upon the relationship between possibility and range of meanings, a question which will not be considered here. If the range of possible meanings turns out to be coextensive with the range of possibilities, there may be no difference between these options.)

Even if we restrict ourselves to actual languages, there are many predicates, and so if there are properties which correspond with each of them, we will have a very abundantly populated ontology. How finely grained such a maximalist ontology is depends upon how we distinguish one property from another (or, relatedly, one predicate from another). In this view, there are uncontroversially properties for being red and being not red. But one might wonder whether there is a distinction between being red and not being not red which can be determined only when we have a principle for individuating properties or predicates. If the criterion is syntactic, then the properties being red and not being not red are distinct, but if the criterion is semantic, ‘being red’ and ‘not being not red’ are intuitively predicates picking out the same entity.

One might attempt to hold an intermediate position between maximalism and minimalism. For example, one might argue that which properties exist are those which have explanatory utility, giving us a more abundant population of properties than the minimalist physicalist accepts and a more restricted one than that which maintains that there is a property to determine the meaning of every predicate. But on reflection it is not clear how different this view will turn out to be from the maximalist accounts based upon the semantic values of predicates; after all, predicates exist because we use them in explanatory sentences. One might need a more restrictive account of legitimate explanations in order to whittle the range of properties down.

One advantage of a liberal, maximalist account of properties is epistemic: if properties are based upon predicates of our language, or on the types which we employ in our explanations, then properties are easy to find. Being an aardvark, or being igneous rock, or having influenza, or being a chair are all properties to which we refer and there is no need to go looking for some more fundamental, ‘genuine’ or ‘real’ set of properties to ground the types into which we classify things in our everyday and scientific explanations. However, this epistemic advantage over minimalism may not persist once we move away from the properties we encounter in the natural and human world and consider how we know about the myriad uninstantiated properties which most maximalists endorse, or once we consider the properties which are not instantiated by spatio-temporal objects but by abstract ones. These cases are particularly problematic because, if a version of the causal theory of knowledge is true, it is not clear how we could know about the properties of abstract objects or about properties which are not instantiated in the actual world at all. At this point, maximalism loses the epistemic advantage, although it still promises a useful account of meaning based upon which properties exist.

Second, the maximalist’s ontology of properties has a pragmatic advantage: the maximalist has a greater range of properties at her disposal, whereas the minimalist may discover that a property or a family of properties for which we have predicates does not exist.

Third, the maximalist can explain predicate meaning directly: the properties which exist determine what our predicates mean.

But for the minimalist, these advantages do not mitigate what he regards as the vastly uneconomical, overpopulated ontology of properties which the maximalist endorses. The maximalist accepts properties such as being threatened by a dragon on a Sunday and being fourth placed in the Mushroom Cup on MarioKart in the guise of a gorilla. The former is a property which has never been instantiated, while the latter is one which is only instantiated in a world of computer games, motor races and gorillas. Are we to say that these properties have always existed? If we are not, then they must have come into existence at some point in the history of the universe, in virtue of a more minimal set of properties which forms the basis for all the rest. If we treat these original properties as fundamental, the minimalist argues, then parsimony will be restored.

In addition to rejecting higher-level properties which appear to be superfluous to the causal workings of the universe, such as being within two miles of a burning barn or being fourth placed in the Mushroom Cup on MarioKart in the guise of a gorilla, some minimalists also adhere to a Principle of Instantiation and reject all alien properties which are never instantiated in the actual spatio-temporal world. Alien properties, such as being a perfect circle or being threatened by a dragon on a Sunday, are rejected in favour of treating them as conceptual or ideal entities which are mind-dependent.

Minimalists disagree about how minimal the set of sparse properties should be, with some physicalist minimalists accepting only the properties of fundamental physics (whatever they turn out to be). However, if we restrict properties to this extent, we are left with the question of what a great many things which we thought were properties actually are. If being water or being square, being green or being a mouse are not properties, then they must be something else, since they form such a central position in our worldview that eliminating them entirely from the ontology is out of the question. It does not seem plausible to treat them in the same way that Armstrong does with alien properties and to maintain that they are mind-dependent or ideal.

At this point, it seems that a compromise is needed. Both minimalism and maximalism are viable in their own right, but as far as explanation goes, they lack precisely what the other can provide. The minimalist’s properties can account for the fundamental nature of reality and perhaps also the causal processes which occur in it, while the maximalist can explain higher level predication and give an account of explanation and predicate meaning. Ideally, the property theorists would like the best of both worlds.

There are two ways in which this compromise can be achieved: first, by a form of dualism about properties which treats sparse and abundant conceptions of properties as different categories of entities (Bealer 1982). There is a sparse population of properties (or ‘qualities’ as Bealer calls them) and an abundant one of concepts, which are not mind-dependent entities in the way in which we often think about concepts, but rather objectively existing entities.

Second, one could accept Lewis’s strategy and give an account of how the sparse properties determine the existence of the abundant ones. According to Lewis (1983a, 1986), there is a fundamental set of sparse, perfectly natural properties which determine the existence of all the other properties by set-theoretic, Boolean combinations. All other properties lie along a continuum, placed according to how simply they are related to the perfectly natural ones. Those which are closely related count as natural properties, with naturalness being a matter of degree which is determined by closeness to perfectly natural properties. If we suppose that the sparse properties are physical ones, then properties such as being green or being a mouse are both natural to some degree or other, as is (to a lesser extent) being fourth placed in the Mushroom Cup on MarioKart in the guise of a gorilla, but eventually naturalness trails off. Being green is more natural than being grue (where ‘grue’ is defined as being green if observed before 2085, otherwise blue) while being grue* is less natural still. (Being grue* is defined as being green if observed before 2030 or blue if observed between 2030-40 or red if observed between 2040-50 or pink if observed between 2050-60 or . . . and so on for 30 disjuncts (Elgin 1995).) The abundant properties exist in virtue of being determined by the sparse natural properties.

The ontological distinction which Lewis marks can also be characterized in other ways. For instance, Armstrong maintains that some universals are genuine ones, with the existence of other universals being determined by them. Such a distinction between perfectly natural sparse properties and the rest is a primitive one, however, and is thus not open to further analysis. If one considers parsimony to be an objective fact about the universe, then it is plausible to accept that some such minimal set of properties exists, but its existence has to be assumed rather than being argued for (McGowan 2002).

4. Problems with Instantiation

A particular is said to instantiate a property P, or to exemplify, bear, have or possess P. In the case of Platonic forms, the particular participates in the form of P-ness which corresponds to or is identified with the property P. One might wonder whether instantiation can be analysed further in order to give us some insight into the relationship between a particular and the properties which it instantiates, but it turns out that this is very difficult to do. In fact, instantiation runs into two major problems: the instantiation regress and problems about whether self-instantiation is possible.

a. The Instantiation Regress

The first problem arises if instantiation is treated as a relation. Presuming that relations are analogous to properties, or are a species of property, then the instantiation relation will behave in a similar way to a property. Let us say that particular b is P. If a relation of instantiation connects b with P, then b instantiates P. But then something must connect b, P and the instantiation relation (let us call it I1), and so there must be another instantiation relation I2 which does this job. However, now the question arises of what connects b, P and I1 with I2, and the answer must be that there is another instantiation relation I3 to do that; and then there must be another relation I4 to connect b, P, I1 and I2 with I3. For each instance of instantiation, we require another relation to bind it to the entities which we already have and so there will never be enough instantiation relations to bind a property P to the particular which has it. It appears that treating instantiation as a relation leads to an infinite regress, and so the instantiation relation is not coherent after all. (The instantiation regress is often associated with a regress suggested by F. H. Bradley (1893) and is thus sometimes known as ‘Bradley’s Regress’.)

There are several ways in which the property theorist might try to avoid this regress. First, she might appeal to the notion of an internal relation: that is, a relation which exists if the entities it relates exist. (Examples of internal relations include x being taller than y or x resembling y. All that is needed for such relations to hold is the existence of the things which they relate, Mount Everest and the Eiger for the former, for instance, or two black kittens for the latter.) However, one cannot say that instantiation is itself an internal relation because the existence of a particular b and a property P is not sufficient to determine that b is P. For example, the existence of a particular cat, Fluffy, and of the property of being white do not on their own guarantee that Fluffy is white; something more is required, in this case that Fluffy instantiates the property of being white. (Even if Fluffy is white, the problem here is that the relation between Fluffy and being white is a contingent one; Fluffy could exist and be black or tabby and so the mere existence of Fluffy and whiteness does not determine the existence of the instantiation relation. Although see Broad 1933, 85.)

David Armstrong argues that, while we cannot do without the first-order instantiation relation between particular and property, we can then treat whatever is required to bind particular, property and instantiation as being an internal matter. In terms of the example of the regress above, the additional instantiation relations, I2, I3 and so on, exist if particular b, property P and I1 exist such that b instantiates1 P. Nothing more is required, and the supposed regress is a cheap logical trick, rather than implying ontological infinitude. Armstrong claims that instantiation is a fundamental universal-like tie which is not open to further analysis.

Armstrong’s response depends strongly upon whether his account of internal relations is a plausible one. Do they provide, as he claims, an ontological free lunch (1989, 56; MacBride 2011, 162–6)? In addition, one might also question whether his solution works for every account of the ontology of properties. Armstrong’s account of instantiation is formulated for immanent universals—entities which are wholly present in each of their instantiations—but it is more difficult to think of instantiation as a fundamental, non-relational tie if it relates a particular to an abstract, transcendent universal, or to a resemblance class of which the particular is a member. If we are to treat instantiation as fundamental, then different accounts of the ontological nature of properties might require their own accounts of instantiation.

Alternatively, the property theorist might challenge the claim that the instantiation regress is vicious (Orilia 2006). If we further analyse the regress outlined above, we either require an infinite number of states of affairs to bind a particular to the property it instantiates, or each state of affairs (each particular’s instantiating a property) requires infinitely many constituents in order to exist (the particular, the property and infinitely many instantiation relations). Orilia distinguishes these as an external and an internal regress respectively, since in the former case the infinitude of additional entities is external to the original state of affairs of b’s being P, while the latter asserts that any state of affairs, such as b is P, does not simply contain b and P but infinitely many instantiation relations besides. Although this may not be what we intuitively expect of the relationship between particulars and the properties they have, one might argue that there is nothing ontologically wrong with such infinitude unless one has already presupposed that the world is finite. After all, we are happy to accept that the real numbers are infinite, such that there are infinitely many numbers between any two real numbers, and so it is not clear why such infinitude cannot occur in the natural world. There is, for instance, debate in the physical sciences about the existence of ‘real’ infinities (see Infinity, Section 4). If one allows that the world is infinitely complex, then the instantiation regress is not vicious, although its consequences for the way the world must be are quite counterintuitive (Allen, 2016, 29–31).

b. The Paradox of Self-Instantiation

It seems plausible to maintain that any property instantiates being a property, and furthermore (if one thinks that properties are abstract objects such as transcendent universals) that the property of being abstract instantiates the property of being abstract. It seems, in such cases, that it is possible for some properties to instantiate themselves and thus that there is such a property as being self-instantiating or a property’s instantiating itself. Moreover, the situation with the Instantiation Regress would be simplified if it were possible for instantiation to instantiate itself. That way, one might argue that the apparently infinite multitude of instantiation relations were in fact instances of the same relation, instantiated over and over again, with different numbers of relata each time on some versions of the regress. However, there is a logical problem with self-instantiation which has led some philosophers to suggest that self-instantiation should not be allowed.

Let us suppose that, for every property of being Q, there is also a negative property of being not Q. If this is the case, then there is a property of being non-self-instantiating or something’s not instantiating itself. But such a property appears to be logically impossible once we consider whether it instantiates itself: if the property of not instantiating itself does not instantiate itself, then it does instantiate not instantiating itself and so it instantiates itself. But if it does instantiate itself, then it is self-instantiating and so it does not instantiate itself. We have a paradox.

Faced with this paradox, one could take the rather extreme measure of banning self-instantiation entirely which would leave us in an implausible situation with respect to ‘properties’ such as being a property, which would not (strictly speaking) be a property. One might mitigate this consequence by introducing a theory of types for properties in addition to banning self-instantiation. Thus, we would have first-order properties which are instantiated by particulars, second-order properties which are instantiated by first-order properties, third-order properties which are instantiated by second-order properties and so on; each nth-order of properties can only be instantiated by the entities of the (n-1)th order. Being a property would then be a shorthand for being a second-order property (a property instantiated by first-order properties), or being a third-order property (a property instantiated by properties of first-order properties) and so on, and these properties do not self-instantiate. However, this hierarchy is perhaps too strict for daily use and conflicts with our intuitive judgments. For example, if a table instantiates the property of being crimson, it also instantiates the property of being red and being a colour; but the property of being crimson also intuitively instantiates being red and being a colour. However, if the theory of types is correct, we have to distinguish the first-order property of the table’s being red from the second-order property of crimson’s being red; different properties are involved in each case if we introduce a hierarchy.

Alternatively, one might solve the problem of self-instantiation by limiting which entities count as genuine properties and accepting a more minimalist position. This response rejects the premise that corresponding to every property Q, there is a property of being not Q which is instantiated just when Q is not. Thus, everything which does not instantiate the property of being red is not thereby not red, and we need not think that the property of not self-instantiating accompanies the property of self-instantiating. The paradox associated with there being a property of self-instantiation need not arise.

5. Categorical and Dispositional Properties

While Plato regarded participation in a form as making something the kind of thing it is, Aristotle also treated such kinds as giving a particular the causal power to do something, the potential to have certain effects. This contrast between understanding properties as qualitative, categorising entities and as dispositional or causally powerful ones survives in contemporary philosophy as the distinction between categorical and dispositional properties. We can conceive of a property such as mass in two contrasting ways: on the one hand, mass is a measure of how much matter a particular is made of; on the other, the mass of a particular determines how much force is required to move it, how much momentum it will have when moving and thus what will happen if it hits something else, and how much energy will be produced if the mass were to be destroyed.

Some philosophers argue that all dispositional properties are dependent upon categorical ones (Armstrong 1999; Lewis 1979, 1986; Schaffer 2005); others argue that all properties are dispositional and have their causal power necessarily or essentially (Cartwright 1989; Mumford 1998, 2004; Bird 2007; Marmadoro 2010a); some accept that a mixture of categorical and dispositional properties exist (Ellis 2000, 2001; Molnar 2003); and still others contend that all properties have a dispositional and a categorical aspect (Schroer 2013) or are both categorical and dispositional (Heil 2003, 2012). Dispositional properties, properties which have their causal roles essentially, are also known as dispositions, powers, causal powers and potentialities; however, it is important to note that these terms are not always used interchangeably.

a. Do Dispositional Properties Depend upon Categorical Ones?

There are three primary motivations for the view that all dispositional properties must depend somehow upon categorical ones: first, dispositional properties are regarded as epistemologically suspect, since we cannot experience a dispositional property as such. Second, dispositional properties are considered to be ontologically suspect. Third, it is thought that we do not need to think of dispositions or dispositional properties as being an ontologically independent category of entities because statements about the dispositional properties an individual instantiates can be analysed as conditional statements about the categorical properties which that individual instantiates, or else we can give an ontological account of how dispositional properties depend upon categorical ones. These issues are considered in turn.

The first motivation is more common within the empiricist tradition, but not exclusive to it. To say that a particular has a disposition or a causal power to do something does not entail that the causal power is actually manifested or that the effect is produced, since the particular may not be in the appropriate conditions for the effect to occur. For instance, although a particular sugar cube is soluble, such a disposition may never be manifested if the sugar cube is never near water; its being soluble ensures that it could dissolve, that it would were the circumstances to be right, and perhaps also that it must do so (although dispositionalists disagree about whether a causal power manifests itself as a matter of necessity in the appropriate circumstances). Thus, accepting the existence of irreducible dispositional properties involves accepting the existence of irreducible modality in nature, perhaps amounting to natural necessity, which makes each property produce its respective effects. As Hume pointed out, such natural necessity cannot be detected by experience, since we can only experience what is actually the case, and so strict empiricists have rejected irreducible dispositional properties on this basis. Some of those who think that at least some dispositional properties are irreducible to categorical ones accept this view about our experience and argue that we have other reasons to accept natural necessity, while others argue that we can experience irreducible modality in nature after all, perhaps through our own intentions being dispositional (Mumford and Anjum, 2011).

The second ontological objection to irreducible dispositional properties is raised by Armstrong (1997, 79) who argues that accepting dispositional properties commits one to Meinongianism. As noted above, any particular instantiation of a property which is the power to M may never manifest M; however, such entities are still construed as being powers to do M and are often individuated in virtue of their manifestations. For example, solubility is the power to dissolve, combustibility is the power to burn, and so on. In committing ourselves to the existence of unmanifested dispositions, the objector argues, we are also committing ourselves to the being (in some sense or other) of their manifestations, a range of entities which do not exist. In most cases, dispositional properties are constituted by relations between instantiated powers and a non-actual manifestation, which Armstrong argues is both ontologically uneconomical and absurd, reminiscent of the ontological commitment attributed to Alexius Meinong by Bertrand Russell (1905). On this basis, Armstrong concludes, essentially dispositional properties should be rejected. (See Mumford 2004, 192–5; Handfield 2005 452–461; and Bird 2007, 105–111 for responses.)

The third objection against irreducible dispositions is that we do not need to talk about dispositions and dispositional properties in the first place because we can translate disposition ascriptions into non-dispositional language. To that end, the conditional analysis of dispositions was first suggested by Carnap (1928, 1936–7), whose own account failed due to the fact that he insisted on analysing dispositions as truth-functional material conditionals. In Carnap’s proposal, we could analyse the dispositional predicate ‘is combustible’ as follows:

(C)  For any object o, if o is lit or otherwise ignited, o is combustible if and only if o burns.

The disadvantage of this account is that it provides a criterion to apply the predicate ‘is combustible’ only for objects which are ignited and says nothing about those objects which are not near any source of ignition. However, we intuitively want to say that the piece of paper on my desk is combustible and the water in the glass is not, whether or not these items are ever ignited. Carnap’s simple analysis leaves out the crucial aspect of dispositions and dispositional properties: the disposition or causal power to have a certain effect is present even when the disposition is not active and has no chance of being triggered because the requisite conditions do not obtain.

The failure of Carnap’s attempt to eliminate dispositional language led to more sophisticated accounts which attempt to analyse an object’s possession of a disposition in terms of subjunctive or counterfactual conditionals: that is, by capturing what the object would do were certain conditions to obtain (whether or not they do actually obtain). The most famous of these is the Simple Conditional Analysis which analyses disposition ascriptions as follows:

(CA) An object o is disposed to manifest M in conditions C if and only if o would M if C obtained.

(Ryle 1949; Goodman 1954; Quine 1960)

While this analysis is an improvement on Carnap’s attempt, there are several well-known counterexamples to it. First, the stimulus conditions may obtain and the disposition not manifest because the effect is masked. For instance, the paper is combustible because it would light were certain stimulus conditions to obtain (were it to be in contact with a source of ignition), but the disposition will not manifest if the atmosphere around it contains no oxygen; the lack of oxygen will mask its combustibility. Second, we can imagine a situation in which the presence of the conditions required for the disposition to manifest removes the disposition somehow; in our current example, perhaps the presence of a source of ignition also causes the paper to be soaked by water, making it, while wet at least, no longer combustible. A disposition where the presence of the requisite triggering conditions results in an object’s either acquiring or losing a disposition is known as a finkish disposition, following Martin (1994). Third, we can find examples in which the effect of a disposition is mimicked when the triggering conditions occur, even though the disposition is not present. For instance, consider Lewis’s famous Hater of Styrofoam (1997), who breaks Styrofoam containers each time they are struck, giving the impression that such containers are fragile when they are not. Such examples show that (CA) can be true while intuitively the dispositional predicate ‘is fragile’ should not be ascribed to the object; the conditional can be true when the disposition is mimicked.

Difficulties with the Simple Conditional Analysis have led to refinements in this approach (Prior 1985; Lewis 1997; Manley and Wasserman 2008), although the Simple Conditional Analysis still has defenders who challenge the counterexamples of finks, masking and mimicking (Choi 2008). However, the complexities of eliminating dispositional ascriptions by analysing them as conditionals have encouraged many contemporary philosophers to take another look at the plausibility of treating dispositional properties more realistically, either as entities which depend for their existence on categorical properties and other entities, or as an independent ontological category.

b. Dispositional Properties from Categorical Ones

Armstrong takes a minimally realist attitude to dispositions: the dispositions which an individual has to act in this way or that are entirely determined by the categorical properties they instantiate and the laws of nature which govern them. Although such dispositions are real, they are a derived category of entities, not a fundamental one, since they are ontologically dependent upon categorical properties and laws. For Armstrong (1983), laws of nature are necessary connections holding between universals (which, as was noted above, Armstrong considers to be the ontological basis of properties) but these necessary connections can vary across different possible situations. Although in the actual world it is true that the instantiation of an F necessitates the instantiation of G, this necessary connection need not hold in counterfactual situations; in another possible situation, F may necessitate the instantiation of H instead of G. Thus, what a property does is determined by which laws obtain in the world in which it is instantiated, not by that property’s intrinsic nature. In Armstrong’s view, categorical properties and laws of nature are more fundamental than the dispositions they confer, and the causal disposition a property has is contingent upon what the laws of nature are in the world in which it is instantiated. Thus, what a property has the power to do can vary in different possible situations. (See Contessa 2015 for a criticism of this view.)

c. Dispositional versus Categorical Properties

Central to arguments about whether we should conceive of properties as categorical or dispositional are clashing intuitions about whether it is plausible for a property P with the causal power to do C1 in the actual world to have the power to do C2 in another possible world w. If so, and if this indicates a genuine possibility, then property P does not have its causal power as a matter of necessity; if this is not possible, then properties do have their causal roles necessarily (or because of their essential nature, if this is different) and are thus dispositional. For instance, in the actual world, particulars with like charges—such as two electrons instantiating negative charge—repel each other. But, is it possible that like-charged particulars could attract each one other? The supporter of categorical properties says ‘yes’ whereas someone who favours dispositional properties says this is not possible. The supporter of dispositional properties maintains that if there were a property which could make electrons attract, it would not be charge but a distinct property, schmarge (say). Since schmarge does not exist in the actual world it is an alien dispositional property, and rather than accept existence of alien properties, some dispositionalists prefer to deny the possibility of electrons attracting.

The empiricist’s suspicion of the natural necessity inherent in dispositional properties is largely based upon an epistemic argument: how can we justify believing that such natural necessity exists, especially since we cannot find out about it through experience? However, the dispositionalist employs a converse epistemic argument which notes that the supporter of categorical properties also postulates entities which lie outside our epistemic grasp: if a property P can have different causal powers C1 and C2 in different possible situations, then the property itself must have a purely qualitative nature or quiddity which is only contingently associated with anything which P can do. Moreover, one and the same causal power C1 can be associated with distinct categorical properties P and Q, and so it is not clear how we determine that one property is being instantiated rather than another. It is plausible to think that we have experiential access to properties only via the effects which they have on us, but this makes the nature of quiddities as mysterious as natural necessity (especially from an empiricist perspective).

d. Explanatory Uses for Dispositional Properties in Metaphysics: Laws and Modality

These arguments are taken to establish the position that at least some properties are dispositional rather than categorical. This position, it is argued, has significant explanatory advantages for metaphysics considered more broadly. First, if properties essentially or necessarily involve having a specific causal role, then the causal relations between properties remain stable and the properties of an object bring about certain effects as a matter of necessity. These fixed relations between properties permit an account of causal laws as derived entities, which hold in virtue of dispositional properties and which hold as a matter of necessity (Mumford 2004). This, it is claimed, is respectively more coherent or more parsimonious than the accounts of laws available with an ontology of categorical properties which treat laws either as simply being contingent regularities holding in virtue of the distribution of properties in a world (Lewis 1973, 1994) or else require the postulation of second-order relations holding between properties or universals to act as laws of nature which govern what those properties do (Armstrong 1983).

Second, some supporters of a dispositional conception of properties argue that the essential, natural modality which such entities involve can be used to give a naturalistic account of possibility and necessity (Jacobs 2010; Borghini and Williams 2008; Vetter 2015). The dispositional properties which an individual instantiates determine what that object could do, and also what it must do in certain circumstances, thereby providing truthmakers for modal statements about that individual. Thus, the truth of statements such as ‘This coal could burn’ or ‘Hillary Clinton could be a physicist’ are made true by the dispositional properties which these individuals instantiate or by properties which actually instantiated dispositional properties that have the power to instantiate. This dispositionalist account of modality has, according to its supporters, the resources to provide an account of modality without recourse to abstract objects or to possible worlds. Furthermore, since some dispositionalists restrict what is possible to what is possible given the dispositional properties which exist, have existed and will exist in the actual world, this account of modality is an actualist one; it does not require ontological commitment to the existence of merely possible entities.

Although the formulation of these dispositionalist accounts of modality is still in the early stages, they already face some significant challenges. The primary difficulty concerns whether an ontology of actually instantiated dispositional properties can provide a broad enough modal range to match our common-sense intuitions about what is possible. For instance, logical and mathematical truths appear to be necessarily true, but we do not readily think of them as being made true by actual dispositional properties or causal powers. ‘2 + 2 = 4’ is always true, and intuitively could not be false, but it is not obvious what in the world makes it that way, nor whether it is coherent to say that everything has the disposition to make such statements true. The dispositionalist has given an account of logical and mathematical necessities in terms of dispositional properties to permit an alternative account of them. (See Vetter 2015.)

Furthermore, claims such as ‘Dinosaurs could have developed digital technology’ or ‘If Coulomb’s Law is false, these two proximate negative charges would not repel’ present difficulties: the first because it is an unactualised possibility which seems very unlikely given the dispositional properties instantiated now or in the past, and the second because it is a counterlegal possibility, a possibility which concerns a situation which could only occur were the laws of nature in the actual world to be false. The dispositionalist can deal with the former type of example by allowing that possibilities are not only grounded by which dispositional properties are actually instantiated, but also by the dispositional properties which these actually instantiated properties could produce, and the ones which these latter, uninstantiated properties could produce, and so on. Thus, it does not matter that no dinosaur actually had the power to invent digital technology, nor that nothing actually has the power to cure cancer, because the possibility rests on something existing (or having existed) which has the power to produce the power to do so.

On the other hand, examples of counterlegal possibilities have proved a more intransigent problem for dispositionalist modality. If, as was noted above, the dispositionalist thinks of natural laws as being entirely determined by the dispositional properties or causal powers which the world instantiates, the actual dispositional properties instantiated in the world cannot also determine possibilities which run counter to those laws. It makes no sense to imagine that the world could have been exactly like the actual one and yet the laws of nature be different. If the dispositionalist wants truthmakers for counterlegal possibilities, then she must be committed to the existence of alien causal powers, ones such as schmarge, which are uninstantiated in the actual world. However, if the dispositionalist makes this move, then her theory has lost the advantage that it claimed over other theories of modality, since it is now committed to the existence of possibilia or abstract objects in order to ground modality. Given this, most dispositionalists restrict what is possible to what is possible given the causal powers which exist, have existed or will exist in the actual world, thus denying possibilities which could occur only if the actual laws of nature were false. In doing so, they accept that some intuitively plausible possibilities, such as ‘It is possible that this one kilogram of gold will not fall towards the Earth when it is unsupported’, are not genuine possibilities at all; the gold might not fall were the universal law of gravitation not to hold, but in this version of actualist dispositionalism, this law holds necessarily; situations in which there is no gravity are not genuinely possible. (Although see Borghini and Williams 2008 and Vetter 2015, who suggest that actual powers or potentialities might be able determine possibilities which go beyond those permitted by the current laws of nature.)

Not all dispositionalists concur with the use of their ontology to ground necessity and possibility in this way. Mumford and Anjum (2011) have suggested an alternative account which argues that dispositions act with a sui generis modality—dispositional modality—which is weaker than necessity and yet stronger than contingency.

e. Problems with Pan-Dispositionalism

Pan-dispositionalism—the view that all properties are dispositional ones—faces several challenges to its coherence. First, there is the complaint that even among the natural properties, some properties are obviously not causal powers: properties such as being a cube or being red are not obviously ones which are essentially causal. The pan-dispositionalist’s answer is usually that such properties are dispositional after all: colours are properties with the power to cause certain wavelengths of light to be reflected, or to cause a specific reaction in ourselves and other animals, and being a cube is associated with various effects such as not being able to roll, being stackable, making a certain imprint in soft clay, and so on. The dispositionalist might add that such properties are continuously manifesting (Hüttemann 2013), which gives the appearance of there being a distinct set of categorical properties.

Second, the pan-dispositionalist ontology is vulnerable to the ‘always packing and never travelling’ objections: dispositional properties are potentialities to have certain effects, but if their manifestations consist in the production of more dispositional properties, the manifestation of the potential of a power consists in the production of more potentialities. (See Molnar 2003, 11.2 for variants of this problem.) This is an ontology of potentialities which ‘never passes from potency to act’ (Armstrong 2004). The critic of pan-dispositionalism argues that such powers must be supplemented by categorical properties to give the world actuality or being, or in order that actual events occur, rather than just the passing of potencies around. For instance, Heil argues that the world cannot be one in which properties are nothing more than contributions to what their bearers have the power to do because such bearers would be indistinguishable from empty space; there would be doing but no being, and this, Heil urges, does not make sense because there would be nothing to do anything at all. According to Heil, a purely dispositionalist ontology would be equivalent to an empty universe.

This objection could be met by accepting a theory in which properties are both qualitative and dispositional (Heil 2003, 2012; Schroer 2013), by permitting continuously manifesting dispositional properties which are analogous to categorical ones, or else by denying the need for a fundamental level (Schaffer 2003). However, Mumford (2004, 174–5) implies that these responses are not required, since the objection is based upon a misunderstanding of what being an essentially dispositional property or power involves, treating these entities as actual only in virtue of their producing actual manifestations. As Mumford argues, being potent (as these entities are) is a way of being and so it is wrong to think of pure powers as being mere potentialities in the first place.

Despite these difficulties in the formulation of a pan-dispositionalist ontology, it is thought by its supporters to have significant explanatory advantages over its rival which treats properties as categorical. The primary reasons for this are that dispositionalists can invoke the irreducible modality in nature in order to explain the necessity of causation and natural laws (Mumford 2004), or to ground an actualist account of modality which permits us to explain what is necessary and what is possible in terms of actually existing properties (Jacobs 2010; Borghini and Williams 2008; Vetter 2015).

6. Properties and Natural Kinds

The world appears to contain kinds of stuff as a matter of natural fact: water, elephants, gold, carbon dioxide, humans, red dwarf stars and so on. We can class these as ‘natural kinds’ and they are especially useful for making inductive inferences to be used for prediction and explanation. What exactly is the relationship between these kinds and properties? Some philosophers, with an exceptionally relaxed view of kinds (or a minimalist view of properties), argue that kinds and properties coincide: that is, that something’s being of a certain kind K simply involves the instantiation of a property and vice versa. However, although it is intuitively plausible to associate kinds with properties in some way, there seem to be more properties than there are kinds. Carbon, elephants, or stars each behave in a variety of ways in virtue of belonging to their respective kinds, while red things, or those which have a mass of 1.1 grams, display a much more restricted range of causal behaviour. Nevertheless, one might still think that this difference is a difference of degree (Bird 2014, 2).

Furthermore, if we do not restrict ourselves to what might be considered natural properties, the mismatch between properties and kinds is magnified. If we are trying to characterize what makes something a natural kind, there are plenty of properties—especially in an abundant conception of properties—which do not seem to be very natural. If it is contentious to consider green things as forming a kind, it seems even more so to include grue ones, or those which instantiate properties such as being on the eighth page of the first novel I read this year, being married to an ice-hockey fan, or being next to a marmoset. In view of this problem, one can either declare that the sharing of such properties does not mark out individuals as a kind or that there are some kinds which are non-natural ones. If one chooses the latter option, there may be further questions about how individuals of such non-natural kinds relate to the properties which they instantiate.

The simplest explication of a natural kind is that the individuals which belong to it share a property or a collection of properties (with some properties being excluded, as noted above). A subset of natural properties, or comparatively more natural properties if one prefers Lewis’s account of property naturalness, determines which natural kinds there are. In this view, natural kinds would be a derivative category and one might choose to dispense with them entirely in favour of the properties or collections of properties which are essential to each individual of the kind. In this view, the kind water is coextensive with having the property of being H20; and we might call the latter the essence of water.

However, this essentialist view is difficult to sustain in the case of many paradigmatic examples of natural kinds, such as species. It is impossible to characterize exactly which properties determine that an individual tiger is a member of the kind tiger, in the sense of giving the properties which are necessary and sufficient for membership of the kind. Furthermore, because species evolve over time, there is not a good reason for thinking that the failure to find a set of properties which are necessary and sufficient for kind membership is an epistemological problem rather than an ontological one. The essentialist account of kinds does not easily account for kinds which appear to be able to change their natures.

Richard Boyd has suggested a characterisation of kinds which might be able to account for such changes in terms of the properties which exist (Boyd 1991, 1999; Millikan 1999). He argues that an entity is a natural kind in virtue of its being a cluster of properties which are commonly instantiated in the same individual, where such clusters are formed and maintained by a homeostatic mechanism. Such mechanisms are either intrinsic to the property cluster because some collections of properties are internally more stable than others, or they are extrinsic and the property cluster is maintained in a fairly stable state by the environment or some other causal mechanism. No property of the cluster need be necessary to the kind, nor need there be any property which is sufficient for kind membership, which allows for the existence of kinds which lack essences. Kinds can change because their individual members lose or gain a property, or because the extension of the kind changes such that novel individuals are included within it. Nevertheless, Boyd argues, the clustering occurs because such changes from a stable cluster have a lower chance of persisting. Thus, we can explain why the members of a species maintain the properties which they do while their environment remains stable and why they evolve as the environment changes when mutations may have a greater chance of survival.

7. Different Types of Properties

There are several useful distinctions between different types of properties. Often these are made to mark a metaphysical distinction between them, to draw attention to the fact that these different types of properties behave in significantly different ways in the same circumstances, or in order to treat them theoretically in different ways. The distinction between categorical and dispositional properties is one such distinction, which has been discussed at length above. Others are considered much more briefly in this section. In addition, the table at the end of this section includes definitions and examples of other types of properties.

a. Intrinsic and Extrinsic Properties

There is a kiwi fruit in my fruit bowl which has a huge variety of properties. It is (roughly) ellipsoid, brown, slightly hairy, bright green and white inside, it has black seeds, it is sweet, soft, contains about 10g sugar and 1g protein, weighs 63 grams and is 5cm in diameter. It is lying next to an over-ripe pear, was grown in New Zealand, is partially obscured by the electricity bill, has travelled farther than I have in the last year, is not Hilary Clinton, it has no beliefs about classical logic, and is being used in a philosophical example.

Intuitively, the properties listed in the former sentence are more important than those in the latter: the difference between the kiwi fruit and the pear is not marked by the fact that one was grown in New Zealand and the other was not (although that happens to be true), and because neither of them are Hilary Clinton and both are partially obscured by the electricity bill, those properties cannot be what mark the difference either. It would make no real difference to the kiwi fruit or its continued existence if the bill were moved from on top of it, but it will change if I get a knife and slice it in half. Not only do the properties in the former set seem to be what determine the real difference between the kiwi fruit and other things in the world, those properties are more likely to be causally efficacious: the kiwi fruit is nutritious because of them, will roll when put on a slope, and can be used to knock over small objects if your aim is good.

It would be philosophically useful to draw a distinction between the properties which (roughly speaking) a particular has in virtue of itself, its own nature, and those which it has due to its relations with other things: that is, those which are intrinsic properties and the extrinsic ones. But can we draw a principled distinction between them? Several bases for such a distinction have been suggested: some attempt to be purely logical and to avoid any commitment to a particular metaphysical position, whereas others can be classed as metaphysical criteria because their plausibility requires that one make certain assumptions about the way the world is.

It is worth noting that some properties can be intrinsic when instantiated by some individuals and extrinsic when instantiated by others. These properties are locally intrinsic or extrinsic. For instance, consider the properties being such that a dog exists or becoming nervous when encountering a dog. In either case, these properties will be extrinsic when instantiated by anything which is not a dog, but intrinsic when instantiated by a dog, thus they are locally intrinsic properties. In what follows, the use of ‘intrinsic’ is confined to properties which are intrinsic when instantiated by any individual.

Lewis suggests that his ontologically elite perfectly natural properties are good candidates to determine intrinsicality. These properties, as we saw above (3b), are the most fundamental ones and ground the existence of other properties which are natural as a matter of degree. Perfectly natural properties determine the objective similarity and difference in the world, and thereby determine whether particulars are duplicates of each other or not. Intrinsic properties are just those properties which duplicates must share. Particulars can be duplicates of each other and differ in extrinsic properties.

However, accepting this criterion depends upon accepting Lewis’s claim that there is a set of such fundamental properties and, secondly, that those properties are intrinsic ones. Neither of these claims are without their detractors. The first claim is vulnerable to criticism from both maximalists about properties and those who deny the existence of a fundamental level to reality. Lewis’s second claim that all fundamental properties are intrinsic has been challenged on the grounds that some seemingly fundamental physical properties such as gravitational mass or spin might require the existence of other particulars to be instantiated. (See Bauer 2011; Allen 2018.) Moreover, even if one accepts Lewis’s minimalist metaphysical account of what the world contains (or something fairly close to it, such as Armstrong’s genuine universals), one might worry that ‘intrinsicality’ has been very closely inter-defined with ‘duplicate’ in this case: duplicates share all their intrinsic properties, while intrinsic properties are those shared between duplicates. Even if this criterion is correct, it does not go a long way towards explaining what an intrinsic property is.

Jaegwon Kim (1982) suggests that we can characterize the distinction in terms of loneliness: intrinsic properties are the properties a particular would have even if nothing else existed in the world. (This criterion requires only that no other contingently existing objects exist and does not exclude necessarily existing particulars, if there are any, such as numbers.) However, although an object’s being lonely is intuitively an extrinsic property, since being lonely depends for its instantiation on the absence of contingently existing objects, it turns out to be an intrinsic property in Kim’s criterion (Lewis 1983b, 198–9). Langton and Lewis (1998) suggest amending Kim’s criterion: an intrinsic property is one whose instantiation is independent of loneliness and accompaniment; that is, it is a property which can be possessed or lacked by a particular regardless of whether or not any distinct, contingently existing objects exist. However, this criterion is still not adequate, since some properties such as being spherical and lonely or non-spherical and accompanied turn out to be independent of loneliness and accompaniment, and thereby would count as being intrinsic. Langton and Lewis rule these disjunctive properties out by fiat, by characterising disjunctive properties as those which have disjuncts which are more natural then they are. (Recall Lewis’s account of naturalness in 3b above.) Accordingly, an intrinsic property is one which is independent of loneliness and accompaniment, and also is neither a disjunctive property nor the negation of a disjunctive property. As with Lewis’s original criterion based on duplication (which he does not reject in favour of the new criterion), Langton and Lewis’s criterion is a metaphysical one because it requires commitment to some kind of property hierarchy.

One might also be concerned about the scope of Langton and Lewis’s criterion since they specifically state that their criterion omits properties which involve particular entities, which they call impure properties, such as being Nelson Mandela or being more than fifty kilometres from Juba. In addition, the criterion makes all indiscriminately necessary properties—such as being such that 2 + 3 = 5—intrinsic as long as they are not disjunctive. (Lewis’s original duplication account, on the other hand, treats all indiscriminately necessary properties as intrinsic.) If this is the case, each particular has infinitely many more intrinsic properties that we would usually be inclined to attribute to it. One could exclude indiscriminately necessary properties from the criterion as well as impure properties, but the consequence of that would be an even less general criterion than before. In response, some philosophers have called for a more general criterion to distinguish between intrinsic and extrinsic properties which is able to take all properties into account.

One attempt to distinguish intrinsic and extrinsic properties on purely logical grounds is by defining extrinsicality. The instantiation of an extrinsic property by an individual consists in its bearing certain relations to at least one distinct individual, while properties which do not do this are intrinsic. We can call the former d-relational properties and maintain that properties which are not d-relational are intrinsic (Francescotti 1999, Harris 2010, 467). There are drawbacks to this account as well, however. First, it is not obvious that one can determine what counts as a ‘distinct individual’ without recourse to intrinsic and extrinsic properties, or else by introducing a metaphysical element into the criterion. If one individual’s being distinct from another requires their not having intrinsic properties in common, then we have made no progress. Second, one might be concerned about how we should deal with d-relations to abstract objects. If an individual can be d-related to abstract objects, then some properties turn out to be extrinsic which seem intuitively to be intrinsic: for instance, the sugar’s weighing 1 kilogram is extrinsic if 1 is an abstract object; in fact, all measurement properties would turn out to be extrinsic properties. On the other hand, if we accept that an individual’s relations to abstract objects cannot make the properties it instantiates d-relational, then indiscriminately necessary properties such as being such that 37 exists all turn out to be intrinsic, and this is another outcome we might hope to avoid.

As these and other suggested criteria have all turned out to be unsatisfactory, some philosophers have suggested that our intuitions about intrinsic and extrinsic properties are unstable and involve more than one division between properties. In this vein, Marshall (2016) suggests that intrinsicality covers three related types of properties: interior properties associated with an individual’s internal nature; properties preserved in duplication; and local properties which are necessarily ascribed to an individual on the basis of how it and its parts are. These, it is argued, play different roles in metaphysical explanation.

b. Accidental and Essential Properties

An individual can survive the loss of some properties and still retain its identity, while other properties are essential to it; were it to lose one of these latter properties it would no longer be the type of particular that it is. We can call the former properties accidental properties and the latter essential ones. For example, a dog is usually larger than a rabbit, has four legs, is domesticated and can swim; it also has a DNA profile similar to that of other dogs and has parents who are also dogs. A particular dog could lose a limb or be unable to swim, and it would still count as being a dog. But were an animal not to have dogs for parents, we would be unlikely to consider it to be a dog. (This example is employed for simplicity, but as noted above in Section 6, species are not really good examples of this distinction, since it is not obvious that there are properties which are essential to being a certain species.) Similarly, it is essential to a piece of gold that it has atomic number 79, but accidental that it is liquid or that it weighs two grams. The former essential property is shared by everything which counts as gold, whereas the latter properties are instantiated by the particular qua gold as a matter of contingent fact.

What is being given here is a modal characterisation of the distinction between accidental and essential properties: the former are those which a particular could lack while still being of the broader type that it is, while if something lacked its essential properties it would cease to exist (at least as the type of thing which it is). To put the point another way, a particular cannot lack its essential properties. Essentialism is the view that at least some particulars have essential properties.

At first glance, the modal characterisation of the distinction between accidental and essential properties fits well with our common-sense intuitions; the properties without which an individual could not exist seem intuitively to capture the essence of that individual. But this characterisation has been challenged because on closer inspection it turns out to classify a range of properties as essential which do not contribute to making a particular the kind of thing that it is. For instance, in this characterisation of the distinction, essential properties will turn out to include all of what we call indiscriminately necessary properties. These are properties which everything has, such as being such that 37 is prime number or being such that the ratio of the circumference to the diameter of a circle is Π. Since these properties are instantiated by everything, they do not intuitively contribute to making each individual what it is; they are not intuitively part of its essence. Furthermore, as Kit Fine (1994) pointed out, each individual has more specific properties necessarily which do not appear to determine that individual’s essential nature. For example, Socrates has the property of being the sole element of the singleton set containing Socrates (that is, being the sole member of {Socrates}), but that property is not, one would think, an essential property of Socrates the man. Fine argues that these examples are enough for us to abandon the modal characterisation of the distinction for an alternative.

In view of this problem, amended accounts have been sought, including Fine’s own suggestion which is that essential properties contribute to the definition of an object, or amended modal criteria which attempt to rule out the problematic properties on the grounds that they are not intrinsic to the individuals in question (Denby 2014), are not locally necessary to the individuals (Correia 2007), or are not sparse properties (Wildman 2013, Cowling 2013). (See also Zalta 2006 for an alternative approach.) As with the attempts to distinguish intrinsic from extrinsic properties, there is a danger of close inter-definition here, and consequently one of circularity: it may not be possible to characterise the intrinsic-extrinsic distinction (say) without a grasp upon the essential-accidental distinction or the distinction between sparse and abundant properties, and vice versa, making the resulting explanations quite impoverished. From an ontological point of view, however, such inter-definition is acceptable but one might feel justified in following Lewis and simply assuming that the characteristics of intrinsicality and sparseness go together, alongside being an essential property when such properties are present.

c. Monadic and Polyadic Properties

Thus far, this article has been primarily concerned with properties which, on each instantiation, are instantiated by one individual: properties such as being blue, being a cube, being an electron, or being a dog. These are monadic properties. However, many properties appear to require more than one individual to be instantiated: Edgar is friends with Julia, the cat is inside the box, Amir is in between Julia and Edgar, Julia is in the same class as Amir and Marie, and 2 is a common factor of 8, 10 and 12. These properties are more commonly known as relations, since they determine how one thing (or more) stands to others. But because they usually require more than one individual to be instantiated (or else, they relate one individual to itself), they are also known as polyadic properties, with their adicity capturing how many individuals are required to instantiate the property: Edgar is friends with Julia is the instantiation of a dyadic property, while being in between is a triadic property instantiated by Amir, Julia and Edgar, and so on.

The predicates of our natural languages allow for many cases in which the number of argument places of a predicate (its degree) is variable: ‘is friends with’ is two-place in the example above, but as ‘are friends with each other’ it could be three-place, four-place, five-place or more; similarly, ‘being in the same class as’ or ‘being a common factor of’ can vary in degree. In most formal logic, the degree of a predicate is fixed (for an exception, see Orilia 2000), but if we use natural, rather than formal, language as a guide to ontology, we might be tempted to think that the properties which correspond to these predicates can vary in their adicity. These are variably polyadic or multigrade properties which admit of a different number of participants in different circumstances.

We can distinguish internal relations from external ones (although philosophers disagree about what exactly they mean by ‘internal relation’). Briefly put, an internal relation is a relation which exists if its relata do. For instance, Ben Nevis is taller than Snowdon, but nothing more is needed for the is taller than relation holding between them than the existence of the two mountains at the heights which they actually are. On the other hand, being friends with each other is an external relation: the mere existence of Edgar and Julia is not sufficient to ensure that they are friends as they might never meet or may not get on; the relation of their being friends with each other exists in addition to the existence of its relata.

Internal relations (and hence the distinction between internal and external relations) are characterised in slightly different ways. For instance, Armstrong maintains that a relation is internal if its existence is necessitated by the intrinsic natures of its relata (1997, 87–9). For instance, in the case of Ben Nevis and Snowdon, their intrinsic properties of being the height that they are necessitates the existence of the relation of Ben Nevis being taller than Snowdon. On the other hand, Lewis claims that an internal relation is one which supervenes upon the internal nature of its relata. An earlier version of the distinction, proposed by G. E. Moore, is that a relation R between entities b and c is internal if the existence of b necessitates that b bears the relation R to c (1919, 47). Thus, in Moore’s case, only the existence of b is necessary for the relation between b and c to hold. Moore’s kind of internal relation has sometimes been distinguished as ‘super-internal’ where the existence of R is necessitated only in virtue of b’s intrinsic properties, or as simply a ‘one-sided’ relation when extrinsic features of b might also be relevant to necessitate the existence of relation R between b and c (see Bennett 2017, 192–4). Because internal relations exist if their relata do, their addition to the ontology (and employment in metaphysical theories) requires no additional ontological commitment over and above the entities they relate (and a general commitment to the existence of such relations). Thus, they have been described by Armstrong as ‘an ontological free lunch’ (1989, 56).

From a historical perspective, relations were not considered to be real entities, with the underlying motivation for this being the conviction that they could be reduced to or supervene upon monadic properties. However, such a reduction has never been fully explained. Furthermore, relations are regarded as being philosophically problematic for at least two reasons. The first is that even when external relations are instantiated, it is not clear where they are: Bangalore is south of New Delhi, but the relation being south of is not one of the properties which these two cities instantiate individually, so it is not located entirely where either of the cities is, and so one might wonder where the relation is. Perhaps its location is somehow divided between its relata, but it must be divided in such a way that the relation can be considered as one unified entity. Furthermore, Heil complains that relations do not fit neatly into our ontological categories of substance or attributes, that they are ‘neither fish nor fowl’ (2012, 141). But neither of these complaints counts decisively against the existence of irreducible relations: if they exist, they simply have to exist (and to have their location) in a way different than either substances or monadic attributes. Like Armstrong’s immanent universals which are wholly present in each of their instantiations, relations are not bound to behave in the same way as the objects and properties of ordinary middle-sized objects.

Another objection threatens the existence of external relations, a version of which was discussed in 4a. This is known as Bradley’s Regress (1893, 32–3). If relation R genuinely relates objects b and c, then R must be something to b and c. However, if R is something to b and c, then there must be a relation R’ which captures the relation between R and b and c. However, if R’ genuinely relates R, b and c, then there must be another relation R’’ which relates R’ to R, b and c; which in turns requires the existence of another relation R’’’, and so on. There is a regress of relations and thus, argues Bradley, the existence of external relations is impossible.

There have been some attempts to solve Bradley’s Regress using relational tropes (Maurin 2010, 321–3) or facts (Armstrong 1989, 109–10); but, as MacBride has argued, these strategies rely upon assuming the coherence of relations in the first place (2011). Russell, on the other hand, adopts the alternative strategy which highlighted the indispensability of relations, such as spatio-temporal relations, to science (1924, 339). It is more likely, he argues, that there is something wrong with Bradley’s regress argument than that we are wrong to take so much of our fundamental science at face value.

A challenge for any philosophical account of relations, assuming now that they can be construed realistically, is how we should understand how non-symmetric relations make a contribution to different states of affairs. The same constituents—Edgar, Julia and the relation of seeing (for instance)—can form two distinct states of affairs: Edgar sees Julia and Julia sees Edgar, which differ in relational order or differential application. Russell (1903, 218) became interested in giving an account of this relational order, a question which has been taken up in contemporary metaphysics (Hochberg 1987; Fine 2000; Orilia 2011). One might think of the difference between the two states of affairs as being explained by the relation having a direction, of the relation being directed from one relatum to another; or one might think that the positions or argument places of the relation are occupied in different ways. In this case, the argument place occupied by the one being seen is different from the one doing the seeing. Fine criticises these two accounts and suggests his own, non-local account of how we can explain differential application in terms of the other states of affairs into which a particular relation enters. Alternatively, MacBride has suggested that we should accept relational order as primitive, in the same way that most philosophers who accept real external relations avoid Bradley’s Regress by simply assuming that the fact that b relates c does not require further explanation (2014).

d. Determinable and Determinate Properties

 Being vermillion or being crimson are specific cases of being red, which is itself a specific case of being coloured. Similarly, being triangular is a case of being shaped, and having a mass of 1.06 kilograms is a specific instance of having mass. This relationship between properties such as being coloured and being red, and then between being red and being crimson, is known as the determinable-determinate relation, where colour is the determinable and crimson is the determinate instance of it. Given that a property, such as being red, can be determinable and determinate, a property’s status as determinable or determinate is usually regarded as relative matter. The different determinates of a particular determinate often exclude one another (if something is red, it cannot be blue or green), and this was thought to be a defining feature of a determinable and its determinates, although this is not always the case, since one can argue that different determinate odours or tastes are compatible with each other (Armstrong 1978b, 113). Nevertheless, even in cases where determinates do exclude each other, the determinable does not appear to be simply the conjunction of all the determinates but something over and above that.

One philosophical question which arises as a result of this distinction is what the relationship between determinables and determinates is. One can be a realist about both determinates and determinables, at which point the further question arises about whether determinates are more ontologically fundamental than determinables; one can be a reductionist about determinables; or one can be an anti-realist about determinables.

One might wonder whether there are any ontologically irreducible determinable properties on epistemic grounds: perhaps we only have to refer to determinable entities such as colour and shape because of our perceptual or cognitive limitations. It is too complicated to think about the world in maximally specific terms, or we do not have the perceptual apparatus to be able to detect such maximal specificity; however, in the absence of these limitations, we would not require determinables. For example, see Heil (2003). However, for this argument to be plausible, and for the reduction or elimination of determinables to be possible, the world must be absolutely determinate and without metaphysical vagueness, and this too is a matter of philosophical debate. Nevertheless, the ontological conviction that the world is maximally determinate is an important motivation for reductive or anti-realist views.

On the other hand, the reality of irreducible determinables is problematic since it is not obvious that we can perceive determinables as such: we perceive shape in virtue of perceiving specific shapes, or colours in virtue of perceiving determinate colours. We do not seem to be aware of determinables as objects of our perceptions.

However, Prior (1949) suggests that determinables must be more than their determinates because determinates are similar with respect to those determinables: red, blue and orange are similar with respect to their colour as are being triangular and being oval with respect to their shape. For this respect to exist, one might argue, determinables must be ontologically independent of determinates and must be real. Furthermore, this ontological point is exploited by Fales to improve the epistemological situation with respect to determinables. He notes that we can perceive the specific similarity between determinates, and in doing so we must be indirectly aware of determinables (1990, 172).

A second argument for the existence of determinables comes from their role in laws of nature and the fact that they are postulated in scientific explanations. For instance, we think of Newton’s second law as holding between the determinables mass, force and acceleration, rather than there being infinitely many laws holding between determinate instances of these determinables. Furthermore, in chemical laws, the relevant relationship holds between determinables (between acids and alkalis, to give a simple example), and one might argue that the specific molecular features of the determinate substances are not important (Batterman 1998).

Realists about determinables have presented a variety of accounts, including an essentialist account (Yablo 1992) which treats determinables as having essences which are contained within the essences of their determinates; accounts based on the causal relations of the determinables being a subset of those of the determinates (Fales 1990); and a causal powers-based account in which causal powers of a determinable are a subset of those of any and all of its determinates (Wilson 1999).

The main version of reductionism about determinables treats them as disjunctions of all their determinates: being coloured is equivalent to being red or being blue or being green or . . . . One objection which is raised against this view is that it does not match the way we think about determinables. Moreover, it seems that someone might fully understand a determinable such as colour while having no conception of all the disjuncts of the disjunction (all the different colours) which make that determinable. In such cases it is not obvious how the reductionist can maintain that such a person understands the determinable in question. Furthermore, the assumption that the world is maximally determinate is questioned on the basis that it is thought to violate the principle of plenitude with respect to the possible ways the world might be. See also Bigelow and Pargetter (1990) for an alternative version of reductionism.

e. Qualitative and Non-Qualitative Properties

Prima facie, it appears that properties such as being blue, having a mass of 1 kilogram, or being an electron are different in kind to being Barack Obama, being such that 4 is an even number, and being the same weight as William Shakespeare, in the sense that the first set of properties apply to the individuals which instantiate in them in virtue of the qualities that individual has (and also, if they are extrinsic properties, in virtue of the qualities which other individuals have and the relations between them), while the latter do not. The latter class of properties include haecceistic properties, impure properties and identity properties (and disjunctions and negations of these), as well as arguably including modal and temporal properties (being possible, being actual, being now) and mathematical properties. (See 7f for some examples of these and further definitions.)

Can we draw a distinction between qualitative and non-qualitative properties, and is there a criterion according to which we can do so? The principled distinction would be a philosophically useful one, since the distinction is already employed in its intuitive formulation: it is qualitative properties, not non-qualitative ones, which are shared by duplicates. Langton and Lewis’s distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties also applies only to qualitative properties (1998, and see 7a); laws of nature are taken to connect qualitative properties rather than non-qualitative ones, and furthermore, inductive inferences are considered illegitimate if the terms within them refer to non-qualitative properties (Hempel and Oppenheim 1948). In addition, claims about the truth of physicalism are usually restricted to claims about the ultimately physical nature of qualitative properties.

There has been some contemporary philosophical consideration of this distinction (Diekemper 2009; Cowling 2015). Reductive analyses of non-qualitative properties have attempted to account for them in terms of the linguistic attributes of the predicates which apply to them (that they always include proper names, for example), or have attempted to characterise non-qualitative properties as being those whose existence necessarily requires the existence of specific individuals (Rosenkrantz 1979). While this latter account is plausible for many positive non-qualitative properties—for instance, being Barack Obama requires the existence of Barack Obama—it does not work as well for negative non-qualitative properties such as being distinct from Barack Obama, since such a property might exist in the absence of Barack Obama himself. Alternatively, one might suggest that qualitative properties are specifically those which can be defined in an appropriate way from perfectly natural properties, or are those which supervene on them (Bricker 1996). Cowling (2015) finds all these alternatives problematic and advocates a primitivist approach to the distinction.

f. Technical Terms for Property Types

Since there are several specialised technical terms for different types of properties, it will be useful to list them here.

Property Name Description Examples
Qualitative properties,

Pure Properties


General Qualities being green,

having mass,

being an armadillo,

being near an iceberg

Existential Properties Property that requires the existence of something or other (usually of a certain type) being such that a cat exists,

being such that a triangle exists

Haecceistic Properties, Identity Properties,

Impure Properties

Property which involves a particular entity being Marie Curie,

being 300km from Bamako,

not being written by David Lewis

Identity Properties A subset of haecceistic properties involving being a particular thing being Obama,

being Marie Curie

Indiscriminately Necessary Properties Property instantiated by every particular being such that 6 + 6 = 12,

being self-identical,

being such that a triangle exists

8. Realism about Properties: Do Properties Exist?

So far, this article has presupposed that properties exist mind-independently, or that at least some of them do. But this claim has been challenged for two main reasons. First, there are the concerns about there being constitutive identity and individuation criteria for properties which were raised in Section 2. Second, there are several interconnected epistemic worries about whether and how we are able to discover or to refer to the properties which exist mind-independently (Putnam 1981; Elgin 1995; Allen 2002). While these do not challenge the existence of properties directly, they remove some of the motivation for postulating that the world has objective qualitative joints of the kind which properties mark, since this motivation has traditionally been based upon the explanatory power which an ontology containing properties has. If we are not justified in our beliefs about which properties exist, it is hard to see how they can have any explanatory power.

Since such epistemic worries do not directly challenge the existence of properties unless one has a fairly strict requirement that the entities of our ontology be epistemically accessible to us, it remains open to the property theorist to advocate a kind of ‘Kantian humility’ about whether the properties which we think exist are the ones which there really are (Lewis 2009). If this attitude is acceptable, then properties can be employed in metaphysics whatever their epistemic relationship to us.

9. Properties in the History of Philosophy

Concern about how we should understand qualitative similarity was a prominent issue during several periods of philosophical history. Since the historical discussions of properties are varied and detailed, as well as sometimes being enmeshed with specific philosophical concerns of the time, it will be impossible to do justice to them here. Bearing this problem in mind, this articles is restricted to considering the very first known theories of properties and then summarise other notable points at which discussion about properties became prominent.

a. Ancient Theories of Properties

In the philosophical traditions of both ancient Greece and ancient India, the phenomenon of similarity and difference between distinct things prompted a certain amount of consternation which became bound up with the desire to explain the even more troubling phenomena of persistence and change. Early philosophers could see—on the basis of their everyday experience—that there were different things around them which were nevertheless the same: entities could be equal and yet unequal, a phenomenon which was in danger of being contradictory. Some philosophers postulated the existence of different elements or substances to account for these similarities and differences, which led to pre-Socratic accounts of the world in which one element is more important or more fundamental than the others; there is an archê or material principle in virtue of which the other substance types come into existence. For Thales, the archê is water; for Heraclitus (in some interpretations) fire; while others preferred pluralistic accounts of the elements, such as Empedocles’ four: earth, air, fire and water.

However, these accounts of different elemental substances stop short of being property theories because they do not have a conception of entities which can be co-located with each other—that is, that can be instantiated in the same spatio-temporal region as each other—and which also perhaps inhere in a more fundamental substance. Thus, in such theories, it is particularly difficult to explain the phenomenon of change. If one has only substances and no properties, the causation of one thing B by another A appears to be a case of substance A being destroyed and substance B being created: if one melts sand and salt together and gets glass, it appears that the sand and salt have been destroyed and the glass created. Each case of change or causation is a radical transformation, conceptually equivalent to the creation of one substance simultaneously with the destruction of another. Furthermore, it appears that the glass has been created from something which is not glass; it was not clear how to explain the coming-into-existence of such things from what they are not, or even how change is possible at all. The explanatory situation is arguably even more serious since it does not just affect cases of substantial change, such as salt and sand turning into glass, but also seemingly insignificant changes such as a hot cup of coffee getting cooler or a solid ice cube becoming liquid as it warms. (See ParmenidesOn Nature, specifically The Way of Truth, which denies the existence of both change and differences of type.) Such problems with change gave rise to fruitful metaphysical discussions, only fragments of which survive today, and generated what became the first theories of properties. How good an account of properties and change any of the pre-Socratics managed to give is therefore a matter of controversy, although Marmadoro (2015) argues that Anaxagoras treated kinds of substances as powers, and several commentators have ascribed a sophisticated account to Heraclitus (Finkelberg 2017).

Perhaps the most famous account of properties from Ancient Greece can be attributed to Plato, who formulated the theory of forms, the first known version of a theory of universals. Plato presented what became known as ‘the One Over Many argument’ in which he argued that many particular F-things could also be one if they are regarded as instantiating or participating in a universal F-ness (Republic, 596a). This accounts for how distinct particulars can be qualitatively the same by grounding their qualitative similarity in the universal which they all instantiate, and thus avoids the contradictory claim that such particulars are both the same and different, or that they are equal and unequal at the same time. For instance, different cats are the same because they instantiate the universal cat and are different because they are distinct individuals. Further differences can be grounded by universals which some of the cats instantiate and others do not, such as being tabby, being fat, or being feral. In addition, Plato argued that the forms must transcend the instances of them: first, because exact (qualitative) equality between different particulars cannot be experienced in nature and thus cannot be due to relations between the particular objects themselves; and second because there are some forms of which no perfect instances exist, such as the perfect circle, although examples of imperfect circles abound.

Following Plato, Aristotle accepted that objective similarity and difference is grounded by forms or universals, but he denied that such entities are transcendent. In his view, universals are immanent, wholly present in each of their instances, rather than being abstract entities which exist independently of them. Furthermore, Aristotle made a distinction between properties or attributes and the substance in which they inhere, or the particular which instantiates them. In this view, some of the philosophical mystery concerning change is dissipated since an entity can persist while the properties which it instantiates change. Water instantiates solidity and cold when it is frozen and liquidity and (comparative) warmth as it heats up, but the water continues to exist. Such an ontology maps conveniently onto the different grammatical elements of our ordinary language (at least if we speak a language with subjects and predicates and adjectives and nouns) with the substances being picked out as the subject or the object, and adjectives or predicates referring to the properties. Substance types such as cat, human, or water are further determined by particulars instantiating immanent universals, and we can understand substantial change—the creation of water, for instance, in a chemical reaction—by a change in the properties instantiated by matter.

Another contrast between Aristotle’s view and the earlier one of Plato is in the nature of the properties or universals they postulated: for Plato, universals can enter into causal relations (despite being abstract objects) but they are predominantly required to determine which category or type of thing a particular is; whereas, for Aristotle, universals have essential causal powers to bring about certain effects in the appropriate circumstances. For Aristotle, a particular’s instantiating a universal gives it the potentiality to have an effect, an effect which will be actualised if the particular is in the appropriate conditions. An ice cube has the potentiality to melt in appropriately warm conditions even if the particular ice cube is never in an environment greater than zero degrees Celsius. Aristotelian properties are essentially causal, which makes Aristotle’s view similar to that of the dispositionalists discussed in Section 5.

Early Indian philosophers encountered similar obstacles to the Greeks in attempting to understand the phenomena of persistence and change, which some early metaphysicians sought to alleviate by distinguishing quality from substance. For instance, Kaṇāda, founder of the Vaiśeṣika school, distinguishes three categories of existents: substance, quality and action, which together can provide an account of the constitution of the cosmos and the change within it (Kaṇāda, Vaiśeṣika Sūtra 8.14). Vaiśeṣika metaphysics, in conjunction with the broadly speaking metaphysical realist Nyāya epistemological system founded by Akṣapadi Gautama, provides a sophisticated account of real and existent particulars and real universals according to which particular substances, qualities and actions fall into categories. The Vaiśeṣikas consider what is existent to be a subset of the real: universals are real but not existent because they are objective, mind-independent entities rather than unreal or imaginary ones, but they do not exist in the same sense as individual objects or qualities. Particulars qualities are thus more fundamental than universals are for the Vaiśeṣika—the former exist and are real, whereas the latter are merely real—making Vaiśeṣika perhaps the earliest form of trope theory (Matilal 1990, ch. 4; Halbfass 1992, 122–7).

Universals are apprehended directly via perception and are eternal, unitary and located in a plurality of things; that is, like Aristotle’s account of them, they are immanent in that a universal is wholly present in every particular which instantiates it. Particular cows, or particular colours, or particular academic institutions, fall into the categories which they do because of the universals which they instantiate. Moreover, such universals can be further distinguished according to whether they determine natural or conventional classifications: cows and colours would be categorised as natural universals (jāti) while being an academic institution is an imposed classification (upādhi), determined as a matter of convention.

In common with objections to other, much later accounts of immanent universals (Armstrong 1978b), the early Buddhist philosopher Diṅnāga raised an objection to the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika conception of a universal on the basis that a unitary entity’s being wholly present in multiple locations is incoherent. In the tenth century, Udayana attempted to provide a strict distinction between natural and imposed universals, and also placed restrictions upon the natural universals so that they could not fall foul of the problems associated with instantiation and self-instantiation noted below in Section 5 (Udayana, Kiraṇāvalī). The development of this metaphysics of properties then continued in the school of Navya-Nyāya (or New Nyāya). See, for instance, Annambhaṭṭa’s The Manual of Reason.

b. Medieval Theories of Properties

The subject of properties came to the fore once again in 12th Century Western European philosophy, and questions about what grounds qualitative similarity became important. Peter Abelard and Guillaume de Champeaux debated the nature of universals, with the former developing a form of nominalism, the view that universals are not objectively existing entities but are names, or irrealism which did not seek to determine the ontological status of universals at all. Abelard argued that realism about universals inherited from Boethius is incoherent since the instantiation of a universal by otherwise very different particulars would lead to contradictions. Both a frog and Aristotle instantiate the universal animal, but that makes it both irrational and rational, which is a contradiction. William of Ockham also formulated a version of nominalism which is sometimes regarded as an early trope theory

The rediscovery of the works of Aristotle in Western Europe from the middle of the 12th Century onwards also encouraged the ongoing debate. William of Ockham formulated a version of nominalism which is sometimes regarded as an early trope theory, and Aquinas adopted aspects of Aristotle’s theory of universals and incorporated into them Aristotle’s notion of causal powers in order to explain qualitative similarity, the nature of change and natural necessity.

c. Properties and Enlightenment Science

The European Enlightenment changed the focus of discussions about properties away from ontological worries about what properties are towards concerns about how properties fit in with our scientific worldview. One result of this change of focus was the development of a distinction between properties which has become known as ‘the primary and secondary quality distinction’. Most famously espoused in the work of John Locke, the distinction was inherited by Locke from Galileo, Malebranche and Boyle, and was widely held in some form by scientists of the time who began to distinguish those properties which are perceived exactly as they exist in objects and those which are mediated by the senses (or in some versions of the distinction are entirely subjective). A tomato has the near-spherical shape objectively, but it does not have its red colour independently of being perceived by a conscious observer. Primary qualities, according to Locke, include Shape, Size, Motion, Number, Texture, and Solidity, while secondary qualities are Colour, Taste, Sound, Felt Texture and Smell. If there were no perceivers, the latter qualities would not exist, but that is not usually taken to imply that these qualities are entirely subjective and do not in any sense exist in the objects which appear to instantiate them. Rather, as Locke maintains, there is a causal relationship between the objects and our sensory system such that secondary qualities are caused by the primary qualities of objects with the effects being mediated by the senses; secondary qualities ‘are powers to produce various sensations in us’ (Locke, 1689, VIII, §10).

A second feature of early modern property theories involved growing empiricist distrust of the Aristotelian conception of properties as being causal powers, entities which make effects occur (in the appropriate circumstances) and thereby ground natural necessity. Most famously, David Hume found nothing in sensory experience—no corresponding sensory impression—which indicated the existence of necessary connexions in nature of the variety which causal powers might ground. For the strict empiricist, there is no reason to believe in the existence of unactualized possibilities or potentialities—potentialities which have not manifested their effects—when all which can be observed are the actual effects when they occur. I can never experience the potential of a sugar cube to dissolve in water; I can only observe its dissolving when it actually does so. For the strict empiricist, powers or potentialities are mysterious features of objects, beyond our possible experience, and so we should not postulate their existence.

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Author Information

Sophie Allen
University of Keele
United Kingdom