Protagoras of Abdera was one of several fifth century Greek thinkers (including also Gorgias, Hippias, and Prodicus) collectively known as the Older Sophists, a group of traveling teachers or intellectuals who were experts in rhetoric (the science of oratory) and related subjects. Protagoras is known primarily for three claims (1) that man is the measure of all things (which is often interpreted as a sort of radical relativism) (2) that he could make the “worse (or weaker) argument appear the better (or stronger)” and (3) that one could not tell if the gods existed or not. While some ancient sources claim that these positions led to his having been tried for impiety in Athens and his books burned, these stories may well have been later legends. Protagoras’ notion that judgments and knowledge are in some way relative to the person judging or knowing has been very influential, and is still widely discussed in contemporary philosophy. Protagoras’ influence on the history of philosophy has been significant. Historically, it was in response to Protagoras and his fellow sophists that Plato began the search for transcendent forms or knowledge which could somehow anchor moral judgment. Along with the other Older Sophists and Socrates, Protagoras was part of a shift in philosophical focus from the earlier Presocratic tradition of natural philosophy to an interest in human philosophy. He emphasized how human subjectivity determines the way we understand, or even construct, our world, a position which is still an essential part of the modern philosophic tradition.
Surprising little is known of Protagoras’ life with any certainty. Our main sources of information concerning Protagoras are:
The first step in understanding Protagoras is to define the general category of “sophist,” a term often applied to Protagoras in antiquity. In the fifth century, the term referred mainly to people who were known for their knowledge (for example, Socrates, the seven sages) and those who earned money by teaching advanced pupils (for example, Protagoras, Prodicus) and seemed to be a somewhat neutral term, although sometimes used with pejorative overtones by those who disapproved of the new ideas of the so-called “Sophistic Enlightenment”. By the fourth century the term becomes more specialized, limited to those who taught rhetoric, specifically the ability to speak in assemblies or law courts. Because sophistic skills could promote injustice (demagoguery in assemblies, winning unjust lawsuits) as well as justice (persuading the polis to act correctly, allowing the underprivileged to win justice for themselves), the term “sophist” gradually acquired the negative connotation of cleverness not restrained by ethics. Conventionally, the term “Older Sophist” is restricted to a small number of figures known from the Platonic dialogues (Protagoras, Gorgias, Prodicus, Hippias, Euthydemus, Thrasymachus and sometimes others). Whether these figures actually had some common body of doctrines is uncertain. At times scholars have tended to lump them together in a group, and attribute to them all a combination of religious skepticism, skill in argument, epistemological and moral relativism, and a certain degree of intellectual unscrupulousness. These characteristics, though, were probably more typical of their fourth century followers than of the Older Sophists themselves, who tended to agree with and follow generally accepted moral codes, even while their more abstract speculations undermined the epistemological foundations of traditional morality.
When we separate Protagoras from general portraits of “sophistic”, as most scholars (for example, the ones listed below in the bibliography) recommend, our information about him is relatively sparse. He was born in approximately 490 B. C. E. in the town of Abdera in Thrace and died c. 420 B. C. E. (place unknown). He traveled around Greece earning his living primarily as a teacher and perhaps advisor and lived in Athens for several years, where he associated with Pericles and other rich and influential Athenians. Pericles invited him to write the constitution for the newly founded Athenian colony of Thurii in 444 B. C. E. Many later legends developed around the life of Protagoras which are probably false, including stories concerning his having studied with Democritus, his trial for impiety, the burning of his books, and his flight from Athens.
If our knowledge of Protagoras’ life is sparse, our knowledge of his career is vague. Protagoras was probably the first Greek to earn money in higher education and he was notorious for the extremely high fees he charged. His teaching included such general areas as public speaking, criticism of poetry, citizenship, and grammar. His teaching methods seemed to consist primarily of lectures, including model orations, analyses of poems, discussions of the meanings and correct uses of words, and general rules of oratory. His audience consisted mainly of wealthy men, from Athens’ social and commercial elites. The reason for his popularity among this class had to do with specific characteristics of the Athenian legal system.
Athens was an extremely litigious society. Not only were various political and personal rivalries normally carried forward by lawsuits, but one special sort of taxation, know as “liturgies” could result in a procedure known as an “antidosis” (exchange). A liturgy was a public expense (such as providinga ship for the navy or supporting a religious festival) assigned to one of the richest men of the community. If a man thought he had been assigned the liturgy unfairly, because there was a richer man able to undertake it, he could bring a lawsuit either to exchange his property with the other man’s or to shift the burden of the liturgy to the richer man. Since Athenians had to represent themselves in court rather than hiring lawyers, it was essential that rich men learn to speak well in order to defend their property; if they could not do so, they would be at the mercy of anyone who wanted to extort money from them. While this made the teachings of Protagoras extremely valuable, it also led a certain conservative faction (for example, the comic playwright Aristophanes) to distrust him, in the same way that people now might distrust a slick lawyer.
Protagoras’ doctrines can be divided into three groups:
Perhaps because the practical side of his teaching was concerned with helping students learn to speak well in the courtroom, Protagoras was interested in “orthoepeia” (the correct use of words). Later sources describe him as one of the first to write on grammar (in the modern sense of syntax) and he seems interested in the correct meaning of words, a specialty often associated with another sophist, Prodicus, as well. In the Protagoras, the Platonic dialogue named after the famous sophist which has both Protagoras and Prodicus as participants, Protagoras is shown interpreting a poem of Simonides, with special concern for the issue of the relationship between the writer’s intent and the literal meanings of the words. This method of interpretation was one which would be especially useful in interpreting laws and other written witnesses (contracts, wills, and so forth) in the courtroom. Unfortunately, we don’t have any actual writings by Protagoras on the topic.
Of the book titles we have attributed to Protagoras, only two, “Truth” (or “Refutations”) and “On the Gods” are probably accurate. Of Protagoras’ works, only a few brief quotations embedded in the works of later authors have survived. (The quotations of and reports about Protagoras below are referred to by their ‘Diels-Kranz,’ or ‘DK’ number, the usual way of referring to such fragments and testimonia. The Diels-Kranz numbering system is explained here.) Of Protagoras’ ipsissima verba (actual words, as opposed to paraphrases), the most famous is the homo-mensura (man-measure) statement (DK80b1): “Of all things the measure is man, of the things that are, that [or "how"] they are, and of things that are not, that [or "how"] they are not.” This precise meaning of this statement, like that of any short extract taken out of context, is far from obvious, although the long discussion of it in Plato’s Theaetetus gives us some sense of how ancient Greek audiences interpreted it. The test case normally used is temperature. If Ms. X. says “it is hot,” then the statement (unless she is lying) is true for her. Another person, Ms. Y, may simultaneously claim “it is cold.” This statement could also be true for her. If Ms. X normally lives in Alaska and Ms. Y in Florida, the same temperature (e. g. 25 Celsius) may seem hot to one and cool to the other. The measure of hotness or coldness is fairly obviously the individual person. One cannot legitimately tell Ms. X she does not feel hot — she is the only person who can accurately report her own perceptions or sensations. In this case, it is indeed impossible to contradict as Protagoras is held to have said (DK80a19). But what if Ms. Y, in claiming it feels cold, suggests that unless the heat is turned on the pipes will freeze? One might suspect that she has a fever and her judgment is unreliable; the measure may still be the individual person, but it is an unreliable one, like a broken ruler or unbalanced scale. In a modern scientific culture, with a predilection for scientific solutions, we would think of consulting a thermometer to determine the objective truth. The Greek response was to look at the more profound philosophical implications.
Even if the case of whether the pipes will freeze can be solved trivially, the problem of it being simultaneously hot and cold to two women remains interesting. If this cannot be resolved by determining that one has a fever, we are presented with evidence that judgments about qualities are subjective. If this is the case though, it has alarming consequences. Abstractions like truth, beauty, justice, and virtue are also qualities and it would seem that Protagoras’ dictum would lead us to conclude that they too are relative to the individual observer, a conclusion which many conservative Athenians found alarming because of its potential social consequences. If good and bad are merely what seem good and bad to the individual observer, then how can one claim that stealing or adultery or impiety or murder are somehow wrong? Moreover, if something can seem both hot and cold (or good and bad) then both claims, that the thing is hot and that the thing is cold, can be argued for equally well. If adultery is both good and bad (good for one person and bad for another), then one can construct equally valid arguments for and against adultery in general or an individual adulterer. What will make a case triumph in court is not some inherent worth of one side, but the persuasive artistry of the orator. And so, Protagoras claims he is able to “make the worse case the better” (DK80b6). The oratorical skills Protagoras taught thus had potential for promoting what most Athenians considered injustice or immorality.
While the pious might wish to look to the gods to provide absolute moral guidance in the relativistic universe of the Sophistic Enlightenment, that certainty also was cast into doubt by philosophic and sophistic thinkers, who pointed out the absurdity and immorality of the conventional epic accounts of the gods. Protagoras’ prose treatise about the gods began “Concerning the gods, I have no means of knowing whether they exist or not or of what sort they may be. Many things prevent knowledge including the obscurity of the subject and the brevity of human life.” (DK80b4)
As a consequence of Protagoras’ agnosticism and relativism, he may have considered that laws (legislative and judicial) were things which evolved gradually by agreement (brought about by debate in democratic assemblies) and thus could be changed by further debate. This position would imply that there was a difference between the laws of nature and the customs of humans. Although Protagoras himself seemed to respect, and even revere the customs of human justice (as a great achievement), some of the younger followers of Protagoras and the other Older Sophists concluded that the arbitrary nature of human laws and customs implies that they can be ignored at will, a position that was held to be one of the causes of the notorious amorality of such figures as Alcibiades.
Protagoras himself was a fairly traditional and upright moralist. He may have viewed his form of relativism as essentially democratic — allowing people to revise unjust or obsolete laws, defend themselves in court, free themselves from false certainties — but he may equally well have considered rhetoric a way in which the elite could counter the tendencies towards mass rule in the assemblies. Our evidence on this matter is unfortunately minimal.
The consequences of the radical skepticism of the sophistic enlightenment appeared, at least to Plato and Aristophanes, among others, as far from benign. In Aristophanes’ play, the Clouds, a teacher of rhetoric (called Socrates, but with doctrines based to a great degree on those of the Sophists, and possibly directed specifically at Protagoras or his followers) teaches that the gods don’t exist, moral values are not fixed, and how to make the weaker argument appear the stronger. The result is moral chaos — the main characters (Strepsiades and his son Pheidippides) in Clouds are portrayed as learning clever tricks to enable them to cheat their creditors and eventually abandoning all sense of conventional morality (illustrated by Pheidippides beating his father on stage and threatening to beat his mother). Although no one accused Protagoras himself of being anything other than honest — even Plato, who disapproved of his philosophical positions, portrays him as generous, courteous, and upright — his techniques were adopted by various unscrupulous characters in the following generation, giving sophistry the bad name it still has for clever (but fallacious) verbal trickery.
Protagoras’ influence on the history of philosophy has been significant. Historically, it was in response to Protagoras and his fellow sophists that Plato began the search for transcendent forms or knowledge which could somehow anchor moral judgment. Along with the other Older Sophists and Socrates, Protagoras was part of a shift in philosophical focus from the earlier Presocratic tradition of natural philosophy to an interest in human philosophy. He emphasized how human subjectivity determines the way we understand, or even construct, our world, a position which is still an essential part of the modern philosophic tradition.
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Last updated: April 27, 2005 | Originally published: