Pyrrho was a Greek philosopher from Elis, and founder of the Greek school of skepticism. In his youth he practiced the art of painting, but passed over this for philosophy. He studied the writings of Democritus, became a disciple of Bryson, the son of Stilpo, and later a disciple of Anaxarchus. He took part in the Indian expedition of Alexander the Great, and met with philosophers of the Indus region. Back in Greece he was frustrated with the assertions of the Dogmatists (those who claimed to possess knowledge), and founded a new school in which he taught fallibilism, namely that every object of human knowledge involves uncertainty. Thus, he argued, it is impossible ever to arrive at the knowledge of truth (Diog. Laert, 58). It is related that he acted on his own principles, and carried his skepticism to such an extreme, that his friends were obliged to accompany him wherever he went, so he might not be run over by carriages or fall down precipices. It is likely, though, that these reports were invented by the Dogmatists whom he opposed. He spent a great part of his life in solitude, and was undisturbed by fear, or joy, or grief. He withstood bodily pain, and when in danger showed no sign of apprehension. In disputes he was known for his subtlety. Epicurus, though no friend to skepticism, admired Pyrrho because he recommended and practiced the kind of self-control that fostered tranquillity; this, for Epicurus, was the end of all physical and moral science. Pyrrho was so highly valued by his countrymen that they honored him with the office of chief priest and, out of respect for him, passed a decree by which all philosophers were made immune from taxation. He was an admirer of poets, particularly Homer, and frequently cited passages from his poems. After his death, the Athenians honored his memory with a statue, and a monument to him was erected in his own country.
Pyrrho left no writings, and we owe our knowledge of his thoughts to his disciple Timon of Phlius. His philosophy, in common with all post-Aristotelian systems, is purely practical in its outlook. Skepticism is not posited on account of its speculative interest, but only because Pyrrho sees in it the road to happiness, and the escape from the calamities of life. The proper course of the sage, said Pyrrho, is to ask himself three questions. Firstly we must ask what things are and how they are constituted. Secondly, we ask how we are related to these things. Thirdly, we ask what ought to be our attitude towards them. As to what things are, we can only answer that we know nothing. We only know how things appear to us, but of their inner substance we are ignorant. The same thing appears differently to different people, and therefore it is impossible to know which opinion is right. The diversity of opinion among the wise, as well as among the vulgar, proves this. To every assertion the contradictory assertion can be opposed with equally good grounds, and whatever my opinion, the contrary opinion is believed by somebody else who is quite as clever and competent to judge as I am. Opinion we may have, but certainty and knowledge are impossible. Hence our attitude to things (the third question), ought to be complete suspense of judgment. We can be certain of nothing, not even of the most trivial assertions. Therefore we ought never to make any positive statements on any subject. And the Pyrrhonists were careful to import an element of doubt even into the most trifling assertions which they might make in the course of their daily life. They did not say, “it is so,” but “it seems so,” or “it appears so to me.” Every observation would be prefixed with a “perhaps,” or “it may be.”
This absence of certainty applies as much to practical as to theoretical matters. Nothing is in itself true or false. It only appears so. In the same way, nothing is in itself good or evil. It is only opinion, custom, law, which makes it so. When the sage realizes this, he will cease to prefer one course of action to another, and the result will be apathy (ataraxia). All action is the result of preference, and preference is the belief that one thing is better than another. If I go to the north, it is because, for one reason or another, I believe that it is better than going to the south. Suppress this belief, learn that the one is not in reality better than the other, but only appears so, and one would go in no direction at all. Complete suppression of opinion would mean complete suppression of action, and it was at this that Pyrrho aimed. To have no opinions was the skeptical maxim, because in practice it meant apathy, total quietism. All action is founded on belief, and all belief is delusion, hence the absence of all activity is the ideal of the sage. In this apathy he will renounce all desires, for desire is the opinion that one thing is better than another. He will live in complete repose, in undisturbed tranquillity of soul, free from all delusions. Unhappiness is the result of not attaining what one desires, or of losing it when attained. The wise person, being free from desires, is free from unhappiness. He knows that, though people struggle and fight for what they desire, vainly supposing some things better than others, such activity is but a futile struggle about nothing, for all things are equally indifferent, and nothing matters. Between health and sickness, life and death, difference there is none. Yet insofar as we are compelled to act, we will follow probability, opinion, custom, and law, but without any belief in the essential validity or truth of these criteria.
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Last updated: April 21, 2001 | Originally published: