Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

The Right to Private Property

The right to private property is the social-political principle that adult human beings may not be prohibited or prevented by anyone from acquiring, holding and trading (with willing parties) valued items not already owned by others. Such a right is, thus, unalienable and, if in fact justified, is supposed to enjoy respect and legal protection in a just human community.

Table of Contents

  1. Why Private Property?
  2. Individuality and Humanity
  3. Individualism: True and False
  4. Individuality and Privacy
  5. Classical Liberalism, Human Nature & Individuality
  6. Fluctuating Classes
  7. The Moral Standing of Private Property Rights
  8. Individualism and Historicism
  9. Individualist Alternative to Organicism
  10. The Appeal of Collectivism
  11. The Right to Private Property
  12. No Carte Blanche to Communities
  13. Property Rights, Individuality and the Moral Life
  14. No Private Property Rights, No Full Moral Agency
  15. Moral Individualism
  16. The Virtue of Prudence
  17. Prudence and Justice
  18. Moral Responsibility and Private Property
  19. Naturalism and Politics
  20. Commerce and Property
  21. Moral Standing of Political-Economic Systems
  22. Morality and Public Affairs
  23. Law and Common Sense
  24. Abandon the Divided Self Idea
  25. End Notes

1. Why Private Property?

The right to private property(1) is the social-political principle that adult human beings may not be prohibited or prevented by anyone from acquiring, holding and trading (with willing parties) valued items not already owned by others. Such a right is, thus, unalienable and, if in fact justified, is supposed to enjoy respect and legal protection in a just human community.

In the development of classical liberalism there emerged in Western political thought a shift of focus as to the prime value in social-political matters, from the group–a tribe, class, state or nation–to the human individual. It started with the effort to gradually transfer power from a few or even one person as the source of collective authority and power to more segments of society involved in exercising such authority and power, leading, eventually, to the sovereignty of the human individual. The way in which power is diffused when individuals are sovereigns rather than groups is through the fact that individuals have only a little and highly diversified power to wield. In consequences, they aren’t likely to impose themselves on others by, say, starting a war, even when they disagree very seriously. That, in essence, was the initial motivation for moving toward individualism, which, when implemented via law and public policy, is much more conducive to peace and, as a result, to prosperity than is any form of collectivism. Thus classical liberalism has had some considerable support on practical grounds–its usefulness to attaining various widely sought after objectives.

A major reason, however, that individualism makes better sense than its competitors is that the view that human beings are primarily parts of a social whole is wrong. This last is a false notion. When invoked, arguably it tends to serve as a disguise for certain special or vested privileges of some members of society.(2) Generalizing such special or vested interests, the values or goals pursued in their name, has been a major source of political acrimony throughout human history. It even continues to drive much of contemporary democratic politics.

There is, however, the problem that as far as its ethical presuppositions and implications are concerned, individualism and in consequences also classical liberalism have not fared all that well. These views are constantly being charged with opposition to community life and human fellowship, hedonism, materialism, and so forth. Even though this is wrongheaded, without a solid moral case it is difficult to show that to be true. The reason is that morality is extremely important in human affairs. Most people do not confidently embrace a political stance unless it manages to embrace certain basic moral principles. Pragmatic reasons thus never suffice to establish the soundness of political systems and public policies.

It is part of the point of this essay to show that private property rights accord with certain basic moral principles. These are the indispensability of human agency in any sensible moral framework and the moral virtue of prudence. I will argue that individualism embraces these principles and that the right to private property makes their actual realization possible in human community life.

2. Individuality and Humanity

Human beings have, as one of their distinctive features, a significant element of individuality. Notice, for example, how this comes through in some thought experiments. If a friend dies, it is nonsense to think, “Oh well, I’ll just get another friend.” You cannot just replace a person with another if you regard him as he really is, most basically, not just as some member of a class of people, such as dentists or auto mechanics. (Even with pets it’s difficult to replace them because they become sort of humanized around us.)

On the other hand, with a cow, fly, rock and most other things in the world, replacing them is no problem in one sense because they aren’t important individually. They’re important in their relationship to other things, whereas in the case of human beings it is everyone’s individuality that matters most, especially in those most significant personal or intimate relationships. You fall in love with an individual, not a banker–when you really fall in love, that is. (Some people “fall in love” with a type, true enough, but there’s something perverse about that — it is somewhat sad to hear, “Well, I love him because he’s in uniform or has a big car.”)

Even apart from such common sense observations there is the clear evidence that whenever we consider human beings, we cannot avoid their volitional conduct, actions they choose to bring about on their own.(3) In intellectual discussions this is evident in the fact that we criticize one another about what we think, holding our adversaries directly or indirectly responsible for alleged misjudgments.(4)

It is a reasonable view, then, that human beings are first and foremost individuals who cause much of what they do. Their actions flow from their thinking and their thinking is the sphere in which they are free, self-determined.(5)

3. Individualism: True and False

Now individualism is associated somewhat uncomfortably with classical liberalism. The reason is that some have overemphasized the element of individuality, making it seem that we are not also members of communities, even of the human race. Such “atomistic” individualism has made it seem that classical liberalism is tied to a misguided social philosophy. An example of it may be found in the oft repeated story, by economists, of Robinson Crusoe. If one models human life on Crusoe’s story and his interaction with Friday, it appears that we are born capable of self-sufficient productive conduct and from the start choose whether to associated with others. Yet this idea is patently absurd, considering that all human beings are born helpless and grow up in the company of others on whose support they vitally depend.

Yet it is not true that individualism is necessarily committed to atomism. One can fully admit to the communal aspects of human life while insisting that we are essentially individuals, as well. Such a robust, what I have called “classical” individualism, also stresses the importance of the private realm and insists that all bona fide human communities must adhere to the terms individuals set for themselves.

The crucial individualist ingredient of classical liberal social and political theory stresses not some arid independence or isolation of the individual human being but the fact that everyone can make what in principle can be independent judgments as to the kind of communities suitable to one’s membership. Given human nature, the element of choice must be preserved in every suitable human community. This is the source of the classical liberal political principles that demands that the consent of the governed be upheld in public policy as well as personal relations. The criminal nature of murder, assault, kidnapping, rape, robbery, burglary and so forth all make sense in terms of this classical or moderate individualism first found in Aristotle philosophy.(6)

4. Individuality and Privacy

The gist of individualism is, then, that everyone must consent to being used by another. This is because each is important, valuable in his or her own right. And if an individual is important as such, then there is a sphere that constitutes the individual’s realm of sovereignty and others ought to respect it, the realm within which one must make effective judgments about one’s life. And indeed in classical liberal, political, and legal theory there’s a great deal of emphasis on individual rights rather than rights of families or other groups, bearing on this individualist element of the position. The right to private property is, in turn, the most practically relevant of those individual rights.

The term “privacy,” then, underlines this emphasis of the importance of individuals. The right to private property is really just an extension, within the framework of a naturalist world view, of the right to one’s own life. It is when one(‘s life) engages with the rest of the world in the unique way one will do so, and when another will do this in his or her unique way, then privacy becomes important.(7) It will then be possible to actualize and to protect who one is and one’s manifestation in the world–one’s own art, productivity, creativity, innovation and so forth. None of those, as well, may be used by others without the individual’s consent to whom they belong.

Socialism and Humanity

Now consider that one of the interesting things about socialism is that in deep-seeded socialist theory there are no individuals. Marx said it directly: “The human essence is the true collectivity of man.”(8) He also noted that human beings constitute specie-beings and comprise “an organic whole” in the collectivity we call humanity.(9) What is important about you and me for a consistent, thoroughgoing socialist is that we belong to the human race, somewhat analogously to the way a bee belongs to its hive or an ant to its colony, only in this case the constituent parts are intelligent persons.

This is especially true of international socialism, but National Socialism and even more restrictive, local forms of socialism, emphasize the group as a whole and its plan, telos or destiny. Even communitarians, as vague as their conception of a community comes to (so that one cannot pin them down as socialists because they leave room for some elements of individualism), speak mostly of concerns in behalf of “us” and use the term “we” to designate the primarily valued party when discussing public policy. The individual can then, at times, be sacrificed if some gains are made for the group, collective or community.

5. Classical Liberalism, Human Nature & Individuality

Yet, if we examine human life carefully, we notice clearly that there is something irreducibly, inescapably, individual about everybody. Just think about yourself. How do you insist on being regarded by friends and others close to you? As a student? An American or Rumanian or Hispanic? Or as a woman or basketball player? Is there not in fact something unique that is the you that captures who you are? One’s identity isn’t racial, ethnic, religious or even professional. It is individual. As John Quincy Adams said in the motion picture Amistad, ask not what someone is but who someone is to come to know the person.

It’s in classical liberalism that this is acknowledged more than in any other political philosophy. There’s always been a little bit of emphasis on individuality, of course, in various rebellious political movements, but it’s very difficult to maintain the supremacy of the tribe or, later, the state if one admits that what is truly important in a human society is the individuals who comprise it, as individuals. Because then one can’t reasonably say, “Well, we can do away with that individual or with that group of individuals or their projects so as to benefit some others, including some collective such as the state, community, culture or race.”

Indeed, with the recognition and acknowledgment of the supreme value of the individual, the very definition of a “good” or “just” society would have to emphasize the freedom and happiness of individuals.

In fact, a characteristic of the classical liberal political ethos is that one scrutinizes a society for its quality, its goodness, and its justice on the basis of how loyal it is to the mission of securing the rights of individuals to their liberty and pursuit of happiness. This is actually a very prominent movement in the world today. It’s not done consistently and purely, but all those human rights organizations that go from country to country to check whether they adhere to tenets of justice are at least rhetorically committed to the examination of whether the countries treat their citizens as individuals with rights. Are their projects respected or are they neglected and treated with callous disregard for the choices of individuals?

This is one of the reasons that in a largely liberal–or, for the sake of avoiding confusion with American liberalism, a libertarian–society membership in a class looses its moral and political significance. In the United States of American, for example there are matters that may make no difference to most people, but when they matter to even just one, it is appreciated. I, for one, once worked as a busboy in Cleveland, Ohio, and noticed that when paid, I could go back to the same restaurant and eat a meal there. There was no frowning and shaking of the head and saying, “Wait a minute, you don’t belong here.” In much of Europe, in contrast, if you work in a restaurant you don’t get to eat there–it is not illegal now but it’s certainly gosh.

6. Fluctuating Classes

In a more or less libertarian social-political society the divisions that are based on incidental attributes–one’s wealth, color, national origin, ethnicity, race, and so forth–tend to be less significant because one’s individual worth trumps all these and classes, at any rate, are always in a flux. Even racial and ethnic, not to mention religious or economic categories tend to shift because there is no widespread and well entrenched legally enforced barriers to either entry to or exit from any of them.

Such categories and the behavior associated with them may still prevail in certain special contexts. For example, a professor will usually attain special respect in the classroom, but when one meets the professor at a restaurant, one will not need to carry over the behavior associated with that classroom status. No “Herr Doktor,” as, for example, in much of Germany, in or outside the classroom. In most American schools, however, one says, “Hello Professor,” but outside the label isn’t usually used.

All this can be a bit disturbing because it can sometimes spill over into disrespect for people who in fact deserve respect. Rampant individualism can corrupt into disrespect for all authority. The corruption can but by no means need be generated by the notion that individuals matter primarily as individuals, not so much as members of classes. It is also evident enough that we are social beings, members of the class of human beings, and there are some matters very important about that, too.

7. The Moral Standing of Private Property Rights

Individualism does, however, underlie the regime of private property rights. But why do we need a separate discussion of the merits of the right to private property? What will such an inquiry yield?

There are at least two answers to that question. One is that when you resist people taking something from you, by taxation, theft or any other means, it is important to know, even if only implicitly, that the resistance is justified. That it is a kind of self-defense, akin to resisting someone assaulting or raping someone else. It is vital to learn that one is in the right and is not doing something merely willful or stubborn or prejudicial, that one is not just being a recalcitrant, antisocial person, when one insists on the integrity of ownership. This is a point widely contested by opponents of classical liberal or libertarian legal orders.

When all things are considered, the most important questions about liberalism and its various tenets is, “Is it true?” “Is classical liberalism or, its purest versions, libertarianism, the way a society ought to be organized?” And, in order to answer that question, one must examine whether its various tenets can withstand challenges, criticisms and so on. Individualism is one of these tenets but the right to private property is the most important practical, public policy element of it.

The second reason we need to examine private property rights is whether system of individual rights, including the right to private property, is a just system? Or is it, as many critics claim, just a figment of some people’s imagination?

One of the most prominent and oft-repeated criticisms leveled at classical liberalism, especially by students of various configurations of Marxism–there are about 300 versions now–is that this whole emphasis on individuality is a kind of a historical glitch. It’s only a temporary phase in history which had its role but now can be dispensed with.

8. Individualism and Historicism

The Marxists and many others, some who follow them without knowing it, claim that in the 16th century the individual was invented, not merely discovered or his existence politically affirmed, for the sake of sustaining economic productivity. In order to create motivation for wealth-creation, the individual had to be made seem significant. It’s a myth, but it’s a useful myth. It’s like telling someone that she is beautiful when she isn’t so that she will do certain things from which certain advantages derive. According to Marxists, there was a period of human history where the belief in the importance of the individual had an objective historical function, not because it’s true, but because it contributes to certain crucial elements of capitalism.

There are people who look at history in this way, as if it is the record of the growth of humanity from infancy to full maturity. They then take it that the bourgeois epoch is like the adolescence of an individual. It’s a temporary stage and has its usefulness because, typically, adolescents embark upon all sorts of useless ventures–such as getting up at four o’clock to drive some place not because there’s something important to do as a sort of exercise to prepare for adulthood. It trains them for the eventual serious challenges of maturity.

When one treats humanity this way, so that it has these various historical stages, individualism can be regarded to be one of those stages. It’s a somewhat appealing picture–it fits some images we have of humankind. Ecologists encourage this, as do some moral visionaries who see humanity as a big family or some other kind of collectivity.

Marx explicitly said that the Greek era was the childhood of humanity. He, as I have noted already, and many of those who have been influenced by his thinking believe that humanity is some kind of organism, a being of which individuals are the parts. Humanity goes through stages of organic development, the tribalism its first and communism its final stage. And while the individualist stage in a necessary one, it is certainly not the completed stage of humanity.

9. Individualist Alternative to Organicism

These challenges have to be answered because they are extremely well developed, plausible enough, and with enormous influence in the world intellectual community. It is a little like when one meets a friend and asks them to explain some event such as their recent divorce and they proceed to give you a very well worked out and sincerely held rationalization as to how things happened. Now, in order to cope with one of these rationalizations, one must get to the heart of the actual situation and demonstrate beyond all reasonable doubt that the story is a different one. One must show that one’s understanding of what’s going on is more rational, coherent, comprehensive, and explains much more than does theirs. Otherwise the deceptive story will be the only viable account making the rounds, despite its conflict with common sense.

Unless liberalism is able to identify a better story than what those who champion the organic view advance, it will be defeated, at least theoretically. And while that isn’t always decisive, it certainly has an impact on the confidence with which the position can be supported and implemented.

Indeed, one of the advantages of anti-liberal doctrines is that so many intellectuals are enchanted by them. They create elaborate and smart stories around them, stories that are extremely appealing and intellectually challenging. For one, such a story gives the intellectual a privileged position. Only intellectuals are in the position to grasp such a complex story, after all. Common sense does not support it. (For example, Marx thought only communists could really understand the truth of such a story, the rest of us having been blinded by our class outlook.)

10. The Appeal of Collectivism

The idea, for example, that we are all mere parts of a large human organism, humanity, has very a strong intellectual standing in our time. A great many people make reference to humanity–as when they talk about sacrificing oneself or one’s private interests or one’s materialistic goals for humanity. And others refer to smaller groups–the community or ethnic group or the race–as the organisms that are of significance.

So it’s almost a feature of the mainstream to think of us not as individuals but as parts of some larger whole. “Don’t you have something more important to live for than yourself?” “Isn’t there something greater than yourself to which your life must be devoted for it to be worthwhile?” Less loosely, some, such as the philosopher Charles Taylor, argue that we all must belong to a group, by dint of our very humanity, our nature as human beings. He tells us that “Theories which assert the primacy of rights are those which take as the fundamental, or at least a fundamental, principle of their political theory the ascription of certain rights to individuals which deny the same status to a principle of belonging or obligation, that is a principle which states our obligation as men to belong to or sustain society, or a society of a certain type, or to obey authority or an authority of a certain type.”(10) Never mind that Taylor cannot give us any such theories–John Locke, for example, rested basic human rights on ethics or natural law. What is important in what Taylor says is not only that if you just live to make the most of your life, you’re not really living a significant enough life. A significant life must not only fulfill a greater purpose and humanity’s purpose is one of the candidates. God’s purpose is another candidate. Ecologists have a biological purpose in mind. But a significant life but belong to the effort to pursue this purpose and thus our lives, to be properly significant, may be subordinated, by force, to such purposes.(11)

There’s a very prominent tradition of selecting alternative wholes larger than ourselves as the proposed beneficiaries of significant human actions. And this can lead to the whole process of forcing individuals to be used for purposes to which they do not consent. This is the greatest source of coercive thinking in human history. Once it is accepted that human individuals are part of a larger whole they, as members of a partnership or team, have enforceable obligations to the goals of that large whole. They belong to it.

Consider, to appreciate this, how in certain cases we treat such wholes as ourselves. If something happens to one’s ear, for example, and yet one prizes one’s appearance with an intact ear, then one takes another part of one’s body that’s not visible and takes part of it so as to replace the ear. The famous Welsh actor, Richard Harris, had his nose destroyed in a fight, so doctors took a part of his hip bone and replaced it, clearly because the nose was more important to an actor than that little part of the hip bone.

Well, if humanity is the larger organism, then maybe a given individual may not be so important a part of it as another. So the less important individual can be sacrificed for the more important one (or the goals of the less important can be sacrificed for those of the more important). One may be an eye and the other just a useless thumb. That picture is widely embraced because of the belief that humanity is some organic whole.

If one recognizes collectivism as a misguided picture of human life, one must carefully and effectively argue in response to these well worked out and often honestly and sincerely meant doctrines. One must demonstrate that it is indeed individuals who count for the most in the human picture. It needs to be proven, some of the widespread opinion to the contrary notwithstanding, that notions such as “individual rights” are universal and not stuck to some limited historical epoch.

11. The Right to Private Property

One reason that it must be shown that the social regulative principle of a right to private property is sound and that it ought to be respected and protected in human community life is that it is a vital conceptual or logical implication of the individualist story. If individualism is indeed sound, so is the principle of private property rights. When the right to private property is not respected and not sufficiently protected, then there is something wrong with a community.

This means that it is not quite fit for human inhabitation, given the individuality of every person and how respect for this is a precondition for his or her flourishing.

There are many different ways in which private property has been supported in the history of political economy. Most prominent has been the claim that there should be legal protection of the right private property because this facilitates productivity–a point that’s in agreement with Marx, only universalized beyond a given epoch. Protecting this right helps society get rich–not only in the 16th century but always. Both Adam Smith and John Stuart Mill tended to argue along these lines: It’s a good thing to have these rights because if we act in terms of them we will have greater prosperity. Many economists today argue a similar point. Indeed, that is one reason many governments engage in privatization, so as to encourage economic growth.

All of this is vital but it isn’t what is most important. What needs to be shown is that the individual has these rights regardless of what’s done when simply exercising them. Even if individuals waste away their lives, they have that right. It is theirs to waste away, not someone else’s, because they are the important element of society, not some outsider, not some other being such as society, the community, the tribe or the ethnic group. It is this element of liberty, the right to choose how one lives, that is most central to human community life, even if, indeed because, as a matter of one’s personal life it is equally important to make the right choice, to choose to do the right thing.

That is exactly why the right to private property is vital. When effectively protected, it secures for human individuals a sphere of personal jurisdiction, the right to acquire and hold the props, as it where, with which to order one’s life. Moral virtues such as generosity, kindness, courage, moderation, prudence and the rest are all imperatives the practice of which engage one with the natural world. If one is not in charge of some of that world, at least oneself, one cannot conduct oneself virtuously. So the right to one’s life, liberty and property are necessary conditions for a morally significant or meaningful life in human communities.

It needs to be noted here, as a significant aside, that even if we are essentially individuals, this doesn’t mean we are not also naturally members of societies. But, as moral agents and as candidates for membership in some human communities or societies, we are morally responsible to take into consideration and never neglect the fact that we must judge those societies as to whether they do adequate justice to our individuality, most generally, and whether they best serve our flourishing.

12. No Carte Blanche to Communities

From this it follows that we must always keep in focus the question of whether we ought to live in a given community. Do we–ought we to–want to support this kind of public policy, this kind of a legal system? What is the standard by which we make that kind of decision when we have the chance? At the most basic level of community concern must lie the issue of what principles should govern human communities. The right to private property is one of those principles.

Very often we don’t have a direct practical option to act on the choice we make about basic principles. But at least we can think about them so that when we do get a chance to make a significant decision, then we will know where to stand. We owe it to ourselves, to a life of integrity, not to forget about that issue, ever. That is the highest duty of citizenship!

13. Property Rights, Individuality and the Moral Life

So what does the right to private property do in connection with the essential human element of individuality?

Well, as already suggested, the right to private property secures for one a sphere of sovereignty. See, if we are individuals, required, morally, to lead our lives by our judgements, it is crucial that we control the elements with which our lives are lived. Indeed, it becomes the most crucial thing.

The question, “How ought I to live?” becomes the foremost question to which you then seek an answer. While we aren’t moral theoreticians and ethical philosophers and so on, that question still is always near the forefront of our minds. No matter what you do, even reading these lines, the question will arise: “Should I sleep or should I pay attention? Should I consider this point or should I just glide over it?”

All of those are questions having to do with your ethical agency, with one’s governance of one’s life, with one’s sovereignty. One’s feeling that one is doing the right thing becomes crucial if one is indeed the master of one’s existence.

14. No Private Property Rights, No Full Moral Agency

Now, without the right to private property, without having some props, some elements of reality that are under our jurisdiction, our ethical decisions cannot be effectual. Consider for example, if it turns out to be true that a good human being ought to be generous. Well, if we do not have the right to private property how are we going to be generous? Are we going to be like politicians and bureaucrats and expropriate what belongs to others and give this to the poor and needy? That’s not generosity. That’s theft.

In short, then, in order to have a effective life of moral virtue, for example the virtue of generosity, we must have the right to property, to hold and then to be free to part with values, on your own terms.

15. Moral Individualism

Although collectivism has some currency, especially among intellectuals and social theorists, so does a particular version of individualism. I have in mind the sort that pertains to moral responsibility.

Few people ever quite let go of the idea that some things they and others do are good and some bad things and that those doing them are responsible. When others judge our lives, or when we reflect upon ours, we say, “I did or didn’t do the right thing.” Moreover, we can go on to consider what we did with what belongs to us–use it well or badly.

Without our sphere of sovereignty, that’s manifest in the actual world where we live our lives, we would not be able to act on most moral principles, especially those that involve allocating resources. Are we stingy? But one has to be stingy with something. If one is a neat person, one has to be neat within some sphere that one keeps orderly. If a slob, one will need something that belongs to one that one isn’t taking good care of. If those items don’t belong to you, if you always have to ask permission of society or the clan or the tribe of the nation as to what to do with these things, the you are not the effective agents in the disposition of them. And you are then not an effective moral agent either. You cannot take pride in what you achieve, nor feel guilt for your failings. You are basically just a little bit of a cell in this larger organism.

16. The Virtue of Prudence

Prudence is one of the virtues identified in classical Greece. I want now to discuss it in a little more detail than thus far.

First, in the modern era prudence has been demeaned because the task of taking care of oneself and one’s own has been deemed to be instinctual ever since Thomas Hobbes argued that we are all driven to preserve ourselves. But Hobbes rested his case on extrapolating the principles of classical mechanistic physics to human life, a move that is not at all justified. Human beings must choose their conduct, including whether they will serve others’ or their own well-being. Prudence, as the ancients saw it, is the virtue one needs to take decent care of oneself.

Later Immanuel Kant argued that since prudence is a motivation that is aligned to one’s own interest or inclinations, it is not a moral virtue. Only motives that are totally indifferent as to one’s own interest or inclinations can have moral significance, even though we can not know whether we are ever so purely motivated.

Neither Hobbes nor Kant had it right. Prudence is a moral virtue, though not the only or highest on. In any case, a prudent person acts, among other ways, economically. Such a person realizes that one must reserve for the future, put resources away for a rainy day. Such a person isn’t reckless in the disposition of the resources over which he or she has control.

But now if we have no right to acquire or hold things then we can’t be prudent. We then don’t have the decision-making authority to allocate resources in accordance with standards of prudence. On the other hand, if we do have this authority, then we can choose to act prudently.

17. Prudence and Justice

If in fact it is a moral virtue to be prudent, but it’s politically impossible for one to act on that virtue, then there is a basic conflict between ethics and politics. Then the political sphere is not properly adjusted to the ethical sphere. Then our ethical agency has not been done sufficient justice by the legal system in which we act.

And, indeed, that is one of the things that is so frustrating in societies where one does not have the right to private property. Not only that one is going to be thwarted in one’s efforts to acquire life’s necessities, but that one cannot act responsibly. Here what happens is a version of the tragedy of commons.

The tragedy of commons is a problem usually associated with managing the environment. The reason is that most spheres where there are environmental problems are public. The atmosphere, oceans, rivers, large forests and so on are spheres wherein no one is individually responsible. To put it another way, everyone is responsible for the management of such spheres but no one has a clear idea what to do about this responsibility because the limits imposed by private property rights are missing.

When you have a distinct or definite sphere of jurisdiction, however complicated it may be–with various layers of responsibility and delegation–then when something is done wrong, it can be traced to the agent or agents who did it. And when things are done right, again it can be traced to the agent or agents whose responsibility it was to do them right. Without the right to private property this is impossible.

This is one of the reasons that no society can completely abolish private property. It is impossible to act in any sort of responsible way without some sphere of personal jurisdiction.

18. Moral Responsibility and Private Property

So the right to private property is the concrete manifestation of the possibility of responsible conduct in a community where there are lots of people who need to know what they ought to do and with what they ought to do it. We are talking about a life lived within the context of the natural world. If our bodies are non-existent and we are just living in an illusionary material world, then these matters are of no significance. There is an assumption underlying the right to private property, and indeed many other elements of classical liberalism or libertarianism, namely, that we have a task to live properly in the midst of a natural environment, a natural world. We are not just living a purely immaterial life. Food needs to be grown and distributed, production has to occur. All sorts of concrete, natural tasks need to be carried out in order to facilitate our human lives.

If this natural life turns out to be either illusionary or insignificant, then some of these things loose their importance. Then politics might indeed be subject to different principles, ones that facilitate different goals, different aims from prosperity, flourishing, or other kinds of earthly success. It’s not easy to imagine what that would be. Yet, in a philosophical discussion of these issues, one has to contend with the fact that there are alternative basic ideas that are proposed concerning the basic elements of human living. Liberalism has to stand the test of being compared with these alternative pictures.

19. Naturalism and Politics

The naturalist approach, in the sense we are preparing and forging ways of living within the natural world, is, I am convinced, demonstrably sound. The alternatives tend to be very vaguely and confusedly supported.

There are doctrines in the world that say that all individuality, for example, is a myth. There are Eastern religions that contend that the natural, individual self is an illusion and that in truth, we’re all just part of the universal consciousness.

In order to test this, one has to have some criteria by which truth needs to be determined. The naturalist approach rests on the application of criteria that are universally accessible, available to all human beings with their rational faculties intact.

20. Commerce and Property

Private property rights, of course, makes for the institution of commerce. If you trade goods and services, if you sell them, if you produce them, if you hoard them, if you save them, you have to have some level of jurisdiction over them. If I wanted to trade you my watch for your shirt, then it has to be my watch. Or I have to have delegated to me the authority of someone whose watch it is. And it has to be your shirt; otherwise there would be no ability or justification in engaging in this trade. I can’t sell you this; this belongs to this hotel. But if it belongs to nobody, then I can’t even ask the permission of the hotel whether I can sell it or even give it away. So commerce, as well as charity and generosity presuppose the institution of private property rights. Without that institution, these activities cannot be undertaken smoothly, without confusion.

21. Moral Standing of Political-Economic Systems

One of the questions that arises in the discussion of political philosophy and political economy is whether they have moral standing. When the Left criticizes classical liberals morally because the liberal or libertarian polity makes profit-making possible, what is the answer?

It’s not enough to just say, “Well, we just like to make profit.” A murderer can just say, “We just like to kill people.” That is no justification, clearly.

There are those who argue that a social science such as economics requires nothing from morality–indeed, it is entirely amoral, purely positive or descriptive in its central thrust. But this is a mistake. All human affairs, including economic ones, are permeated with moral issues. In economics, for example, there is the moral (or as Rasmussen and Den Uyl have called it, the meta-normative(12)) element of private property rights.

If one does not own anything, no trade can ensue and all the talk of supply and demand must be abandoned in favor of what collectivists tend to support, a sort of share-and-share alike “economy.” But to own something means to be in a distinctively normative relationship with others. They are prohibited from taking what belongs to one. They ought not do so and will be penalized, furthermore, if they do.

So the amoral stance on the market economy is doomed to failure. What is needed is a moral or other normative justification of the institution of private property rights.(13)

To do that we must analyze human nature as it is manifest in the natural world. Will such an analysis support the institutions of freedom and free markets and give them a stronger moral standing in human society than alternative ones possess?

22. Morality and Public Affairs

Now there are some who would dismiss all this because there are cases in human community affairs involving innocent helpless persons, one’s who meet with natural disaster and may find themselves without any voluntary help when they need it. And that is certain a possibility, even if not a likelihood in a free society. James Sterba, for example, has been arguing for decades that because such cases are possible, the people who find themselves in them have a right to welfare that the legal order may protect. These positive rights, whereby others are required to work for such persons–or part with goods they have worked for in order to support them–come about because it would not be reasonable, Sterba argues, to demand that such people respect private property rights. It would be more reasonable to expect of them to strive to obtain the goods they need–ones Sterba calls, in a question-begging fashion, surplus wealth. (As if someone is justified in identifying what constitutes surplus–a term from classical Marxism that makes no sense outside the Marxist framework.)

If one recognizes, however, that an individual’s life is his or her own and he or she does not belong to anything or anyone outside of memberships to which he or she consents, then even the most dire needs of others does not support any institutional arrangement that fails to recognize individual rights–to life, liberty, and, yes, property (that one comes by without violating the rights of others even if one does not strictly deserve the property for some kind of service rendered or other achievement–for instance, come by because others want to purchase some talent or other attribute one naturally has). Just as it is unjustified to use others as a shield against natural danger, regardless of how little use one may make of them, one may not use others against their will, including wealth they own. One must find ways around this prohibition, as indeed most do when they engage in trade rather than theft in the effort to acquire their own wealth.

It is reasonable to demand this of everyone, even those in dire straits. If, however, in desperate circumstances such people do not honor this prohibition, there can be some measure of forgiveness, even within the purview of the legal authority (as per some cases that have been subject to unusual judicial discretion). But such exceptions, as hard cases in general, make bad general law.

23. Law and Common Sense

Let me go back to where we started. When somebody robs another who resists, the latter has a common sense idea of doing the right thing, that the resistance is not merely some immature, capricious and willful conduct. It is not as if one were simply engaged in feet stomping and crying, “I want it! I want it! I want it!” No, one senses that there is right on one’s side, not just an arbitrary wish and desire.

That is one reason it is vital to consider whether the free system can be given justification. What has been said here is by no means a thorough defense of the right to private property, but it does furnish some hints as to how such a defense would have to be presented if the issue ever arises, which is quite often in our world. First, this right, if protected, preserves one’s moral agency in this natural world in which community life occurs. Furthermore, it punctuates the fact that striving to prosper is a morally valid goal for human beings. So, the moral virtue of prudence, of taking the requisite actions to care for oneself and one’s intimates, supports the right to private property as well.

One thing that respect and protection of private property rights makes possible is the pursuit of wealth. Oddly, however, that is a criticism many offer against the system of free market capitalism that is built on the legal infrastructure of private property rights. They say, as we have already seen Marx do so, that private property rights–if they are protected, maintained, developed as law–encourage a hedonistic, narrowly selfish life, one that is concerned exclusively with acquisition of worldly goods. As he said, “the right of man to property is the ? right of selfishness.” Freedom is supposed to make too much self-indulgence, including pleasure, possible.

So another question that arises here turns out to be, “Is pleasure justified?” For even if the right to private property could be used for purposes quite different from obtaining pleasure in life, if pleasure is something loathsome and this right somehow encourages its relentless pursuit, perhaps it is an institution that is much more harmful than benign.

We cannot enter this topic at length but this much should suffice for now. If we are indeed natural beings in this world, one of our important values will be pleasure, the good feelings we experience via our bodies. This is so even if there are higher goods the attainment of which may require giving up some pleasure.

So, now, if wealth brings with it the possibility of pleasure, then wealth itself is a worthy good, provided it is not stolen but created, produced, and that it is not chosen as the highest good if a higher one can also be identified.

24. Abandon the Divided Self Idea

If one has a completely different view of human nature, whereby only the spiritual side of human life is of significance, then one will embrace a different system of values and probably also champion different institutions. We have a powerful tradition in most civilizations whereby there is an uneasiness about facilitating the flourishing of the human body. And that is often what stands, at a most basic level, against the free society!

One reason underlying that stand is the lack of a clear, unambiguous and benign acceptance of our earthly selves. We often think ourselves to be so unique, so extraordinary that we believe we must be partly divine or otherworldly. St. Augustine said it well when he cried out, “How great, my God, is this force of memory, how exceedingly great! It is like a vast and boundless subterranean shrine….Yet this is a faculty of my mind and belongs to my nature; nor can I myself grasp all that I am. Therefore the mind is not large enough to contain itself. But where can that uncontained part of it be?”(14) And he then answered, as have millions of others, that it must be somewhere apart from nature.

Business, too, has a bad reputation because of this, as well as the free market place, because if our natural selves are somehow inferior, than servicing it with the vigor with which people in business do must be misguided. People who pursue profit or material wealth, would then be pursuing trivia. They would be mere hedonists. As the title of one of my articles put it, “Praise Mother Teresa and then Hit the Shopping Malls.” In other words, we live a schizophrenic life. We embrace the value of prosperity, economic success, wealth on the one hand but then we deny it on the other.

Yet, if in our lives we embrace our bodies, minds, emotions, sensations and so on, then we suggest by this that a more integrated view of how to live and how to protect our values is right, not one that tears us into warring pieces.

The private property rights system rests, in part, on such an integrated understanding of human life, not the schizophrenic one. It rejects the idea that each human being is divided, a view that much of our literature embraces. It places us squarely on this earth, even though it is by no means hostile to anyone who chooses to look elsewhere for fulfillment, quite the contrary. (Indeed, the right to private property has made religious pursuits extremely fruitful as well as abundant, especially in the United States of America where churches can purchase their own land and welcome parishioners where they will not be disrupted by their foes.

The divided self idea started with Plato, at least with a certain reading of him, where he takes our minds to be divided from our bodies and where the mind is supposed to hold the rest of ourselves in check, rule it firmly. Major writers, especially theologians, have ever since stressed this drama and it is reflected in our society’s institutions. Victor Hugo made note of this point:

On the day when Christianity said to man: You are a duality, you are composed of two beings, one perishable, the other immortal, one carnal, the other ethereal, one enchained by appetites, needs, and passions, the other lofted on wings of enthusiasm and reverie, the former bending forever to earth, its mother, the latter soaring always toward heaven, its fatherland–on that day, the drama was created. Is it anything other, in fact, than this contrast on every day, this battle at every moment, between two opposing principles that are ever-present in life and that contend over man from the cradle to the grave?(15)

As a result of this, sadly, we are often apologetic for pursuing a satisfactory, happy life here on earth. And then we find it difficult if not impossible to defend the political regime that most clearly enhances such a life, having to accept it when others maintain that, well, it is a mundane, materialist life that such a regime supports.

All of this must be seriously rethought. Without it the best socioeconomic system human beings have ever identified will fail to flourish.

25. End Notes

1. Randy Barnett prefers the term “the right to several property” in The Structure of Liberty (London: Oxford University Press, 1998). One reason that it is useful, at least in the context of political philosophy and moral theory, to keep with the terminology of “the right to private property” is that this right is tied to an important element of classic liberal social and political thought, namely, individualism.

2. This is what public choice theory, within contemporary political economy, has helped identify. See, however, Harold Kincaid Philosophical Foundations of the Social Sciences: Analyzing Controversies in Social Research (London: Cambridge University Press, 1996), in which the author argues that the individualist stance in modern economics is mistaken and that we ought to deploy a more holistic approach. Kincaid and many other critics of what they dub “liberal individualism” claim that individualism is atomistic. While some may, certainly not all individualist fit this description. Nor is that the only version of individualism that gives rise to liberal politics. A good case in point is John Locke, among the early liberals, and many others such as Ayn Rand, Eric Mack, Douglas B. Rasmussen, Douglas J. Den Uyl, Fred D. Miller, Jr., and the late David L. Norton, in our own age.

3. Exceptions are individuals crucially incapacitated. Political theory and law are not devices for dealing with exceptions, however.

4. I develop much of this throughout Tibor R. Machan, Classical Individualism, The Supreme Importance of Each Human Being (London: Routledge, 1998), especially in Chapter 13. “Individualism and Political Dialogue.” Any kind of professional, including scholarly and intellectual, malpractice alleged in the course of political or other disputes implicitly rests responsibility with the interlocutors, blaming or commanding them for what they ought to or ought not to have done or said.

5. For more on this, see Edward Pols, Acts of Our Being (Boston, MA: University of Massachusetts Press, 1982) and Tibor R. Machan, Initiative: Human Agency and Society (Stanford, CA: Hoover Institution Press, 2000).

6. “To [Aristotle] the Individual is the primary reality, and has the first claim to recognition. In his metaphysics individual things are regarded, not as the mere shadows of the idea, but as independent realities; universal conceptions not as independent substances but as the expression for the common peculiarity of a number of individuals. Similarly in his moral philosophy he transfers the ultimate end of human action and social institutions from the State to the individual, and looks for its attainment in his free self-development. The highest aim of the State consists in the happiness of its citizens.”6. Eduard Zeller, Aristotle and the Earlier Peripatetics, trans. B. F. C. Costelloe and J. H. Muirhead (London: Oxford University Press, 1897), pp. 224-26. This idea is developed further in Fred D. Miller, Jr., Nature, Justice, and Rights in Aristotle’s Politics (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995). The difference between the atomistic and classical type of individualism is discussed in Tibor R. Machan, Capitalism and Individualism, Reframing the Argument for the Free Society (New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1990).

7.A very important beginning had been made on this line of analysis by William of Ockham who regarded property rights as securing “the power of rights reason,” that is, a sphere of personal jurisdiction that made reasoning about what one ought to do possible. This was extended more elaborate in John Locke’s idea that one has the right to one’s person and estate, something that, if protected, makes choice among other persons possible. An even greater advance on the precise identification of the nature of private property had been made in James Sadowsky, “Private Property and Collective Ownership,” in Tibor R. Machan, The Libertarian Alternative (Chicago: Nelson Hall, 1974). Karl Marx, too, got it nearly right when he wrote that “the right of man to property is the right to enjoy his possessions and dispose of the same arbitrarily without regard for other men, independently, from society, the right of selfishness.” Karl Marx, “On The Jewish Question,” in Robert C. Trucker, ed., The Marx-Engels Reader (New York: W. W. Norton, 1978), p. 26. Only, Marx’s warped view of human nature prompted him to consider only the most wasteful and pointless way the right to private property might be exercised.

8. Karl Marx, Selected Writings, ed., D. McLellan (London: Oxford University Press, 1977), p. 126.

9. Karl Marx, Grundrisse, trans. D. McLennan (New York: Harper Torchbooks, 1971), p. 39.

10. Charles Taylor, Philosophy and the Human Sciences (London: Cambridge University Press, 1985), p. 188.

11. The concept “belong” can be used to refer to membership as well as to being a part of. Membership in human communities embarking on various purposes can be voluntary but being a part of is something ontologically pregnant ? one is part of something sometimes whether one likes it or not. Taylor seems clearly to mean by “belong” “being part of,” so that one can be compelled to adhere to the purpose at hand.

12. Douglas B. Rasmussen and Douglas J. Den Uyl, Liberty and Nature (Chicago, IL: Open Court Publishing Co., Inc., 1990).

13. For more on this, see Tibor R. Machan, “The Normative Basis of Economic Science,” Economic Affairs,Vol. 18 (June 1998), pp. 43-46.

14. Augustine, Confessions, Lib. X, chap. 17. 8ff

15. Victor Hugo, La preface de Cromwell, Maurice A. Souriau, ed. (Geneve: Slatkine Reprints, 1973).

Author Information

Tibor Machan
Email: Machan@Chapman.edu
Chapman University
U. S. A.

Last updated: April 27, 2005 | Originally published: