Pudgalavāda Buddhist Philosophy
The Pudgalavāda was a group of five of the Early Schools of Buddhism. The name arises from their adherents’ distinctive doctrine (vāda) concerning the self or person (pudgala). The doctrine holds that the person, in a certain sense, is real. To other Buddhists, their view seemed to contradict a fundamental tenet of Buddhism, the doctrine of non-self. However, the Pudgalavādins were convinced that they had had preserved the true interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching.
Although now all but forgotten, the Pudgalavāda was one of the dominant traditions of Buddhism in India during the time that Buddhism survived there. It was never strong in other parts of Asia, however, and with the eventual disappearance of Buddhism in India, almost all of the literature of the Pudgalavāda was lost. It is difficult to reconstruct their understanding of the self from the few Chinese translations that have come down to us, and from the summaries of their doctrines and the critiques of their position that have been preserved by other Buddhist schools. But there is no doubt that they affirmed the reality of the self or person, and that with scriptural authority they held that the self of an enlightened one cannot be described as non-existent after death, in “complete Nirvana” (Parinirvana), even though the five “aggregates” which are the basis of its identity have then passed away without any possibility of recurrence in a further life. These five are material form, feeling, ideation, mental forces, and consciousness.
It seems, then, that they thought of some aspect or dimension of the self as transcending the aggregates and may have identified that aspect with Nirvana, which like most early Buddhists they regarded as an eternal reality. In its involvement with the aggregates through successive lives, the self could be seen as characterized by incessant change; but in its eternal aspect, it could be seen as having an identity that remains constant through all its lives until it fulfils itself in the impersonal happiness of Parinirvana. Although their account of the self seemed unorthodox and irrational to their Buddhist opponents, the Pudgalavādins evidently believed that only such an account could do justice to the Buddha’s moral teaching, to the accepted facts of karma, rebirth and liberation, and to our actual experience of selves and persons.
Table of Contents
- The Problem of the Self in Buddhism
- The Pudgalavādin Characterization of the Self
- Reconstruction of the Pudgalavādin Conception of the Self
- Pudgalavādin Arguments in Support of their Conception of the Self
- References and Further Reading
The Pudgalavāda was a group of five of the Early Schools of Buddhism, distinguished from the other schools by their doctrine of the reality of the self. The group consists of the Vātsīputrīya, the original Pudgalavādin School, and four others that derived from it, the Dharmottarīya, the Bhadrayānīya, the Sāmmitīya and the Shannagarika. Of these, only the Vātsīputrīya and the Sāmmitīya had a large following. The Vātsīputrīya evidently arose about two centuries after the death of the Buddha (the Parinirvana). Since the date of the Buddha’s death was probably in about 486 BCE or 368 BCE (according to which sources one follows), the rise of the Vātsīputrīya school would have been in the early third century or toward the middle of the second century BCE. According to the Chinese monk Xuanzang (Hsüan-tsang), who traveled in India in the seventh century CE, the Sāmmitīya was at that time by far the largest of the Shrāvakayāna schools (or Early Schools), equal in size to all of the other schools combined; and as the monastic populations of the Shrāvakayāna and the Mahāyāna were roughly the same, the Sāmmitīya represented about a quarter of the entire Buddhist monastic population of India. The Vātsīputrīya and a branch of the Sāmmitīya survived in India at least until the tenth century, but since the Pudgalavādin schools never spread to any great extent beyond the subcontinent, when Buddhism died out in India, the tradition of the Pudgalavāda came to an end.
The name Pudgalavāda came to be applied to these schools because “pudgala” was one of the words which they used for the self whose reality they affirmed. “Pudgala” is a term that appears in the early canonical texts with the meaning of a person or individual. The Pudgalavāda is thus a Doctrine of the Person, or Personalism, and Pudgalavādins are accordingly Personalists. Their use of the term “pudgala” has sometimes given the impression that they were trying to conceal their unorthodoxy by talking about a person rather than a self. But in fact they often used other words for the self, such as “ātman” and “jīva,” and were evidently quite unabashed in declaring that the self is real.
It is hardly necessary to point out the importance, both philosophically and historically, of a form of Buddhism which differs strikingly in its interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching from what we have come to regard as orthodox, and yet was for some time, at least, the dominant form of Shrāvakayāna Buddhism in India. But the difficulties facing us in investigating the Pudgalavāda are considerable. There is no living tradition of Pudgalavāda; there are no learned monks to whom we can turn for interpretations handed down within that tradition. There are very few Pudgalavādin texts that have survived, only two of them with anything to say about the self, and those only in Chinese translations of poor quality. Apart from these, we have extensive quotations from their texts (but none, unfortunately, dealing with the self) in an Indian Buddhist work which has survived only in Tibetan, some brief summaries of their doctrines in Tibetan and Chinese translations of Indian works on the formation of the Shrāvakayāna schools, and finally criticisms of their doctrines in works from other schools, some of these fortunately available in Pali or Sanskrit. The evidence we have is thus quite limited, much of it surviving only in translation, and some of it from hostile sources. Any interpretation of the Pudgalavādin doctrine of the self will necessarily be to a considerable extent a reconstruction, and should accordingly be regarded as a more or less plausible hypothesis rather than anything like a definitive account.
The Buddha taught that no self is to be found either in or outside of the five skandhas or in their aggregates; the five are material form, feeling, ideation, mental forces, and consciousness. He rejected the two extreme positions of a permanent, unchanging self persisting in Samsara (cycle of death and rebirth) through successive lives, and of a self which is completely destroyed at death. He taught instead a middle position of dependent origination (pratītyasamutpāda), according to which our existence in this life has arisen as a result of our ethically significant volitional acts (karma) in our last life, and such volitional acts in our present life will give rise to our existence (but will not determine our acts) in our next life. What we are now is thus not the same as what we were, since this is a new life with a different body, different feelings and so on, but neither is it entirely separate from what we were, since what we are now is the result of decisions made in our past life.
In the non-Pudgalavādin schools, which we now think of as orthodox in this regard, this teaching was interpreted (not unreasonably) as a denial that there is any substantial self together with an affirmation of the complex process of evanescent phenomena which at any particular time we identify as a person. In the opinion of these schools, the teaching understood in this way offers several advantages: first, it is true, in the sense that it can be accepted as an accurate account of what can actually be observed of a person (including the events and decisions of past lives, which were supposed to be accessible to the Buddha’s memory); secondly, it removes the basis for selfishness (the root of both wrong-doing and suffering) by exposing the ultimate unreality of the self as a substantial entity; and thirdly, it supports the view that what we do makes a real difference to what we become in both this life and future lives. It thus offers rational hope for an eventual dismantling of the otherwise self-perpetuating mechanism of misunderstanding, craving and suffering in which we are trapped.
But this interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching also involves certain difficulties. In the first place, even if we can understand the functional identity of the person as simply the continuity of a causal process in which the evanescent phenomena of the five aggregates occur and recur in a gradually changing pattern, it is hard to understand how this continuity is maintained through death to the birth of the person in a new life. If rebirth is immediate, as the Theravādins held, how can the final moments of one life bring about the beginning of a new life in a place necessarily at some distance from the place of death? But if there is an intermediate state between death and rebirth, as the Sarvāstivādins held, how can the person journey from one life to the next when the aggregates of the old life have passed away and the aggregates of the new life have not yet arisen? Or if there are aggregates in the intermediate state, why does this state not constitute a life interposed between the one that has ended and the one that is to begin?
In the second place, the denial of the ultimate reality of the self certainly seems to cut away the basis for selfishness, but it seems in the same way to cut away the basis for compassion. If the effort to gain anything for oneself is essentially deluded, how can it not be equally deluded to try to gain anything for other persons, other selves? If to be liberated is to realize that there was never anyone to be liberated, why would that liberation not include the realization that there was never anyone else to be liberated either? Yet it was out of compassion that the Buddha, freshly enlightened, undertook to teach in the first place, and without that compassion there would have been no Buddhism.
Schools that accepted this interpretation, such as the Theravāda and Sarvāstivāda, were of course aware of these difficulties and dealt with them as well as they could. But it is not surprising that the Pudgalavādin schools, sensitive to such problems, developed a fundamentally different interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching about the self.
The Pudgalavādins described the person or self as “inexpressible,” that is, as indeterminate in its relation to the five aggregates, since it cannot be identified with the aggregates and cannot be found apart from them: the self and the aggregates are neither the same nor different. But whereas other schools took this indeterminacy as evidence that the self is unreal, the Pudgalavādins understood it to characterize a real self, a self that is “true and ultimate.” It is this self, they maintained, that dies and is reborn through successive lives in Samsara, continuing to exist until enlightenment is attained. Even in Parinirvana, when the aggregates of the enlightened self have passed away in death and no new aggregates can arise in rebirth, the self, though no longer existent with the aggregates of an individual person, cannot actually be said to be non-existent.
Like most other Shrāvakayāna Buddhists, the Pudgalavādins regarded Nirvana as a real entity, differing from the realm of dependent origination (though not absolutely distinct from it) in being uncaused (asamskrita) and thus indestructible. Accordingly, Nirvana is not something brought into being at the moment of enlightenment, but is rather an eternally existing reality which at that moment is finally attained. The Pudgalavādins held that the self is indeterminate also in its relation to this eternal reality of Nirvana: the self and Nirvana are neither the same nor different.
In its indeterminate relationship with the five aggregates and Nirvana, the self is understood to constitute a fifth category of existence, the “inexpressible.” The phenomena of the five aggregates and of temporal existence in general form three categories: past phenomena, present phenomena and future phenomena. Nirvana, as an eternal, uncaused reality, is the fourth category. The self or person, not to be described either as the same as the dependent phenomena of the temporal world or as distinct from them, is the fifth.
The Pudgalavādins distinguished three ways in which the self can be designated or conceived:
- according to the aggregates appropriated as its basis in a particular life: In the this case, we have a conception of a particular person based on what we know of that person’s physical appearance, feelings, thoughts, inclinations and awareness.
- according to its acquisition of new aggregates in its transition from a past life to its present one, or from the present life to a future one: In this case, we would have a conception of a particular person as one who was such-and-such a person, with that person’s body, feelings and so on, in a previous life, or as one who will be reborn as such-and-such a person, with that person’s body, feelings and so on, in a future life.
- according to the final passing away of its aggregates at death after attaining enlightenment: In the this case, we have a conception of a person who has attained Parinirvana based on the body, feelings, thoughts, inclinations and awareness that have passed away at death without any possibility of recurrence.
In this way, all the statements made by the Buddha—and by others on his authority or on the strength of their own observation, concerning persons or selves and their past or future existences—can be shown to be based on the five aggregates from which those persons are inseparable.
Other schools understood the self to be a merely conceptual entity in the sense that it was simply the diverse phenomena of the five aggregates comprehended for convenience under a single term such as “self” or “person.” They supposed its existence to be thus purely nominal; there is no single, substantial entity corresponding to the term we use for it. We might expect that the Pudgalavādins, who held that the self is real, would on the contrary insist that the self is not merely conceptual or nominal, but substantial. But in fact they seem to have regarded the self, at lest initially, as conceptual, though “true and ultimate.” A later source represents them as maintaining that it is neither conceptual nor substantial, and still later sources ascribe the view to them that the self is indeed substantial. The difference in these accounts may be the result of confusion in our sources, but it is certainly possible that the Pudgalavādins gradually modified their position under the pressure of criticism from other schools.
The Theravādins and Sarvāstivādins made a clear distinction between what are traditionally called “two truths,” which in modern parlance is a distinction between two types of “truth predicates”: ultimate truth (paramārthasatya) and conventional truth (samvritisatya). Ultimate truth distinguishes accurate statements about primary phenomena (dharmas) and their relationships. Conventional truth distinguishes accurate statements about persons and other composite entities; they were thus statements expressed according to the conventions of ordinary usage, and are true only in the sense that they could in principle be translated into accurate statements about the constituent phenomena on which such conventional notions as “person” and so on were based. The two types of truth predicates (commonly called the “Two Truths”) are to be distinguished from four important principles taught by the Buddha, which are not truth predicates, but are called the “Four Noble Truths.” These “Truths” are: (1) life is suffering (the Truth of Suffering), (2) suffering arises from desire (the Truth of the Origination of Suffering), (3) suffering can be stopped (the Truth of Nirvana and the Cessation of Suffering), (4) the cessation of suffering is brought about by adherence to the Buddhist Path, which consists of prescriptions such as the Eight Fold Path (the Truth of the Path).
The Pudgalavādins also distinguished between two kinds of doctrine, concerning phenomena and concerning persons, but they did not regard these as related to higher and lower kinds of truth predicates. They actually recognized three truth predicates: “ultimate truth,, “characteristical truth,” and “practical truth.” They identified ultimate truth with the Third Noble Truth, the Truth of Nirvana, and the cessation of suffering. Characteristical truth distinguishes the First, Second and Fourth of the Noble Truths, the Truths of Suffering, its Origin, and the Path leading to its cessation. Because the characteristical truth predicate was understood as characterizing the world oriented of the Four Noble Truths, it was understood as also distinguishing accurate claims about dependent phenomena. The practical truth predicate distinguished forms of speech and behavior inherited through local or family traditions or learned through monastic training. It would seem that the self was subject to all three of these truths, as the one who eventually attains the cessation of suffering, as the one who suffers as a result of craving and follows a path leading to the end of suffering, and as the one who speaks and acts in accordance with the norms of secular or monastic life.
What the Pudgalavādins said (or in some cases are said to have said) about the self is sufficient to locate their conception of the self in relation to various Buddhist and non-Buddhist opinions that they rejected. But the exact nature of their conception of it remains unclear. Just what was the self supposed to be? Was it simply the five aggregates taken together as a totality but which was not reducible to its parts? Or was it a persisting entity distinct from the aggregates but bound to them so that it could be said to change as the aggregates connected with it changed? Or was it in fact something else altogether?
If the self was supposed to be conceptual, as the Pudgalavādins seem initially to have asserted, that would tend to support the view that they regarded the self as the totality of its constituent aggregates. This view differed from the Theravādins and Sarvāstivādins in not thinking that this conceptual whole was reducible to its parts. On the other hand, if it was supposed to be substantial, as the Pudgalavādins seem later to have asserted, that would tend to support the view that they regarded it as an entity in its own right, non-different from the aggregates only in the sense that it was inseparably bound to them. But there is a problem that affects both of these interpretations. The person who has completely passed away in Parinirvana is supposed to be neither existent nor non-existent. If the self were the aggregates taken as a whole, then with the final destruction of body, feeling, and so on the self would simply be non-existent. But if the self were an entity distinct from the aggregates though bound to them, then in Parinirvana the self would either come to an end together with the aggregates and thus be non-existent, or else it would continue to exist without the aggregates, in spite of allegedly being bound to them, and so would be simply existent. The former interpretation in fact comes too close to identifying the self with the aggregates, and the latter, to treating it as a separate entity.
An analogy that the Pudgalavādins frequently made use of may give some indication of what they actually had in mind. They say that the person is to the aggregates as fire is to its fuel. This analogy appears in a number of the canonical texts and so would have to be accepted by all Buddhist who accepted these texts, though their understanding of it would of course be different from the Pudgalavādins’. As the Pudgalavādins explain it, fire is described in terms of its fuel, as a wood fire or a straw fire, but the fire is not the same as the fuel, nor can it continue to burn without the fuel. Similarly, the person is described in terms of the aggregates, as having such-and-such a physical appearance and so on, but it is not the same as that particular body, those feelings and so on, and cannot exist without a body, feelings and the other aggregates. This analogy makes it clear that although the aggregates in some sense support the self, they are not actually its constituents, since a fire, though supported by its fuel, is certainly not a whole constituted by some particular arrangement of logs.
What the analogy seems not to make clear is why the person in Parinirvana, no longer supported by the aggregates, is not simply non-existent like a fire that has gone out when its fuel is exhausted. But there is reason to think that the Pudgalavādins did not understand the extinction of the fire as we would. Several of the canonical texts that use this analogy specifically compare the Buddha after death to a fire that has gone out and has not gone north, south, east or west, but is simply extinct; but instead of going on to say that the Buddha is non-existent, they say that he is “unfathomable”, that he cannot be described in terms of arising or non-arising, existence or non-existence. Another text, preserved and accepted as authoritative by the Theravādins, explains that Nirvana exists eternally and can be attained even though there is no place where it is “stored up,” just as fire exists and can be produced by rubbing two sticks together even though there is no place where it is stored up. The extinction of the fire can be understood as a transition from its local existence supported by its fuel to a non-local state which cannot be described as either existence or non-existence. The Parinirvana of the Buddha will then be his transition from a local existence supported by the aggregates to a non-local state which is unfathomable. A canonical text of the Mahāyāna explicitly describes the non-local form of the Buddha after his death as his “eternal body,” which is said to be like the fire that has not gone north, south, east or west, but is simply extinct.
There is no evidence that the Pudgalavādins anticipated this Mahāyāna doctrine of an eternal body of the Buddha. However, the analogy understood in this way certainly indicates that the person or self (in this case, the Buddha) is a local manifestation of something. Could that “something” have been a supreme self such as we find in the Upanishads and the Vedānta, and, suitably qualified, in some Mahāyāna texts? There is no evidence to suggest that it was, and in fact the Pudgalavādins may have felt that it would be inappropriate to use the term designating a local, dependent manifestation of that something to refer to the something itself, which unlike any self was eternal and independent of the aggregates.
But there is some evidence which points in another direction. One of our Pudgalavādin sources speaks of the person in Parinirvana as having attained the “unshakeable happiness”, and another source says that the Pudgalavādins held that although Nirvana has the nature of non-existence, because there is no body, faculty or thought there, it also has the nature of existence, because the supreme, ever-lasting happiness is there. So Nirvana is characterized by eternal happiness, but it is a happiness unaccompanied by any body, faculty or thought. Moreover, another source ascribes to the Pudgalavādins the view that Nirvana is the quiescence of the person’s previous “coming and going” in Samsara; it seems to say, then, that Nirvana is a state that the person achieves. This “state” cannot be something that comes into being when Nirvana is attained; otherwise Nirvana would be dependent and so in principle impermanent. And in Parinirvana there are no aggregates, and thus no person, in any normal sense, of which this quiescence could be a state. But if this quiescence is Nirvana, it cannot be simply the non-existence of the person, since we are told explicitly that the person is not nonexistent in Parinirvana (though of course not existent, either). Nirvana must be quiescence in the sense in which it is the “cessation of suffering,” not as a state that arises at the moment of enlightenment and is completed at death, but as an already existing reality whose attainment puts an end to suffering and the coming and going of Samsara.
But in what sense is this eternal happiness “attained” by the person who at death ceases to exist as a self supported by body, faculties and thought? And in what sense is a person who has attained this eternal happiness “not non-existent” after death, even though the five aggregates have passed away once and for all? If even without the aggregates the person somehow survives to enjoy the eternal happiness, why do the Pudgalavādins deny that the person is existent in Parinirvana? But if the person does not survive and there is supposed to be only eternal happiness without anyone who enjoys it, in what sense does the person attain it?
The difficulty arises from the assumption that the self or person and Nirvana are two different things, the one impermanent and the other eternal. But the Pudgalavādins say that the self and Nirvana are neither the same nor different. Even while suffering in Samsara the self is not distinct from the eternal happiness of Nirvana, and when the person’s body, feelings and so on have passed away in Parinirvana, the self is still not entirely non-existent. That is because Nirvana, which is not distinct from the self, continues to exist. The relationship between the self and Nirvana, then, seems to be similar to that between the local manifestation of fire and the fire in its non-local state. The “something” that is locally manifested as a self on the basis of the aggregates would thus be Nirvana.
The Pudgalavādins, like other Buddhist philosophers, saw it as their task to present what they believed to be the best interpretation of the teaching of the Buddha and to support that interpretation through rational argument. The correctness of the Buddha’s teaching was beyond question; what could be debated was the adequacy of this or that interpretation as an explanation of his meaning. Accordingly, their arguments were broadly of two kinds: appeals to the canonical texts (sutras) in which the Buddha’s teaching had been preserved, and arguments on the basis of consistency with acknowledged fact. These were not entirely distinct, since the Buddha’s teaching was supposed to be based not on divine revelation but on the exercise of human faculties developed to an extraordinary degree, and “acknowledged fact” was understood to include generally accepted Buddhist doctrines concerning, for example, karma and rebirth.
Appeals to the canonical texts were not entirely straightforward. These texts had been transmitted orally for several centuries before being committed to writing. Each school preserved its own versions of these texts, and although the versions agreed to a considerable extent, there were also differences, in some cases involving whole sutras. It was not enough, then, for the Pudgalavādins and their opponents to quote sutras from their own versions of the canon; they had to make sure that the sutra they quoted was also included in their opponents’ version. Otherwise, their opponents would feel free to dismiss it as quite possibly a forgery.
The Pudgalavādins often quoted passages in which the Buddha spoke of persons or the self as existing. In most cases, these could be readily explained by their opponents on the basis of the two truths: the Buddha spoke conventionally of persons and the self, but elsewhere made it clear that ultimately there are only the phenomena of the five aggregates. In the view of such non-Pudgalavādin schools as the Theravādins and Sarvāstivādins, these passages merely serve to explain how the Pudgalavādins have come to misunderstand the Buddha’s teaching; they give no support at all to the misinterpretation.
But there is one case at least in which the Buddha’s way of expressing himself is more difficult to account for, and the Theravādin and Sarvastivādin explanations of it show signs of strain. Here the Buddha speaks of the five aggregates as the burden, and identifies the bearer of the burden as the person. Certainly it is possible to explain this in terms, for example, of decisions made by the aggregates of a past life whose consequences are then a burden to the aggregates of this life. But the more natural and obvious reading is to take it as distinguishing between the person who transmigrates from life to life, and the aggregates which the person takes up with each life and carries as a burden.
In another passage to which the Pudgalavādins referred, the Buddha indicates that the idea that one has no self is a mistake. Their opponents were quick to point out that in the same passage he also indicates that the idea that one has a self is a mistake; the meaning, they would suggest, is that it is a mistake to affirm the ultimate existence of the self, but a mistake also to deny its conventional existence. This is certainly not unreasonable; but neither is the Pudgalavādins’ explanation: that it is a mistake to affirm the existence of a self that is either the same as the aggregates or separate from them (these being the two ways in which the self is usually imagined). but a mistake also to deny that there is any self at all.
The fact that the Buddha seems to have been generally unwilling to say outright that the self does not exist is something of an embarrassment for the Pudgalavādins’ opponents. The Buddha characteristically said that the self is not to be found in the aggregates or apart from them. The Theravādins, Sarvāstivādins and others take this to mean that there is no self at all (except nominally or conventionally); but the Pudgalavādins take it as characterizing an existing self which is neither the aggregates themselves nor something apart from them. Whenever the Buddha says that the aggregates in particular or phenomena (dharmas) in general are non-self, the Pudgalavādins understand this only as a denial that the self can be simply identified with them. The view of the Theravādins and Sarvāstivādins, that what we call the self is simply the ever-changing aggregates spoken and thought of for convenience as a persisting entity, seems to the Pudgalavādins to be equivalent to identifying the self with its aggregates, a view which the Buddha explicitly rejected.
Apart from appeals to the canonical texts, the Pudgalavādins also offered arguments pointing out what they saw as the inadequacy of their opponents’ view to account for some of the facts of personal existence and self-cultivation which were generally accepted by Buddhists. They argued, for example, that if there were no person distinguishable from the aggregates, there would be no real basis for identifying oneself, as the Buddha did, with the person that one was in a previous life, since the aggregates in the two lives would be completely different. They evidently felt that the causal relationship that was supposed to obtain between the aggregates of a past life and those of the present life was insufficient to establish a personal identity persisting through the successive lives.
They also argued that one of the meditations recommended by the Buddha, in which the meditator cultivates the wish that all sentient beings may be happy, presupposes the existence of real sentient beings, of persons, to be the objects of the meditator’s benevolence. They rejected their opponents’ opinion that the aggregates are the real object of benevolence, and insisted that if that were the case, the Buddha’s recommendation to wish that all sentient beings may be happy would not have been “well said”. In their opponents’ view, this was simply another case in which the Pudgalavādins failed to recognize that the Buddha spoke conventionally of sentient beings and persons when it would have been inconvenient to speak in terms of the aggregates, which were all that was ultimately there. But to the Pudgalavādins it seemed clear that benevolence toward a sentient being or person is not the same thing as benevolence (if it is possible at all) toward a series of constantly changing aggregates.
They argued also that the operation of karma is incomprehensible if the person is nothing more than an assemblage of phenomena. Destroying a particular arrangement of particles of clay in the form of an ox is not killing anything and has in itself no karmic consequences; but destroying a particular arrangement of aggregates in the form of a living ox is killing something and has unfortunate consequences for the person who killed it. If the ox is really nothing but an arrangement of aggregates, destroying that arrangement, rearranging the aggregates, should have no more moral and karmic significance than smashing the clay image of an ox. Their thought seems to have been something like this: the phenomena (dharmas) which are supposed to be the ox’s constituents cannot, strictly speaking, be destroyed, since their existence is in any case momentary; all that can be destroyed is the arrangement in which these phenomena have been occurring, and that, in the view of their opponents, is nothing real. As Buddhists, their opponents agree with the Pudgalavādins in accepting the effectiveness of karma, but their denial of the reality of the self makes nonsense of what they accept.
The analogy with fire was important in explaining the indeterminacy of the self or person in relation to the aggregates, but they did not offer it as an argument in its own right for the reality of the self. Its function was rather to clarify the nature of the relationship between the self and the aggregates, and to serve as evidence that at least one instance of such a relationship could be recognized in the world around us, so that there could be no justification for rejecting their position out of hand as manifestly impossible.
The view of the Pudgalavādins, that the self is a real entity which is neither the same as the aggregates nor different from them, is certainly paradoxical and seems to have been regarded by their opponents as fundamentally irrational. But they evidently felt that only such a view did justice to our actual experience of personal existence and to what in the Buddhist tradition were the accepted facts of karma, rebirth and final liberation. To some extent they were able to explain the paradox by pointing to the ways in which the self seems limited to a particular body, particular feelings and so on and the ways in which it also seems to transcend these, but the self in their view remains something mysterious and only partially amenable to the principles of rational thought.
The Theravādins, Sarvāstivādins and others naturally saw the Pudgalavādins’ account of the self as not so much paradoxical as incoherent. They were sure that the reason that the Pudgalavādins could not really make sense of the self they affirmed was that no such self is possible. But there was after all some justification for the Pudgalavādins’ view, that their opponents, if they achieved consistency, did so to some extent at the expense of the facts. And the insistence of the Theravādins and Sarvāstivādins on the precise determinacy of anything that they were prepared to regard as real brought its own problems, as the dialectic of the Mādhyamikas would show.
The very considerable success of the Pudgalavādins in India surely indicates that there were many who regarded their doctrine as a viable interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching. At the very least, it was an interpretation which, though different from what we now regard as orthodox, had significant strengths as well as weaknesses. Perhaps belief in a real though indeterminate self would tend, as their opponents argued, to reinforce our inveterate selfishness; but the Pudgalavādins held that the self once realized to be indeterminate could not be a basis for the self-love and craving that are the source of suffering. Their conception of a persisting self, moreover, could be felt to give a stronger sense of our investment in the person that we are to become, and thus a greater appreciation of the significance of our actions in this life. Finally, belief in the reality of other selves would seem to make it more difficult to ignore the suffering of others than if all persons were thought to be essentially an illusion. That there was in fact a danger that belief in the unreality of the self might lead to an attitude of indifference to other sentient beings is evident from the endless admonishments to cultivate compassion that we find in the works of the Mahāyāna.
As a theory of the self, the Pudgalavāda was naturally shaped and so in some measure limited by the concerns of Buddhism; the Pudgalavādins were interested in the nature of selfhood only to the extent that it had a bearing on the problem of suffering. But their interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching offers a perspective which is also of more general interest. Even in the fragmentary evidence that has come down to us, we can see at least the rough outline of a view which gives full weight to the instinctive conviction that as persons we are neither reducible to our apparent constituents, whether these are conceived to be dharmas or molecules, nor separable from our particular, concrete presence in the physical world. It is a view that reminds us of the experiential immediacy of our awareness of other selves, and that confirms our natural resistance to regarding a person as nothing more than a construct of the understanding. Finally, it renews in us the sense of something mysterious and perhaps ultimately unfathomable in the mere fact of our selfhood and of our existence in the world as conscious beings.
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