Psychological egoism is the thesis that we are always deep down motivated by what we perceive to be in our own self-interest. Psychological altruism, on the other hand, is the view that sometimes we can have ultimately altruistic motives. Suppose, for example, that Pam saves Jim from a burning office building. What ultimately motivated her to do this? It would be odd to suggest that it’s ultimately her own benefit that Pam is seeking. After all, she’s risking her own life in the process. But the psychological egoist holds that Pam’s apparently altruistic act is ultimately motivated by the goal to benefit herself, whether she is aware of this or not. Pam might have wanted to gain a good feeling from being a hero, or to avoid social reprimand that would follow had she not helped Jim, or something along these lines.
Several other egoistic views are related to, but distinct from psychological egoism. Unlike ethical egoism, psychological egoism is merely an empirical claim about what kinds of motives we have, not what they ought to be. So, while the ethical egoist claims that being self-interested in this way is moral, the psychological egoist merely holds that this is how we are. Similarly, psychological egoism is not identical to what is often called “psychological hedonism.” Psychological hedonism restricts the range of self-interested motivations to only pleasure and the avoidance of pain. Thus, it is a specific version of psychological egoism.
The story of psychological egoism is rather peculiar. Though it is often discussed, it hasn’t been explicitly held by many major figures in the history of philosophy. It is most often attributed to only Thomas Hobbes (1651) and Jeremy Bentham (1781). Most philosophers explicitly reject the view, largely based on famous arguments from Joseph Butler (1726). Nevertheless, psychological egoism can be seen as a background assumption of several other disciplines, such as psychology and economics. Moreover, some biologists have suggested that the thesis can be supported or rejected directly based on evolutionary theory or work in sociobiology.
While psychological egoism is undoubtedly an empirical claim, there hasn’t always been a substantial body of experimental data that bears on the debate. However, a great deal of empirical work beginning in the late 20th century has largely filled the void. Evidence from biology, neuroscience, and psychology has stimulated a lively interdisciplinary dialogue. Regardless of whether or not the empirical evidence renders a decisive verdict on the debate, it has certainly enriched discussion of the issue.
Psychological egoism is a thesis about motivation, usually with a focus on the motivation of human (intentional) action. It is exemplified in the kinds of descriptions we sometimes give of people’s actions in terms of hidden, ulterior motives. A famous story involving Abraham Lincoln usefully illustrates this (see Rachels 2003, p. 69). Lincoln was allegedly arguing that we are all ultimately self-interested when he suddenly stopped to save a group of piglets from drowning. His interlocutor seized the moment, attempting to point out that Lincoln is a living counter-example to his own theory; Lincoln seemed to be concerned with something other than what he took to be his own well-being. But Lincoln reportedly replied: “I should have had no peace of mind all day had I gone on and left that suffering old sow worrying over those pigs. I did it to get peace of mind, don’t you see?”
The psychological egoist holds that descriptions of our motivation, like Lincoln’s, apply to all of us in every instance. The story illustrates that there are many subtle moves for the defender of psychological egoism to make. So it is important to get a clear idea of the competing egoistic versus altruistic theories and of the terms of the debate between them.
Egoism is often contrasted with altruism. Although the egoism-altruism debate concerns the possibility of altruism in some sense, the ordinary term “altruism” may not track the issue that is of primary interest here. In at least one ordinary use of the term, for someone to act altruistically depends on her being motivated solely by a concern for the welfare of another, without any ulterior motive to simply benefit herself. Altruism here is a feature of the motivation that underlies the action (Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 199). (Another sense of “altruism”—often used in a fairly technical sense in biology—is merely behavioral; see §4a.) To this extent, this ordinary notion of altruism is close to what is of philosophical interest. But there are differences. For instance, ordinarily we seem to only apply the term “altruism” to fairly atypical actions, such as those of great self-sacrifice or heroism. But the debate about psychological egoism concerns the motivations that underlie all of our actions (Nagel 1970/1978, p. 16, n. 1).
Regardless of ordinary terminology, the view philosophers label “psychological egoism” has certain key features. Developing a clear and precise account of the egoism-altruism debate is more difficult than it might seem at first. To make the task easier, we may begin with quite bare and schematic definitions of the positions in the debate (May 2011, p. 27; compare also Rosas 2002, p. 98):
We will use the term “desire” here in a rather broad sense to simply mean a motivational mental state—what we might ordinarily call a “motive” or “reason” in at least one sense of those terms. But what is an “ultimate” desire, and when is it “altruistic” rather than “egoistic”? Answering these and related questions will provide the requisite framework for the debate.
We can begin to add substance to our bare theses by characterizing what it is to have an altruistic versus an egoistic desire. As some philosophers have pointed out, the psychological egoist claims that all of one’s ultimate desires concern oneself in some sense. However, we must make clear that an egoistic desire exclusively concerns one’s own well-being, benefit, or welfare. A malevolent ultimate desire for the destruction of an enemy does not concern oneself, but it is hardly altruistic (Feinberg 1965/1999, §9, p. 497; Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 229).
Similarly, despite its common use in this context, the term “selfish” is not appropriate here either. The psychological egoist claims that we ultimately only care about (what we consider to be) our own welfare, but this needn’t always amount to selfishness. Consider an ultimate desire to take a nap that is well-deserved and won’t negatively affect anyone. While this concerns one’s own benefit, there is no sense in which it is selfish (Henson 1988, §7; Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 227). The term “self-interest” is more fitting.
With these points in mind, we can characterize egoistic and altruistic desires in the following way:
It’s important that the desire in some sense represents the person as oneself (or, as the case may be, as another). For example, suppose that John wants to help put out a fire in the hair of a man who appears to be in front of him, but he doesn’t know that he’s actually looking into a mirror, and it’s his own hair that’s ablaze. If John’s desire is ultimate and is simply to help the man with his hair in flames, then it is necessary to count his desire as concerning someone other than himself, even though he is in fact the man with his hair on fire (Oldenquist 1980, pp. 27-8; Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 214).
The reason for the focus on ultimate desires is that psychological egoists don’t deny that we often have desires that are altruistic. They do claim, however, that all such altruistic desires ultimately depend on an egoistic desire that is more basic. In other words, we have an ulterior motive when we help others—one that likely tends to fly below the radar of consciousness or introspection.
Thus, we must draw a common philosophical distinction between desires that are for a means to an end and desires for an end in itself. Instrumental desires are those desires one has for something as a means for something else; ultimate desires are those desires one has for something as an end in itself, not as a means to something else (see Sober & Wilson 1998, pp. 217-222). The former are often called “extrinsic desires” and the latter “intrinsic desires” (see e.g. Mele 2003 Ch. 1.8.). Desires for pleasure and the avoidance of pain are paradigmatic ultimate desires, since people often desire these as ends in themselves, not as a mere means to anything else. But the class of ultimate desires may include much more than this.
There are two important aspects to highlight regarding how psychological egoism and altruism relate to one another. First, psychological egoism makes a stronger, universal claim that all of our ultimate desires are egoistic, while psychological altruism merely makes the weaker claim that some of our ultimate desires are altruistic. Thus, the former is a monistic thesis, while the latter is a pluralistic thesis (Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 228). Consequently, psychological egoism is easier to refute than the opposing view. If one were to successfully demonstrate that some—even just one—of a person’s ultimate desires are altruistic, then we can safely reject psychological egoism. For example, if Thomas removes his heel from another’s gouty toe because he has an ultimate desire that the person benefit from it, then psychological egoism is false.
Second, the positions in the debate are not exactly the denial of one another, provided there are desires that are neither altruistic nor egoistic (Stich, Doris, & Roedder 2010, sect. 2). To take an example from Bernard Williams, a “madman” might have an ultimate desire for “a chimpanzees’ tea party to be held in the cathedral” (1973, p. 263). He does not desire this as a means to some other end, such as enjoyment at the sight of such a spectacle (he might, for example, secure this in his will for after his death). Assuming the desire for such a tea party is neither altruistic nor egoistic (because it doesn’t have to do with anyone’s well-being), would it settle the egoism-altruism debate? Not entirely. It would show that psychological egoism is false, since it would demonstrate that some of our ultimate desires are not egoistic. However, it would not show that psychological altruism is true, since it does not show that some of our ultimate desires are altruistic. Likewise, suppose that psychological altruism is false because none of our ultimate desires concern the benefit of others. If that is true, psychological egoism is not thereby true. It too could be false if we sometimes have ultimate desires that are not egoistic, like the madman’s. The point is that the theses are contraries: they cannot both be true, but they can both be false.
Philosophers don’t have much sympathy for psychological egoism. Indeed, the only major figures in the history of philosophy to endorse the view explicitly are arguably Thomas Hobbes and Jeremy Bentham. Some might also include Aristotle (compare Feinberg 1965/1999, p. 501) and John Stuart Mill (compare Sidgwick 1874/1907, 126.96.36.199), but there is some room for interpreting them otherwise. Hobbes explicitly states in Leviathan (1651/1991):
…no man giveth but with intention of good to himself, because gift is voluntary; and of all voluntary acts, the object is to every man his own good; of which, if men see they shall be frustrated, there will be no beginning of benevolence or trust, nor consequently of mutual help. (Ch. XV, p. 47)
In a similar vein, Bentham famously opens his Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation (1781/1991) with this:
Nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain and pleasure. It is for them alone to point out what we ought to do, as well as to determine what we shall do. On the one hand the standard of right and wrong, on the other the chain of causes and effects, are fastened to their throne. (p. 313)
Here Bentham appears to endorse a specific version of psychological egoism, namely psychological hedonism. This view restricts the kind of self-interest we can ultimately desire to pleasure or the avoidance of pain. Unfortunately, Hobbes and Bentham don’t offer much in the way of arguments for these views; they tend to just assume them.
One tempting argument for psychological egoism is based on what seem to be conceptual truths about (intentional) action. For example, many hold that all of one’s actions are motivated by one’s own desires. This might seem to directly support psychological egoism because it shows that we are all out to satisfy our own desires (compare Hobbes). In his famous Fifteen Sermons, Bishop Butler (1726/1991) anticipates such an argument for the universality of egoistic desires (or “self-love”) in the following manner:
[B]ecause every particular affection is a man’s own, and the pleasure arising from its gratification his own pleasure, or pleasure to himself, such particular affection must be called self-love; according to this way of speaking, no creature whatever can possibly act but merely from self-love. (Sermon XI, p. 366)
However, as Butler goes on to say, this line of argument rests on a mistake or at least a play on words. Many philosophers have subsequently reinforced Butler’s objection, often pointing to two intertwined confusions: one based on our desires being ours, another based on equivocation on the word “satisfaction.” On the former confusion, C. D. Broad says “it is true that all impulses belong to a self” but “it is not true that the object of any of them is the general happiness of the self who owns them” (1930/2000, p. 65).
Similarly, the second confusion fails to distinguish between what Bernard Williams calls “desiring the satisfaction of one’s desire” and “desiring one’s own satisfaction” (1973, p. 261). The word “satisfaction” in the latter case is the more ordinary use involving one’s own pleasure or happiness. If all actions are motivated by a desire for this, then psychological egoism is indeed established. But the basic consideration from the theory of action we began with was merely that all actions are motivated by a desire of one’s own, which is meant to be satisfied. However, this employs a different notion of satisfaction, which merely means that the person got what she wanted (Feinberg 1965/1999, p. 496). The claim that everyone is out to satisfy their own desires is a fairly uninteresting one, since it doesn’t show that we are motivated by self-interest. If Mother Teresa did have an altruistic desire for the benefit of another, it is no count against her that she sought to satisfy it—that is, bring about the benefit of another. This argument for psychological egoism, then, seems to rely on an obviously false view of self-interest as desire-satisfaction.
A major theoretical attraction of psychological egoism is parsimony. It provides a simple account of human motivation and offers a unified explanation of all our actions. Although actions may vary in content, the ultimate source is self-interest: doing well at one’s job is merely to gain the favor of one’s boss; returning a wallet is merely to avoid the pang of guilt that would follow keeping it; saying “thank you” for a meal is merely to avoid social reprimand for failing to conform to etiquette; and so on.
One might dispute whether psychological egoism is any more parsimonious than psychological altruism (Sober & Wilson 1998, pp. 292-3). More importantly, however, it is no argument for a view that it is simpler than its competitors. Perhaps we might employ Ockham’s Razor as a sort of tie-breaker to adjudicate between two theories when they are equal in all other respects, but this involves more than just simplicity (Sober & Wilson 1998, pp. 293-5). As David Hume puts it, psychological egoism shouldn’t be based solely on “that love of simplicity which has been the source of much false reasoning in philosophy” (1751/1998, p. 166). The heart of the debate then is whether there are other reasons to prefer one view over the other.
Perhaps the psychological egoist needn’t appeal to parsimony or erroneous conceptions of self-interest. Bentham, after all, suggests that ordinary experience shows that we are ultimately motivated to gain pleasure or avoid pain (1781/1991, Ch. 3). Perhaps one could extrapolate an argument on behalf of psychological egoism along the following lines (Feinberg 1965/1999, sect. 4, p. 495). Experience shows that people must be taught to care for others with carrots and sticks—with reward and punishment. So seemingly altruistic ultimate desires are merely instrumental to egoistic ones; we come to believe that we must be concerned with the interests of others in order to gain rewards and avoid punishment for ourselves (compare the argument in §5a).
This line of reasoning is rather difficult to evaluate given that it rests on an empirical claim about moral development and learning. Ordinary experience does show that sometimes it’s necessary to impose sanctions on children for them to be nice and caring. But even if this occurs often, it doesn’t support a universal claim that it always does. Moreover, there is a growing body of evidence gathered by developmental psychologists indicating that young children have a natural, unlearned concern for others. There is some evidence, for example, that children as young as 14-months will spontaneously help a person they believe is in need (Warneken & Tomasello 2007). It seems implausible that children have learned at such a young age that this behavior will be benefit themselves. On the other hand, such empirical results do not necessarily show that the ultimate motivation behind such action is altruistic. The psychological egoist could argue that we still possess ultimately egoistic desires (perhaps we are simply born believing that concern for others will benefit oneself). However, the developmental evidence still undermines the moral education argument by indicating that our concern for the welfare others is not universally learned from birth by sanctions of reward and punishment.
Another argument for psychological egoism relies on the idea that we often blur our conception of ourselves and others when we are benevolent. Consider the paradigm of apparently selfless motivation: concern for family, especially one’s children. Francis Hutcheson anticipates the objection when he imagines a psychological egoist proclaiming: “Children are not only made of our bodies, but resemble us in body and mind; they are rational agents as we are, and we only love our own likeness in them” (1725/1991, p. 279, Raphael sect. 327). And this might seem to be supported by recent empirical research. After all, social psychologists have discovered that we tend to feel more empathy for others we perceive to be in need when they are similar to us in various respects and when we take on their perspective (Batson 1991; see §5b). In fact, some psychologists have endorsed precisely this sort of self-other merging argument for an egoistic view (for example, Cialdini, Brown, Lewis, Luce, and Neuberg 1997).
One might doubt, however, whether a self-other merging account is able to explain helping behavior in an egoistic way. For example, it would be quite implausible to say that we literally believe we exist in two different bodies when feeling empathy for someone. The most credible reading of the proposal is that we conceptually blur the distinction between ourselves and others in the relevant cases. Yet this would seem to require, contrary to fact, that our behavior reflects this blurring. If we think of the boundary between ourselves and another as indeterminate, presumably our helping behavior would reflect such indeterminacy. (For further discussion, see Hutcheson 1725/1991, pp. 279-80; Batson 2011, ch. 6; May 2011.)
Considering the arguments, the case for psychological egoism seems rather weak. But is there anything to be said directly against it? This section examines some of the most famous arguments philosophers have proposed against the view.
Bishop Joseph Butler provides a famous argument against psychological hedonism in his Fifteen Sermons. The key passage is the following:
That all particular appetites and passions are towards external things themselves, distinct from the pleasure arising from them, is manifested from hence; that there could not be this pleasure, were it not for that prior suitableness between the object and the passion: there could be no enjoyment or delight from one thing more than another, from eating food more than from swallowing a stone, if there were not an affection or appetite to one thing more than another. (1726/1991, Sermon XI, p. 365)
Elliott Sober and David Sloan Wilson (1998) have dubbed this argument “Butler’s stone.” And many philosophers have championed it. Broad (1930/2000), for example, writes that Butler “killed the theory [of psychological egoism] so thoroughly that he sometimes seems to the modern reader to be flogging dead horses” (p. 55).
Butler’s crucial claim is this: the experience of pleasure upon attaining some external thing presupposes a desire for the thing attained. This is then meant to entail that the pleasure that accompanies the fulfillment of our desires is a mere by-product of our prior desire for the thing that gave us pleasure. According to Sober and Wilson (1998, p. 278), the structure of Butler’s stone argument is this:
The idea is that pleasure can’t be our universal concern because it presupposes a desire for something other than pleasure itself.
Many philosophers have endorsed this argument as sound, or proposed their own Butler-style arguments, not only against psychological hedonism but more generally against psychological egoism (Hume 1751/1998, App. 2.12; Broad 1950/1952; Nagel 1970/1978, p. 80, n. 1; Feinberg 1965/1999, pp. 496-7). The argument can be extended by modifying the key claim to something like the following: the self-benefit we gain upon helping another presupposes a desire for that person’s well-being. Sober and Wilson, however, make the case that such arguments are seriously flawed because “the conclusion does not follow from the premises” and “the second premises is false” (1998, p. 278).
We can doubt the truth of the second premise for several reasons. First, certain pleasures or pains seem intrinsically pleasurable or painful. For example, the taste of sugar seems pleasant in itself, regardless of what we think or want (Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 279). Second, as Sidgwick puts it, Butler has “certainly over-stated his case” (1874/1907, 188.8.131.52), since there seem to be at least some ultimate desires for pleasure or the elimination of pain—ones that do not presuppose a desire for some other thing. Relief from a headache is a perfect example (Sober & Wilson 1998, pp. 356-7, n. 1). Similar points hold for any version of the argument extending to the broader thesis of psychological egoism relying on claims about self-benefit in general rather than pleasure.
More importantly, Sober and Wilson also argue that Butler’s stone argument has bad form; it fails to establish the conclusion even if the premises were both true. The key problem is that presupposition arguments tell us nothing about which desires are ultimate. Even if the experience of pleasure always presupposes a desire for the pleasurable object, it is still left open whether the desire for the object is merely instrumental to a desire for pleasure. Consider the following causal chain, using “→” to mean “caused” (see Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 278):
Desire for food → Eating → Pleasure
According to Butler, the experience of pleasure upon eating some food allows us to infer the existence of a desire for food. This is all the argument gets us. Yet Butler’s opponent, the psychological hedonist, maintains that the desire for food is subsequent to and dependent on an ultimate desire for pleasure:
Ultimate desire for pleasure → Desire for food → Eating → Pleasure
This egoistic picture is entirely compatible with Butler’s claims about presupposition. So, even if the premises are true, it does not follow that psychological egoism is false.
Perhaps Butler and company could assert a stronger presupposition claim as the second premise so that the argument has proper form. While we’re at it, let us generalize the argument to lead to the conclusion of the falsity of psychological egoism, by focusing on benefit generally rather than pleasure in particular. This yields a generalized presupposition argument against psychological egoism as follows:
The key idea is that benefiting from helping another always presupposes a desire for the thing that caused the benefit (namely, helping the other).
However, this generalized argument against egoism suffers from multiple problems. First, it leaves the second premise even more doubtful, since surely we can sometimes ultimately desire our own benefit while the benefit of another is merely a side-effect. In fact, this argument seeks to establish too much—namely, that we can never have egoistic ultimate desires. This precludes the pluralistic thesis that psychological altruism enshrines, which forces Butler-style opponents of egoism to likewise hold a strong, universal claim. Second, this generalized argument is arguably question begging. The second premise seems to amount to nothing more than the denial of psychological egoism: sometimes when people desire to benefit themselves, this is because they had an ultimate desire for something other than the benefit. At the very least, the argument is dialectically unhelpful—it offers premises in support of the conclusion that are as controversial as the conclusion is, and for similar reasons.
Still, a general moral can clearly be gained from arguments like Butler’s. Psychological egoists cannot establish their view simply by pointing to the pleasure or self-benefit that accompanies so many actions. After all, often self-benefit only seems to be what we ultimately desire, though a closer look reveals benefits like pleasure are likely just by-products while the ultimate desire is for that which generates them. As Hume puts it, sometimes “we are impelled immediately to seek particular objects, such as fame or power, or vengeance without any regard to interest; and when these objects are attained a pleasing enjoyment ensues, as the consequence of our indulged affections” (1751/1998, App. 2.12, emphasis added).
A simple argument against psychological egoism is that it seems obviously false. As Francis Hutcheson proclaims: “An honest farmer will tell you, that he studies the preservation and happiness of his children, and loves them without any design of good to himself” (1725/1991, p. 277, Raphael sect. 327). Likewise, Hume rhetorically asks, “What interest can a fond mother have in view, who loses her health by assiduous attendance on her sick child, and afterwards languishes and dies of grief, when freed, by its death, from the slavery of that attendance?” (1751/1998, App. 2.9, p. 167). Building on this observation, Hume takes the “most obvious objection” to psychological egoism to be that:
…as it is contrary to common feeling and our most unprejudiced notions, there is required the highest stretch of philosophy to establish so extraordinary a paradox. To the most careless observer there appear to be such dispositions as benevolence and generosity; such affections as love, friendship, compassion, gratitude. […] And as this is the obvious appearance of things, it must be admitted, till some hypothesis be discovered, which by penetrating deeper into human nature, may prove the former affections to be nothing but modifications of the latter. (1751/1998, App. 2.6, p. 166)
Here Hume is offering a burden-shifting argument. The idea is that psychological egoism is implausible on its face, offering strained accounts of apparently altruistic actions. So the burden of proof is on the egoist to show us why we should believe the view; yet the attempts so far have “hitherto proved fruitless,” according to Hume (1751/1998, App. 2.6, p. 166). Similarly, C. D. Broad (1950/1952) and Bernard Williams (1973, pp. 262-3) consider various examples of actions that seem implausible to characterize as ultimately motivated by self-interest.
Given the arguments, it is still unclear why we should consider psychological egoism to be obviously untrue. One might appeal to introspection or common sense; but neither is particularly powerful. First, the consensus among psychologists is that a great number of our mental states, even our motives, are not accessible to consciousness or cannot reliably be reported on through the use of introspection (see, for example, Nisbett and Wilson 1977). While introspection, to some extent, may be a decent source of knowledge of our own minds, it is fairly suspect to reject an empirical claim about potentially unconscious motivations. Besides, one might report universally egoistic motives based on introspection (e.g. Mercer 2001, pp. 229-30). Second, shifting the burden of proof based on common sense is rather limited. Sober and Wilson (1998, p. 288) go so far as to say that we have “no business taking common sense at face value” in the context of an empirical hypothesis. Even if we disagree with their claim and allow a larger role for shifting burdens of proof via common sense, it still may have limited use, especially when the common sense view might be reasonably cast as supporting either position in the egoism-altruism debate. Here, instead of appeals to common sense, it would be of greater use to employ more secure philosophical arguments and rigorous empirical evidence.
Another popular complaint about psychological egoism is that it seems to be immune to empirical refutation; it is “unfalsifiable.” And this is often taken to be a criterion for an empirical theory: any view that isn’t falsifiable isn’t a genuine, credible scientific theory (see Karl Popper’s Falsificationism). The worry for psychological egoism is that it will fail to meet this criterion if any commonly accepted altruistic action can be explained away as motivated by some sort of self-interest. Joel Feinberg, for example, writes:
Until we know what they [psychological egoists] would count as unselfish behavior, we can’t very well know what they mean when they say that all voluntary behavior is selfish. And at this point we may suspect that they are holding their theory in a “privileged position”—that of immunity to evidence, that they would allow no conceivable behavior to count as evidence against it. What they say then, if true, must be true in virtue of the way they define—or redefine—the word “selfish.” And in that case, it cannot be an empirical hypothesis. (1965/1999, §18, p. 503; see also §§14-19)
As we have seen (§1b), psychological egoism needn’t hold that all our ultimate desires are selfish. But Feinberg’s point is that we need to know what would count as empirical evidence against the existence of an egoistic ultimate desire.
This objection to psychological egoism has three substantial problems. First, falsification criteria for empirical theories are problematic and have come under heavy attack. In addition it’s unclear why we should think the view is false. Perhaps it is a bad scientific theory or a view we shouldn’t care much about, but it is not thereby false. Second, any problems that afflict psychological egoism on this front will also apply to the opposing view (Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 290). After all, psychological altruism is a pluralistic thesis that includes both egoistic and altruistic motives. Third, and most importantly, a charitable construal of psychological egoism renders it falsifiable. As we have seen, psychological egoists have a clear account of what would falsify it: an ultimate desire that is not egoistic. While it may be difficult to detect the ultimate motives of people, the view is in principle falsifiable. In fact, it is empirically testable, as we shall see below.
Another popular objection to various forms of psychological egoism is often called “the paradox of hedonism,” which was primarily popularized by Henry Sidgwick (1874/1907, 184.108.40.206). It is usually directed at psychological hedonism, but the problem can be extended to psychological egoism generally.
When the target is only hedonism, the “paradox” is that we tend to attain more pleasure by focusing on things other than pleasure. Likewise, when directed at egoism generally, the idea is that we will tend not to benefit ourselves by focusing on our own benefit. Consider someone, Jones, who is ultimately concerned with his own well-being, not the interests of others (the example is adapted from Feinberg 1965/1999, p. 498, sect. 11). Two things will seemingly hold: (a) such a person would eventually lack friends, close relationships, etc. and (b) this will lead to much unhappiness. This seems problematic for a theory that says all of our ultimate desires are for our own well-being.
Despite its popularity, this sort of objection to psychological egoism is quite questionable. There are several worries about the premises of the argument, such as the claim that ultimate concern for oneself diminishes one’s own well-being (see Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 280). Most importantly, the paradox is only potentially an issue for a version of egoism that prescribes ultimate concern for oneself, such as normative egoism (Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 280). The futility of ultimate concern for oneself can only undermine claims such as “We should only ultimately care about our own well-being” since this allegedly would not lead to happiness. But psychological egoism is a descriptive thesis. Even if egoistic ultimate desires lead to unhappiness, that would only show that egoistically motivated people will find this unfortunate.
Despite its widespread rejection among philosophers, philosophical arguments against psychological egoism aren’t overwhelmingly powerful. However, the theses in this debate are ultimately empirical claims about human motivation. So we can also look to more empirical disciplines, such as biology and psychology, to advance the debate. Biology in particular contains an abundance of literature on altruism. But, as we will see, much of it is rather tangential to the thesis of psychological altruism.
The ordinary (psychological) sense of “altruism” is different from altruism as discussed in biology. For example, sociobiologists, such as E. O. Wilson, often theorize about the biological basis of altruism by focusing on the behavior of non-human animals. But this is altruism only in the sense of helpful behavior that seems to be at some cost to the helper. It says nothing about the motivations for such behavior, which is of interest to us here. Similarly, “altruism” is a label commonly used in a technical sense as a problem for evolutionary theory (see Altruism and Group Selection). What we might separately label evolutionary altruism occurs whenever an organism “reduces its own fitness and augments the fitness of others” regardless of the motivation behind it (Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 199). Distinguishing the psychological sense of “altruism” from other uses of the term is crucial if we are to look to biology to contribute to the debate on ultimate desires.
Given the multiple uses of terms, discussion of altruism and self-interest in evolutionary theory can often seem directly relevant to the psychological egoism-altruism debate. One might think, for example, that basic facts about evolution show we’re motivated by self-interest. Consider our desire for water. We have this perhaps solely because it enhanced the evolutionary “fitness” of our ancestors, by helping them stay alive and thus to propagate their genes. And evolutionary theory plausibly uncovers this sort of gene-centered story for many features of organisms. Richard Dawkins offers us some ideas of this sort. Although he emphasizes that the term “selfish,” as he applies it to genes, is merely metaphorical, he says “we have the power to defy the selfish genes of our birth… let us try to teach generosity and altruism because we are born selfish (1976/2006, p. 3).
But we should be careful not to let the self-centered origin of our traits overshadow the traits themselves. Even if all of our desires are due to evolutionary adaptations (which is a strong claim), this is only the origin of them. Consider again the desire for water. It might exist only because it can help propagate one’s genes, but the desire is still for water, not to propagate one’s genes (compare the Genetic Fallacy). As Simon Blackburn points out, “Dawkins is following a long tradition in implying that biology carries simple messages for understanding the sociology and psychology of human beings” (1998, p. 146). To be fair, in a later edition of The Selfish Gene, Dawkins recognizes his folly and asks the reader to ignore such “rogue” sentences (p. ix). In any event, we must avoid what Blackburn polemically calls the “biologist’s fallacy” of “inferring the ‘true’ psychology of the person from the fact that his or her genes have proved good at replicating over time” (p. 147). The point is that we must avoid simple leaps from biology to psychology without substantial argument (see also Stich et al. 2010, sect. 3).
Philosopher Elliott Sober and biologist David Sloan Wilson (1998) have made careful and sophisticated arguments for the falsity of psychological egoism directly from considerations in evolutionary biology. Their contention is the following: “‘Natural selection is unlikely to have given us purely egoistic motives” (p. 12). To establish this, they focus on parental care, an other-regarding behavior in humans, whose mechanism is plausibly due to natural selection. Assuming such behavior is mediated by what the organism believes and desires, we can inquire into the kinds of mental mechanisms that could have evolved. The crucial question becomes: Is it more likely that such a mechanism for parental care would, as psychological egoism holds, involve only egoistic ultimate desires? To answer this question, Sober and Wilson focus on just one version of egoism, and what they take to be the most difficult to refute: psychological hedonism (p. 297). The hedonistic mechanism always begins with the ultimate desire for pleasure and the avoidance of pain. The mechanism consistent with psychological altruism, however, is pluralistic: some ultimate desires are hedonistic, but others are altruistic.
According to Sober and Wilson, there are three main factors that could affect the likelihood that a mechanism evolved: availability, reliability, and energetic efficiency (pp. 305-8). First, the genes that give rise to the mechanism must be available in the pool for selection. Second, the mechanism mustn’t conflict with the organism’s reproductive fitness; they must reliably produce the relevant fitness-enhancing outcome (such as viability of offspring). And third, they must do this efficiently, without yielding a significant cost to the organism’s own fitness-enhancing resources. Sober and Wilson find no reason to believe that a hedonistic mechanism would be more or less available or energetically efficient. The key difference, they contend, is reliability: “Pluralism was just as available as hedonism, it was more reliable, and hedonism provides no advantage in terms of energetic efficiency” (p. 323).
Sober and Wilson make several arguments for the claim that the pluralistic mechanism is more reliable. But one key disadvantage of a hedonistic mechanism, they argue, is that it’s heavily “mediated by beliefs” (p. 314). For example, in order to produce parental care given the ultimate desire for pleasure, one must believe that helping one’s child will provide one with sufficient pleasure over competing alternative courses of action:
(Ultimate) Desire for Pleasure → Believe Helping Provides Most Pleasure → Desire to Help…
Moreover, such beliefs must be true, otherwise it’s likely the instrumental desire to help will eventually extinguish, and then the fitness-enhancing outcome of parental care won’t occur. The pluralistic model, however, is comparatively less complicated since it can just deploy an ultimate desire to help:
(Ultimate) Desire to Help…
Since the pluralistic mechanism doesn’t rely on as many beliefs, it is less susceptible to lack of available evidence for maintaining them. So yielding the fitness-enhancing outcome of parental care will be less vulnerable to disruption. Sober and Wilson (p. 314) liken the hedonistic mechanism to a Rube Goldberg machine, partly because it accomplishes its goal through overly complex means. Each link in the chain is susceptible to error, which makes the mechanism less reliable at yielding the relevant outcome.
Such arguments have not gone undisputed (see, for example, Stich et al. 2010, sect. 3). Yet they still provide a sophisticated way to connect evolutionary considerations with psychological egoism. In the next section we’ll consider more direct ways for addressing the egoism-altruism debate empirically.
Psychological egoism is an empirical claim; however, considerations from biology provide only one route to addressing the egoism-altruism debate empirically. Another, perhaps more direct, approach is to examine empirical work on the mind itself.
In the 20th century, one of the earliest philosophical discussions of egoism as it relates to research in psychology comes from Michael Slote (1964). He argues that there is at least potentially a basis for psychological egoism in behavioristic theories of learning, championed especially by psychologists such as B. F. Skinner. Slote writes that such theories “posit a certain number of basically ‘selfish,’ unlearned primary drives or motives (like hunger, thirst, sleep, elimination, and sex), and explain all other, higher-order drives or motives as derived genetically from the primary ones via certain ‘laws of reinforcement’” (p. 530). This theory importantly makes the additional claim that the “higher-order” motives, including altruistic ones, are not “functionally autonomous.” That is, they are merely instrumental to (“functionally dependent” on) the egoistic ultimate desires. According to Slote, the basic support for functional dependence is the following: If “we cut off all reinforcement of [the instrumental desire] by primary rewards (rewards of primary [egoistic] drives),” then the altruistic desire “actually does extinguish” (p. 531). Thus, all altruistic desires are merely instrumental to ultimately egoistic ones; we have merely learned through conditioning that benefiting others benefits ourselves. That, according to Slote, is what the behavioristic learning theory maintains.
Like the moral education argument, Slote’s is vulnerable to work in developmental psychology indicating that some prosocial behavior is not conditioned (see §2c). Moreover, behavioristic approaches throughout psychology have been widely rejected in the wake of the “cognitive revolution.” Learning theorists now recognize mechanisms that go quite beyond the tools of behaviorism (beyond mere classical and operant conditioning). Slote does only claim to have established the following highly qualified thesis: “It would seem, then, that, as psychology stands today, there is at least some reason to think that the psychological theory we have been discussing may be true” (p. 537); and he appears to reject psychological egoism in his later work. In any event, more recent empirical research is more apt and informative to this debate.
Philosopher Carolyn Morillo (1990) has defended a version of psychological hedonism based on more recent neuroscientific work primarily done on rats. Morillo argues for a “strongly monistic” theory of motivation that is grounded in “internal reward events,” which holds that “we [ultimately] desire these reward events because we find them to be intrinsically satisfying” (p. 173). The support for her claim is primarily evidence that the “reward center” of the brain, which is the spring of motivation, is the same as the “pleasure center,” which indicates that the basic reward driving action is pleasure.
Morillo admits though that the idea is “highly speculative” and based on “empirical straws in the wind.” Furthermore, philosopher Timothy Schroeder (2004) argues that later work in neuroscience casts serious doubt on the identification of the reward event with pleasure. In short, by manipulating rats’ brains, neuroscientist Kent Berridge and colleagues have provided substantial evidence that being motivated to get something is entirely separable from “liking” it (that is, from its generating pleasure). Against Morillo, Schroeder concludes that the data are better explained by the hypothesis that the reward center of the brain “can indirectly activate the pleasure center than by the hypothesis that either is such a center” (p. 81, emphasis added; see also Schroeder, Roskies, and Nichols 2010, pp. 105-6.)
Other empirical work that bears on the existence of altruistic motives can be found in the study of empathy-induced helping behavior. Beginning around the 1980s, C. Daniel Batson and other social psychologists addressed the debate head on by examining such phenomena. Batson (1991; 2011), in particular, argues that the experiments conducted provide evidence for an altruistic model, the empathy-altruism hypothesis, which holds that as “empathic feeling for a person in need increases, altruistic motivation to have that person’s need relieved increases” (1991, p. 72). In other words, the hypothesis states that empathy tends to induce in us ultimate desires for the well-being of someone other than ourselves. If true, this entails that psychological egoism is false.
Batson comes to this conclusion by concentrating on a robust effect of empathy on helping behavior discovered in the 1970s. The empathy-helping relationship is the finding that the experience of relatively high empathy for another perceived to be in need causes people to help the other more than relatively low empathy. However, as Batson recognizes, this doesn’t establish psychological altruism, because it doesn’t specify whether the ultimate desire is altruistic or egoistic. Given that there can be both egoistic and altruistic explanations of the empathy-helping relationship, Batson and others have devised experiments to test them.
The general experimental approach involves placing ordinary people in situations in which they have an opportunity to help someone they think is in need while manipulating other variables in the situation. The purpose is to provide circumstances in which egoistic versus altruistic explanations of empathy-induced helping behavior make different predictions about what people will do. Different hypotheses then provide either egoistic or altruistic explanations of why the subjects ultimately chose to help or offer to help. (For detailed discussions of the background assumptions involved here, see Batson 1991, pp. 64-67; Sober & Wilson 1998, Ch. 6; Stich, Doris, and Roedder 2010.)
Several egoistic explanations of the empathy-helping relationship are in competition with the empathy-altruism hypothesis. Each one claims that experiences of relatively high empathy (“empathic arousal”) causes subjects to help simply because it induces an egoistic ultimate desire; the desire to help the other is solely instrumental to the ultimate desire to benefit oneself. However, the experiments seem to rule out all the plausible (and some rather implausible) egoistic explanations. For example, if those feeling higher amounts of empathy help only because they want to reduce the discomfort of the situation, then they should help less frequently when they know their task is over and they can simply leave the experiment without helping. Yet this prediction has been repeatedly disconfirmed (Batson 1991, ch. 8). A host of experiments have similarly disconfirmed a range of egoistic hypotheses. The cumulative results evidently show that the empathy-helping relationship is not put in place by egoistic ultimate desires to either:
Furthermore, according to Batson, the data all conform to the empathy-altruism hypothesis, which claims that empathic arousal induces an ultimate desire for the person in need to be helped (see Batson 1991; for a relatively brief review, see Batson & Shaw 1991).
Some have argued against Batson that there are plausible egoistic explanations not ruled out by the data collected thus far (e.g. Cialdini et al. 1997; Sober & Wilson 1998, Ch. 8; Stich, Doris, and Roedder 2010). However, many egoistic explanations have been tested along similar lines and appear to be disconfirmed. While Batson admits that more studies can and should be done on this topic, he ultimately concludes that we are at least tentatively justified in believing that the empathy-altruism hypothesis is true. Thus, he contends that psychological egoism is false: ”Contrary to the beliefs of Hobbes, La Rochefoucauld, Mandeville, and virtually all psychologists, altruistic concern for the welfare of others is within the human repertoire” (1991, p. 174).
It seems philosophical arguments against psychological egoism aren’t quite as powerful as we might expect given the widespread rejection of the theory among philosophers. So the theory is arguably more difficult to refute than many have tended to suppose. It is important to keep in mind, however, that the theory makes a rather strong, universal claim that all of our ultimate desires are egoistic, making it easy to cast doubt on such a view given that it takes only one counter-example to refute it.
Another important conclusion is that empirical work can contribute to the egoism-altruism debate. There is now a wealth of data emerging in various disciplines that addresses this fascinating and important debate about the nature of human motivation. While some have argued that the jury is still out, it is clear that the rising interdisciplinary dialogue is both welcome and constructive. Perhaps with the philosophical and empirical arguments taken together we can declare substantial progress.
University of Alabama at Birmingham
U. S. A.
Last updated: October 2, 2011 | Originally published: