Punishment involves the deliberate infliction of suffering on a supposed or actual offender for an offense such as a moral or legal transgression. Since punishment involves inflicting a pain or deprivation similar to that which the perpetrator of a crime inflicts on his victim, it has generally been agreed that punishment requires moral as well as legal and political justification. While philosophers almost all agree that punishment is at least sometimes justifiable, they offer various accounts of how it is to be justified as well as what the infliction of punishment is designed to protect – rights, personal autonomy and private property, a political constitution, or the democratic process, for instance. Utilitarians attempt to justify punishment in terms of the balance of good over evil produced and thus focus our attention on extrinsic or consequentialist considerations. Retributivists attempt a justification that links punishment to moral wrongdoing, generally justifying the practice on the grounds that it gives to wrongdoers what they deserve; their focus is thus on the intrinsic wrongness of crime that thereby merits punishment. “Compromise” theorists attempt to combine these two types of theories in a way that retains their perceived strengths while overcoming their perceived weaknesses. After discussing the various attempts at justification, utilitarian and retributive approaches to determining the amount of punishment will be examined. Finally, the controversial issue of capital punishment will be briefly discussed.
Utilitarianism is the moral theory that holds that the rightness or wrongness of an action is determined by the balance of good over evil that is produced by that action. Philosophers have argued over exactly how the resulting good and evil may be identified and to whom the greatest good should belong. Jeremy Bentham identified good with pleasure and evil with pain and held that the greatest pleasure should belong to the greatest number of people. John Stuart Mill, perhaps the most notable utilitarian, identified good with happiness and evil with unhappiness and also held that the greatest happiness should belong to the greatest number. This is how utilitarianism is most often discussed in the literature, so we will follow Mill in our discussion.
When attempting to determine whether a punishment is justifiable, utilitarians will attempt to anticipate the likely consequences of carrying out the punishment. If punishing an offender would most likely produce the greatest balance of happiness over unhappiness compared with the other available options (not taking any action, publicly denouncing the offender, etc.), then the punishment is justified. If another available option would produce a greater balance of happiness over unhappiness, then that option should be chosen and punishment is unjustified.
Clearly, crimes tend to produce unhappiness, so in seeking to promote a state of affairs in which the balance of happiness over unhappiness is maximized, a utilitarian will be highly concerned with reducing crime. Traditionally, utilitarians have focused on three ways in which punishment can reduce crime. First, the threat of punishment can deter potential offenders. If an individual is tempted to commit a certain crime, but he knows that it is against the law and a punishment is attached to a conviction for breaking that law, then, generally speaking, that potential offender will be less likely to commit the crime. Second, punishment can incapacitate offenders. If an offender is confined for a certain period of time, then that offender will be less able to harm others during that period of time. Third, punishment can rehabilitate offenders. Rehabilitation involves making strides to improve an offender’s character so that he will be less likely to re-offend.
Although utilitarians have traditionally focused on these three ways in which punishment can reduce crime, there are other ways in which a punishment can affect the balance of happiness over unhappiness. For example, whether or not a given offender is punished will affect how the society views the governmental institution that is charged with responding to violations of the law. The degree to which they believe this institution is functioning justly will clearly affect their happiness. Utilitarians are committed to taking into account every consequence of a given punishment insofar as it affects the balance of happiness over unhappiness.
Perhaps the most common objection to the utilitarian justification of punishment is that its proponent is committed to punishing individuals in situations in which punishment would clearly be morally wrong. H.J. McCloskey offers the following example:
Suppose a utilitarian were visiting an area in which there was racial strife, and that, during his visit, a Negro rapes a white woman, and that race riots occur as a result of the crime, white mobs, with the connivance of the police, bashing and killing Negroes, etc. Suppose too that our utilitarian is in the area of the crime when it is committed such that his testimony would bring about the conviction of a particular Negro. If he knows that a quick arrest will stop the riots and lynchings, surely, as a utilitarian, he must conclude that he has a duty to bear false witness in order to bring about the punishment of an innocent person (127).
A utilitarian is committed to endorsing the act that would be most likely to produce the greatest balance of happiness over unhappiness, and, in this situation, it appears that the act that meets this criterion is bearing false witness against an innocent person. But, so the argument goes, it cannot be morally permissible, let alone morally mandatory, to perform an act that leads directly to the punishment of an innocent person. Therefore, since the utilitarian is committed to performing this clearly wrong act, the utilitarian justification must be incorrect.
The standard utilitarian response to this argument demands that we look more closely at the example. Once we do this, it supposedly becomes clear that the utilitarian is not committed to performing this clearly wrong act. In his reply to McCloskey’s argument, T.L.S. Sprigge states that if faced with the decision presented in the example, a “sensible utilitarian” will attach a great deal of weight to the near-certain fact that framing an innocent man would produce a great deal of misery for that man and his family. This consideration would receive such weight because “the prediction of misery… rests on well confirmed generalizations” (72). Furthermore, the sensible utilitarian will not attach much weight to the possibility that framing the man would stop the riots. This is because this prediction “will be based on a hunch about the character of the riots” (72). Since well confirmed generalizations are more reliable than hunches, happiness is most likely to be maximized when individuals give the vast majority of the weight to such well confirmed generalizations when making moral decisions. Therefore, since the relevant well confirmed generalization tells us that at least a few people (the innocent man and his family) would be made miserable by the false testimony, the utilitarian would give much weight to this consideration and choose not to bear false witness against an innocent man.
This type of response can in turn be challenged in various ways, but perhaps the best way to challenge it is to point out that even if it is true that the greatest balance of good over evil would not be promoted by punishing an innocent person in this situation, that is not the reason why punishing an innocent person would be wrong. It would be wrong because it would be unjust. The innocent man did not rape the woman, so he does not deserve to be punished for that crime. Because utilitarianism focuses solely on the balance of happiness over unhappiness that is produced by various actions, it is unable to take into account important factors such as justice and desert. If justice and desert cannot be incorporated into the theory, then the punishment of innocents cannot be ruled out as unjust, so a prohibition against it will have to be dependent upon the likelihood of various consequences. This strikes many theorists as problematic.
Regarding retributive theories, C.L. Ten states that, “There is no complete agreement about what sorts of theories are retributive except that all such theories try to establish an essential link between punishment and moral wrongdoing” (38). He is surely right about this, so, therefore, it is difficult to give a general account of retributive justification. However, it is possible to state certain features that characterize retributive theories generally. Concepts of desert and justice occupy a central place in most retributive theories: in accordance with the demands of justice, wrongdoers are thought to deserve to suffer, so punishment is justified on the grounds that it gives to wrongdoers what they deserve. It is instructive to look at the form that a particular retributive theory can take, so we will examine the views of Immanuel Kant.
Kant invokes what he refers to as the “principle of equality” in his discussion of punishment. If this principle is obeyed, then “the pointer of the scale of justice is made to incline no more to the one side than the other” (104). If a wrongful act is committed, then the person who has committed it has upset the balance of the scale of justice. He has inflicted suffering on another, and therefore rendered himself deserving of suffering. So in order to balance the scale of justice, it is necessary to inflict the deserved suffering on him. But it is not permissible to just inflict any type of suffering. Kant states that the act that the person has performed “is to be regarded as perpetrated on himself” (104). This he refers to as the “principle of retaliation”. Perhaps the most straightforward application of this principle demands that murderers receive the penalty of death. So, for Kant, the justification of punishment is derived from the principle of retaliation, which is grounded in the principle of equality.
The concepts of desert and justice play a central role in Kant’s theory, and they are applied in a way that rules out the possibility of justifying the punishment of innocents. Since an innocent person does not deserve to be punished, a Kantian is not committed to punishing an innocent person, and since it seems to some that utilitarians are committed to punishing innocents (or participating in the punishment of innocents) in certain circumstances, Kant’s theory may seem to be superior in this respect. Recall that the failure to take desert and justice into consideration is thought by many to be a major problem with utilitarian theory. However, while Kantian theory may seem superior because it takes desert and justice into account, an influential criticism of the theory challenges the idea that punishment can be justified on the grounds of justice and desert without requiring that the balance of happiness over unhappiness be taken into account.
Gertrude Ezorsky argues that we should test the Kantian position and other retributive positions that resemble it “by imagining a world in which punishing criminals has no further effects worth achieving” (xviii). In this world, punishment does not deter or rehabilitate. For whatever reason, incapacitation is impossible. In addition, victims receive no satisfaction from the punishment of those who have harmed them. In this world, a Kantian would be committed to the position that punishments still ought to be inflicted upon wrongdoers. Furthermore, the individuals that populated this world would be morally obligated to punish wrongdoers. If they failed to punish wrongdoers, they would be failing to abide by the dictates of justice. But surely it is quite odd to hold that these individuals would be morally obligated to punish when doing so would not produce any positive effects for anyone. According to Ezorsky, this terribly odd consequence suggests that the Kantian theory is problematic.
Kant would not agree that this consequence of his theory is odd. According to Kant, “if justice and righteousness perish, human life would no longer have any value in the world” (104). So, even the inhabitants of our imaginary world are obliged to ensure that “every one may realize the desert of his deeds” (106). If they do not live up to this obligation, then they will be failing to abide by the dictates of justice, and their lives will be of lesser value. Of course, critics of the Kantian theory are unlikely to be persuaded by this response. Indeed, it is appropriate to be highly skeptical of a conception of justice that holds that justice can be promoted without anyone’s welfare being promoted.
As stated earlier, many of the theories that are referred to as “retributive” vary significantly from one another. However, as the Kantian theory possesses many central features that other retributive theories possess, criticisms similar to Ezorsky’s have been leveled against many of them. Predictably, the responses to these criticisms vary depending on the particular theory.
Many theorists have attempted to take features of utilitarianism and retributivism and combine them into a theory that retains the strengths of both while overcoming their weaknesses. The impetus for attempting to develop this sort of theory is clear: the idea that punishment should promote good consequences, such as the reduction of crime, surely seems attractive. However, the idea that it would be justified to punish an innocent in any circumstance where such punishment would be likely to promote the greatest balance of happiness over unhappiness surely seems wrong. Likewise, the idea that justice and the desert of the offender should play a central role in a justification of punishment is attractive, while being committed to punishing an offender even when nobody’s welfare would be promoted as a result seems to be problematic. So, each type of theory seems to have positive and negative aspects. But how to combine these seemingly opposed theories and produce a better one? Is a compromise between them really possible? In an attempt to explore this possibility, we will examine the theory of H.L.A. Hart.
According to Hart, in order to clarify our thinking on the subject of punishment,
What is needed is the realization that different principles… are relevant at different points in any morally acceptable account of punishment. What we should look for are answers to a number of different questions such as: What justifies the general practice of punishment? To whom may punishment be applied? (3)
The failure to separate these questions from one another and consider that they might be answered by appealing to different principles has prevented many previous theorists from generating an acceptable account of punishment. Hart states that the first question (“What justifies the general practice of punishment?”) is a question of “General Justifying Aim” and ought to be answered by citing utilitarian concerns. The second (“To whom may punishment be applied?”) is a question of “Distribution” and ought to be answered by citing retributive concerns. So, the general practice is to be justified by citing the social consequences of punishment, the main social consequence being the reduction of crime, but we ought not be permitted to punish whenever inflicting a punishment is likely to reduce crime. In other words, we may not apply punishment indiscriminately. We may only punish “an offender for an offense” (9). With few exceptions, the individual upon whom punishment is inflicted must have committed an offense, and the punishment must be attached to that offense.
Hart’s theory attempts to avoid what may have appeared to be an impasse blocking the construction of an acceptable theory of punishment. Utilitarian concerns play a major role in his theory: the practice of punishment must promote the reduction of crime, or else it is not justifiable. But retributive concerns also play a major role: the range of acceptable practices that can be engaged in by those concerned with reducing crime is to be constrained by a retributive principle allowing only the punishment of an offender for an offense. Hart’s theory, at the very least, represents a plausible attempt at a “compromise” between those inclined towards utilitarianism and those inclined towards retributivism.
Hart does admit that on certain occasions the principle stating that we may only punish an offender for an offense (referred to as the principle of “retribution in Distribution”) may be overridden by utilitarian concerns. When the utilitarian case for punishing an innocent person is particularly compelling, it may be good for us to do so, but “we should do so with the sense of sacrificing an important principle” (12). Many people will agree with Hart that it may be necessary to punish an innocent person in extreme cases, and it is thought to be an advantage of his theory that it captures the sense that, in these cases, an important principle is being overridden.
This overriding process, however, cannot work in the opposite direction. In Hart’s theory, some social good must be promoted or some social evil must be reduced in order for punishment to be justified. Because of this, it is unjustifiable to punish a person who seems to deserve punishment unless some utilitarian aim is being furthered. Imagine the most despicable character you can think of, a mass-murderer perhaps. The justifiability of punishing a person guilty of such crimes is beholden to the social consequences of the punishment. That a depraved character would suffer for his wrongdoing is not enough. So, for Hart, considerations of desert cannot override utilitarian considerations in this way. Some theorists find this consequence of his theory unacceptable. Ten argues that, “it would be unfair to punish an offender for a lesser offense and yet not punish another offender for a more serious offense” (80). If we are behaving in accordance with Hart’s theory, we may, on occasion, have to avoid punishing serious offenders while continuing to punish less serious offenders for utilitarian reasons. Since doing so would be unfair, it seems that Hart’s theory may be seriously flawed.
In order to assess Ten’s criticism, it is important to ask the following question: If we were to avoid punishing the more serious offender, to whom would we be being unfair? In an effort to answer this question, we must consider whether the offender who has committed the lesser crime has grounds for complaint if the more serious offender is not punished. By stipulation, the lesser offender committed the crime and cannot thereby claim a violation of justice on those grounds. Is the justification of his punishment contingent upon the punishment of others? Arguably not: The punishment of the lesser offender is justified regardless of whoever else is punished. He may bemoan his bad luck and wish that his punishment were not likely to further any utilitarian aims so that he may avoid it, but he cannot rightly accuse society of a violation of justice for failing to punish others when he does in fact deserve the punishment that is being inflicted upon him. The attractiveness of Ten’s argument is derived from the fact that its conclusion fits with our intuitions regarding the idea that some people just deserve to suffer no matter what. Perhaps we ought to reexamine that intuition and consider that it may be rooted in an urge to revenge, not a concern for justice.
The belief that, in most cases, the amount of punishment should vary directly with the seriousness of the offense is widely accepted. However, utilitarians and retributivists have different ways of arriving at this general conclusion.
Bentham, a utilitarian, states that, “The greater the mischief of the offence, the greater is the expense, which it may be worth while to be at, in the way of punishment” (181). Crime and punishment both tend to cause unhappiness. Recall that utilitarianism is solely concerned with the balance of happiness over unhappiness produced by an action. When attempting to determine the amount of punishment that ought to be permitted for a given offense, it is necessary to weigh the unhappiness that would be caused by the offense against the unhappiness caused by various punishments. The greater the unhappiness caused by a given offense, the greater the amount of punishment that may be inflicted for that offense in order to reduce its occurrence before the unhappiness caused by the punishment outweighs the unhappiness caused by the offense (Ten, 143).
So, utilitarians would often be committed to abiding by the rule that the amount of punishment should vary directly with the seriousness of the offense. However, it seems that there are cases in which they would be committed to violating this rule. Critics argue that utilitarians would sometimes be committed to inflicting a severe punishment for a relatively minor offense. Ten asks us to imagine a society in which there are many petty thefts and thieves are very difficult to catch. Since there are many thefts, the total amount of unhappiness caused by them is great. Imagine that one thief is caught and the authorities are deciding how severely to punish him. If these authorities were utilitarians, they would be committed to giving him a very severe sentence, 10 years perhaps, if this were the only way to deter a significant number of petty thieves. But surely making an example of the one thief who was unlucky or unskilled enough to be caught is unjust. Since utilitarians are sometimes committed to inflicting such harsh punishments for relatively minor offenses, their approach must be inadequate (143-144).
Retributivists argue that more serious offenses should be punished more severely because offenders who commit more serious crimes deserve harsher punishment than those who commit less serious crimes. Given our previous discussion of retributivism, it should not come as a surprise that the concept of desert plays a central role here. According to many classic versions of retributivism, including Kant’s, the deserved punishment is determined by invoking the lex talionis. The old adage, “An eye for an eye, a tooth for a tooth,” is derived from the lex talionis, which “requires imposing a harm on a criminal identical to the one he imposed on his victim” (Shafer-Landau, 773). Those who argue that murderers ought to be put to death have often invoked this principle, but it is rarely invoked when attempting to determine the proper punishment for other crimes. Its lack of popularity can be explained by noting a couple of objections. First, it is difficult to apply to many offenses, and it seems to be outright inapplicable to some. How should we punish the counterfeiter, the hijacker, or the childless kidnapper? Applying the lex talionis to these crimes is, at the very least, problematic. Second, there are many cases in which it would require that we punish offenders by performing actions that ought not to be carried out by any government (773). Surely we should not rape rapists! For these and other reasons, except when the topic at hand is capital punishment, appeals to the lex talionis in the contemporary literature are rare.
Many contemporary retributivists hold that the principle of proportionality should be used in order to determine the amount of punishment to be meted out in particular cases. This principle states that, “the amount of punishment should be proportionate to the moral seriousness or moral gravity of offenses…” (Ten, 154). Different versions of the proportionality principle call for different ways of establishing how severe a punishment must be in order to meet the demands set by the principle. Must it merely be the case that there be a direct relationship between the amount of punishment and the seriousness of the offense, or must offenders suffer the same amount as their victim(s) in order for the demands of the principle to be met? Retributivists are not in complete agreement on how to answer this question.
While retributivists seem to have an easier time ensuring that there be a direct relationship between the amount of punishment and the seriousness of the offense, their position is subject to criticism. Because they are committed to inflicting the deserved punishment, they must do so even when a lesser punishment would produce the same social effects. Clearly, this criticism runs parallel to the objection to retributivism discussed in section 2: if the retributivist is committed to inflicting the deserved punishment regardless of the social effects, then it seems that he is committed to inflicting gratuitous pain on an offender. Of course, some resist the idea that inflicting suffering in such a case would be gratuitous, which is why this debate continues. In any case, the perceived shortcomings of both the utilitarian and retributive approaches have led theorists to attempt to develop approaches that combine elements of both. For reasons similar to those cited in support of the aforementioned “compromise” theories, it seems that these approaches are the most promising.
Capital punishment involves the deliberate killing of a supposed or actual offender for an offense. Throughout history and across different societies, criminals have been executed for a variety of offenses, but much of the literature is devoted to examining whether those convicted of murder ought to be executed, and this discussion will be similarly focused.
A combination of utilitarian and retributive considerations are usually invoked in an effort to justify the execution of murderers. The centerpiece of most arguments in favor of capital punishment is retributive: Murderers deserve to be put to death. This is usually argued for along Kantian lines: By deliberately causing an innocent person’s death, the murderer has rendered himself deserving of death. Utilitarian considerations generally play a large role as well. Proponents argue that the threat of capital punishment can deter potential murderers. Since many human beings’ greatest fear is death, the intuitive plausibility of this claim is clear. In addition, proponents point to the fact that capital punishment is the ultimate incapacitation. Clearly, if a murderer is dead, then he can never harm anyone again.
Opponents of capital punishment challenge proponents on each of these points. Albert Camus denies that murder and capital punishment are equivalent to one another:
But what is capital punishment if not the most premeditated of murders, to which no criminal act, no matter how calculated, can be compared? If there were to be a real equivalence, the death penalty would have to be pronounced upon a criminal who had forewarned his victim of the very moment he would put him to a horrible death, and who, from that time on, had kept him confined at his own discretion for a period of months. It is not in private life that one meets such monsters (25).
This argument and others that resemble it are often put forth in an attempt to counter the retributive argument. Also, any criminal justice system that executes convicted criminals runs the risk of executing some individuals who do not deserve to be executed: the wrongfully convicted. Some argue that a fallible criminal justice system ought not to impose a penalty that removes the possibility of mistakes being rectified. The utilitarian arguments have also come under attack. Some argue that the proponents of capital punishment have overstated its deterrent value, and it has been argued that it may even incite some people to commit murder (Bedau, 198-200). Regarding incapacitation, it has been argued that the danger involved in failing to execute murderers has been similarly overstated (196-198).
These issues introducing punishment have received a great deal of attention in the professional literature, and many philosophers continue to discuss them and offer various answers to the questions that are raised. However, the issues raised here are not the only ones. There are many, including the role of excuses and mitigating circumstances, the usage of insanity as a defense, the imprisonment of offenders, and the cultural and historical context of punishment.
John Jay College of Criminal Justice
Last updated: July 24, 2005 | Originally published: