W. V. O. Quine (1908-2000) did not conceive of philosophy as an activity separate from the general province of empirical science. His interest in science is not best described as a philosophy of science but as a set of reflections on the nature of science that is pursued with the same empirical spirit that animates scientific inquiry. Quine’s philosophy should then be seen as a systematic attempt to understand science from within the resources of science itself. This project investigates both the epistemological and ontological dimensions of scientific theorizing. Quine’s epistemological concern is to examine our successful acquisition of scientific theories, while his ontological interests focus on the further logical regimentation of that theory. He thus advocates what is more famously known as ‘naturalized epistemology’, which consists of his attempt to provide an improved scientific explanation of how we have developed elaborate scientific theories on the basis of meager sensory input. Quine further argues that the most general features of reality can be examined through the use of formal logic by clarifying what objects we must acknowledge as real given our acceptance of an overarching systematic view of the world. In pursuing these issues, Quine reformulates and thus transforms these philosophical concerns according to those standards of clarity, empirical adequacy, and utility that he takes as central to the explanatory power of empirical science. While few philosophers have adopted Quine’s strict standards or accepted the details of his respective positions, the general empirical reconfiguration of philosophy and philosophy of science recommended by his naturalism has been very influential. This article provides an overview of Quine’s naturalistic conception of philosophy, and elaborates on its examination of the epistemological and ontological elements of scientific practice.
One central theme from the history of Western thought concerns the relationship between philosophy and science. Philosophy is often depicted as providing a set of general conditions that somehow support or validate the various claims made in the formal and empirical sciences. So, Plato describes how geometry helps equip philosophers with rational insight into a supersensible realm of ideas or forms – a superior level of reality that shapes how the world looks in ordinary sensory perception. In a related way, Descartes argues that inner reflection of the mind’s contents and activities reveals indubitable truths that form the basis of the emerging modern scientific worldview. Lastly, Kant argues for the active structuring role of human reason in making possible experience and scientific knowledge.
Such examples highlight a prominent historical self-understanding of philosophy and its relation to science, in which philosophy offers general truths that in some way serve to justify, ground, or support the specific results of scientific inquiry. On this general picture, philosophy is not conceived as a science, but as distinct from experience and experiment and further providing a priori resources that constitute a secure foundation for scientific claims. The empiricist tradition in philosophy, stretching from Locke to Russell, with its view that all substantial knowledge finds its source in experience, provides a useful contrast to this a priori conception of philosophy. Empiricists have been more sympathetic with the idea of aligning philosophy more closely to science, but there remained a problem concerning the nature of logical and mathematical knowledge, which did not appear to depend on experience. Rudolf Carnap’s logical empiricism with its use of the analytic-synthetic distinction is often presented as responding to this specific epistemological challenge (see Quine 1995a; for dissenting views see Richardson 1998, Friedman 2006). Statements such as “All bachelors are unmarried” were deemed analytic and were true in virtue of the meaning of the words used, whereas synthetic claims such as “Some bachelors are over six feet tall,” are determined true by the meaning of their terms and through experience.
Analytic statements, including logical and mathematical claims, provide no substantial knowledge about the world but merely report the conventional use of certain terms within a language. Analytic statements do not then make any claims about the world, but are the product of the specific way we construct a language. With the a priori (now thought of as analytic) character of logic and mathematics depicted in such terms, it does not constitute a separate type of knowledge, and does then conflict with the empiricist commitment that all knowledge has its source in experience. Carnap further conceived of philosophy as concerned with the analysis of the formal linguistic structure of scientific claims. Philosophy then focuses on the analytic framework of scientific language, and finds its place as a kind of subdiscipline within the formal sciences, while still distinct from the empirical sciences (see Carnap 1935).
Quine’s view of philosophical inquiry breaks decisively with the a priori conception of philosophy’s relation to science as seen in Plato, Descartes and Kant. Although he finds himself more in sympathy with the empiricist tradition (this is especially true with regard to both Russell’s and Carnap’s distinctive attempts to make philosophy more scientific), he also rejects what he sees as its attempt to preserve the a priori status of logic and mathematics through the distinction between analytic and synthetic statements (1981, 67-72). The basic conception of philosophy and philosophical practice that informs his discussion of science is commonly know as naturalism, a view that recommends the “abandonment of the goal of a first philosophy prior to natural science” (1981, 67), which further involves a “readiness to see philosophy as natural science trained upon itself and permitted free use of scientific findings” (1981, 85) and lastly, recognizes that “…it is within science itself, and not in some prior philosophy, that reality is to be identified and described” (1981, 21).
These remarks indicate that Quine rejects the view that philosophy maintains some distinctive perspective, or type of knowledge that distinguishes it from science, and which could further serve as a independent standpoint from which to critically assess or ground the methods and procedures found in science. Consequently, he recommends the pursuit of philosophical issues from within the available resources of the empirical sciences themselves.
So, for example, the philosophical treatment of scientific knowledge does not proceed from a perspective different in kind from the very knowledge that is under examination.
Here, Quine often appeals to Neurath’s metaphor of science as a boat, where changes need to be made piece by piece while we stay afloat, and not when docked at port. He further emphasizes that both the philosopher and scientist are in the same boat (1960, 3; 1981, 72, 178). The Quinean philosopher then begins from within the ongoing system of knowledge provided by science, and proceeds to use science in order to understand science. In laying out these various points, Quine offers few remarks concerning the nature of science or why he thinks that it should be given such priority with regard to philosophical investigations. This is because, in part, his use of the term “science” applies quite broadly referring not simply to the ‘hard’ or natural sciences, but also including psychology, economics, sociology, and even history (Quine 1995, 19; also see Quine 1997). But a more substantive reason centers on his view that all knowledge strives to provide a true understanding of the world and is then responsive to observation as the ultimate test of its claims. Once we view this as the shared pursuit of human knowledge, and couple it with Quine’s broad use of ‘science,’ then any attempt to gain such an understanding can be thought of as proceeding in a general scientific spirit. Quine then attaches scientific status to any statement that makes a contribution, no matter how slight, to a theory that can be tested through prediction (1992, 20).
These points gain some support from Quine’s general view of what one commentator has called “the seamlessness of knowledge” (Hylton 2007, 8-9). This seamlessness of our overall system of knowledge emphasizes how all knowledge claims are on par without any significant breaks or gaps between them. There are not, then, on this view, different distinctive types of knowledge that may be responsive to divergence standards of evidence. Quine views human knowledge as one all-encompassing system of belief, which is accepted, rejected, or modified according to how well it accommodates and explains what is observed. He sometimes makes this point by highlighting the ‘continuity’ between the claims of common-sense and those of more advanced science, where all attempts at making true claims are viewed as continuous in the general sense of being responsive to the same standards of evidence and testability that are the hallmark of scientific knowledge (1976b, 233). Most significantly, this results in Quine’s rejection of any a priori element to human knowledge. This point received its most sophisticated modern formulation with Carnap’s use of the analytic-synthetic distinction. By rejecting any sharp distinction between analytic and synthetic truths, Quine is led to the further denial of any type of knowledge that is categorically distinct from that found in our system of empirical knowledge (for details, see Quine 1951; Hylton 2007, 48-80). We can also note that this view of knowledge serves to reinforce Quine’s view of philosophy as more or less identical with the philosophical examination of scientific practice.
Not surprisingly then, Quine views science as our most successful attempt at acquiring knowledge. Accordingly, if philosophical work is to contribute to human knowledge it must locate its concerns within this ongoing attempt to acquire successful knowledge of the world, and aspire to the very same scientific standards of clarity, utility and explanation. From this perspective, philosophical reflection cannot simply rely on the uncritical use of our everyday terms but will need to propose new ways of formulating its concerns based on the rigorous standards found in the sciences. Given the kind of standards that Quine emphasizes as conducive to philosophical progress and to the advancement of knowledge, it is perhaps not surprising to learn that much of the vocabulary used in philosophy does not meet his standards. He would then reject it as insufficiently clear for the purposes of his naturalistic conception of philosophy and as incapable of advancing our understanding of the issues it discusses (see Hylton 2007, 11; Quine 1981, 184-6; 1987). It is perhaps here that Quine’s basic attitude to philosophical concerns most clearly departs from other philosophical approaches.
One example of this tendency in Quine’s thought is found with the concept of ‘knowledge’ itself. While our everyday use of the term is unobjectionable, Quine thinks that it is too vague to meet the scientific demands of his theory of knowledge because it does not admit of clear and sharp boundaries. For example, it remains unclear how much evidence is needed for someone to ‘know’ something, or how much certainty is required for a belief to count as case of genuine knowledge (Quine 1987). Progress in the theory of knowledge cannot then be achieved if we continue to use such concepts as knowledge or evidence within the formulation of our problems and solutions. Given the more technical uses required of his scientific approach to knowledge Quine thinks it better to use expressions such as “our system of the world” or “our theory.” These expressions are sufficiently clear, or can be made so, to address the questions that matter while placing aside those concepts, and the concerns they generate, which would forestall any attempt at increased understanding.
This attitude can also be seen with Quine’s interest in ontological questions. Here he examines our system of scientific knowledge in order to further clarify how it might be best formulated, if it can be further simplified, and to make more explicit its basic ontological commitments. The interest here remains philosophical in the sense of being concerned with determining what general categories are needed to clearly specify what kinds of objects our scientific theory takes to be real. While such concerns are more abstract than the more focused empirical studies of the natural sciences, Quine does not take them to be distinct from such scientific questions:
What distinguishes between the ontological philosopher’s concerns and …[zoology, botany, and physics] is only breadth of categories. Given physical objects in general, the natural scientist is the man to decide about wombats and unicorns. Given classes…it is the mathematician to say whether in particular there are any even prime numbers…On the other hand it is the scrutiny of this uncritical acceptance of the realm of physical objects itself, or of classes, etc., that devolves upon ontology. (Quine 1960, 275)
General worries about ontology are then of a piece with specific scientific decisions about whether electrons or quarks exist; they are simply more general in their philosophical scrutiny of the broad categories needed to do justice to this specific acceptance of electrons or quarks. In carrying out these concerns, Quine requires that our scientific theory fit within the framework of first-order logic, have an ontology of physical objects and sets, and further meet the standards of physicalism (although Quine advocates a nonstandard use of the term “physicalism”) (see Hylton 2007, 324). In pursuing this logical ‘regimentation’ of our theory, Quine appeals to criteria that many philosophers have found to overly restrictive for calibrating human knowledge. Yet he thinks that it is only through such standards that we can clarify what we must acknowledge as real given our acceptance of that theory. To settle for less rigorous standards would obscure what our knowledge tells us about what ultimately exists.
The need to reformulate our philosophical concerns in this way highlights an important feature of Quine’s attitude to theoretical progress in science. Advances are often achieved through the recognition that our questions themselves cannot be successfully addressed because of the vagueness of the concepts employed. The proper response here is to recognize that our concepts are failing us, and to then search for better formulations that yield fruitful explanations of the phenomena under investigation. If as a result, some philosophical problems need to be dropped in favor of scientific formulations that hold the promise of increased understanding, then Quine would claim so much the worse for those old problems and their formulations. This itself represents a kind of scientific progress. Quine thinks that those philosophical problems most worth considering are those that can be clarified according to these scientific standards (see Hylton 2007, 11-12; Kemp 2006, 151-164). He is then impressed with the fact that scientific progress is often achieved by the dropping of the relevant terms, concepts, issues or distinctions that lead to the type of problems that hinder the growth of knowledge.
Quine’s extension of this general perspective into the study of human knowledge results in his famous naturalization of epistemology, where the philosophical treatment of knowledge is presented as a scientific account of how humans have developed a systematic scientific understanding of the world. Here is how Quine conceives his core epistemological project:
The business of naturalized epistemology, for me, is an improved understanding of the chains of causation and implication that connect the bombardment of our surfaces, at one extreme, with our scientific output at the other. (1995c, 349)
It is rational reconstruction of the individual’s and/or the [human] race’s actual acquisition of a responsible theory of the external world. It would address the question how we, physical denizens of the physical world, can have projected our scientific theory of that whole world from our meager contacts with it: from the mere impacts of rays and particles on our surfaces and a few odds and ends such as the strain of walking uphill. (1995a, 16)
A naturalized conception of human knowledge seeks to provide an improved scientific account of the connections between the activation of our sensory surfaces and our theoretical discourse about the world. Put succinctly, Quine seeks to elucidate how cognitive discourse about the world is systematically related to sensory stimulation. Because he rejects the epistemological search for some independent philosophical validation of scientific inquiry, Quine’s own project presupposes and thus uses whatever scientific resources he thinks are relevant to understanding human knowledge (1992, 19).
So, Quine takes the traditional problem of the epistemology of empirical knowledge and interprets it in exclusively scientific terms. From this viewpoint, epistemological problems need to be reformulated according to those standards of clarity, evidence and explanation that are found in science. This explains Quine’s use of the various technical terms that form part of his project, such as “observation sentence,” “neural intake,” and others. These are all chosen for their perceived ability to adhere to the methodological dictates of empirical science. The usual philosophical concepts of “experience,” “sense data,” and “the external world” are too unclear to advance the type of scientific understanding and explanation promoted by Quine’s naturalized conception of epistemology. He replaces them with scientifically acceptable counterparts in the form of “stimulations,” “the triggering of sensory receptors” and “observation sentence.”
Perhaps his most significant move in this direction is the rejection of any conception of observation as something empirically ‘given’ that grounds or justifies our knowledge. Here, he follows Russell and Popper and rejects induction as providing confirmation of our theories through an appeal to pure observation (see Lugg 2006). Instead, Quine examines how knowledge emerges from our responses to sensory stimulation and how observation sentences (sentences we are disposed to accept or reject simply on the basis of stimulation) are related to these responses. Quine thinks that science itself tells us that our information about the world comes through the impingement of energy on our sensory surfaces resulting in the stimulation of our nerve endings (1992, 19). This empirical fact stands as a scientific vindication of empiricism, and it forms the basis for Quine’s further reflections on the nature of natural knowledge. Philosophers have generally been skeptical about the possibility of accounting for human knowledge in such austere scientific terms, most notably, without any use of the concepts of knowledge, meaning and understanding. Quine’s response to such skepticism consists of his attempt to sketch the details of this naturalistic account and thus demonstrate how it is possible to make sense of human knowledge and our use of cognitive language in such strict scientific terms. He then endeavors to show that we can pursue such an account without presupposing any mentalistic concepts (see Hylton 2007, 94-5).
In doing so, he provides a genetic account describing how humans have come to learn cognitive language. To bring out the epistemological significance of such an account he draws a parallel between the learning of cognitive language and the evidential support for a scientific theory:
The channels by which, having learned observation sentences, we acquire theoretical language, are the very same channels by which observation lends evidence to scientific theory…We see, then, a strategy for investigating the relation of evidential support, between observation and scientific theory. We can adopt a genetic approach, studying how theoretical language is learned. For the evidential relation is virtually enacted, it would seem, in the learning. This genetic strategy is attractive because the learning of language goes on in the world and is open to scientific study. It is a strategy for the scientific study of scientific method and evidence. (Quine 1975a, 75-6)
On Quine’s account, for a sentence to be considered cognitive it must be connected in some way to sentences that are answerable to sensory stimulation. It is through the learning of language that such connections are forged, since the child must learn to use sentences in response to sensory stimulation. The link between language and the world is described in terms of sentences causally tied to neural input, and is essential to both the learning of language and the responsiveness of theory to evidence (see Hylton 2007, 95).
Quine’s emphasis on language learning and causal conditioning has been at times sharply criticized as overly behaviorist in orientation (Searle 1987). It is then important to clarify the extent of this behaviorist commitment. (For further details see Gibson 2004.) Importantly, Quine dismisses any definition of behaviorism that limits it to conditioned response, and explains “What matters, as I see it, is just the insistence upon couching all criteria in observation terms” (1976a, 58). From his perspective behaviorism is a crucial methodological requirement resulting from the need for observable evidence, which facilitates the prediction and testing of hypotheses, and is also mandated by sound empirical method. He further explains how this “disciplines data, not explanation” and that to account for any appreciable language learning beyond the present observable scene requires a significant innate endowment: “Behaviorism welcomes genetics, neurology and innate endowments” (2000d, 417). Even if the processes involved in the learning of observation sentences should turn out to be unlike classical conditioning, this still would not, Quine emphasizes, be a refutation of behaviorism (Quine 1976a, 57). His use of the term is solely concerned with the establishment of the observable evidence required by empirical method. Quine’s behaviorism is not then some odd a priori assumption, nor a straightforward empirical thesis, but stands as the name for an approach to language learning which signals Quine’s commitment to the evidential and methodological requirements of his naturalism. His understanding of what is required with such a commitment results in his use of this behaviorist stance when examining language and the nature of human knowledge.
Quine’s genetic account then utilizes this methodological requirement to consider how the human child, subject to various forms of sensory stimulation, could come to acquire a theory of the world. He takes knowledge itself to be embodied within our language, so the examination of how this language is learned will enable us to better understand how the causal relations between observation sentences and sensory stimulation yield evidence for our scientific theory. Beginning with our basic cognitive vocabulary, we see that the child starts by making basic, primitive responses to sensory stimulation, and through the encouragement and discouragement of others, more sophisticated language and knowledge gradually emerges. In describing the various steps the child would take, Quine continues to emphasis the importance of observation sentences, which are those expressions that children learn through direct association with neural input (Quine 1995a, 22-25).
Observation sentences are an important subset of occasion sentences, sentences that are true or false on different occasions, with the additional requirement that they command an individual’s assent or dissent outright on the specific occasion of the relevant stimulation (Quine 1992, 3). The significance of observation sentences cannot be overemphasized, because they serve as the final objective checkpoint of science. It is through the utterance of an observation sentence that one provides the prediction that tests a hypothesis implied by our scientific theory. It is the requirement that neural input prompt the verdict outright, without further reflection, which makes the observation sentence the final checkpoint. The further requirement of intersubjectivity, unlike the report of a pain or feeling, indicates that the observation sentence yields the same response from all linguistically competent members of the community, revealing the source of the objective nature of science.
We can then imagine the child being conditioned to utter certain observation sentences in response to neural input, such as “milk,” when encountering the necessary stimulus. Over time children learn to assent and dissent, learning to assent to a sentence when stimulated in a way that would have caused them to utter that expression themselves, and to dissent when stimulated in a way that would not cause the utterance of this sentence. Quine emphasizes how such observation sentences, “Milk,” “Dog,” “Red” and “It’s raining” should be treated as wholes or holophrastically; each expression, whether containing one word or more, is conditioned as a whole to stimulation, and not as containing component words: “Each is simply an expression learned intact by association with stimulation and, derivatively, similar stimulations” (Quine 1984, 15). Each such observation sentence becomes associated with a range of perceptually similar neural intakes through conditioning. Quine defines perceptual similarity as a relation between an individual’s neural intake, testable through the reinforcement and extinction of the individual’s responses. He explains that perceptual similarity “is the basis of all learning, all habit formation, all expectation by induction from past experience; for we are innately disposed to expect similar events to have sequels that are similar to each other” (Quine 1995b, 253).
The relation between neural input and observation sentences is then understood in terms of conditioned response and subjective standards of perceptual similarity. However, there remains a lingering difficulty only resolved in some of Quine’s last writings in epistemology (see Quine 1995a, 1996, 2000a). Simply put, the problem concerns bridging “the gap between the privacy of our neural intake and the publicity of our testimony” (2000e, 409). Consider the surrounding environment of two interlocutors, what we might call the distal scene. Observation sentences tend to report this distal scene, and our agreement on what we see is registered with such verbal reports. Once we consider the causal chain from distal objects to our neural input we realize that all we share is this distal cause of our utterance; that is, we both utter “rabbit” in the presence of rabbits, but our perspectives on the scene are different, and there is no homology (shared neural structure) between our nerve endings. Despite this neural diversity we end up associating the same words with the same object, and the problem then is: “How is this distal harmony across proximal heterogeneity to be explained?” (Quine 2000e, 407).
Quine’s answer involves what he calls a “preestablished harmony of standards of perceptual similarity” (1996). He begins with his familiar emphasis on each individual’s subjective similarity standards and their central role in learning. Each bit of neural intake is similar to another more than it is to others, allowing us to notice differences as well as similarities. However, such perceptual similarities are private between us, and we share no receptors, nor are they homologous, but we still end up agreeing on the passing show. I utter “rabbit,” and you agree; in this case my neural intake was perceptually similar to earlier ones, as was your current ‘rabbity’ intake. What explains this convergence is a preestablished harmony between our similarity scales. Generally, when two events produce neural intakes that are perceptually similar for me, they also tend to be perceptually similar for you. Some of these similarity metrics must be innate, since learning cannot get started without them. Quine then concludes that our perceptual similarity standards are in part innate, and are in preestablished harmony. This harmony is further explained through natural selection:
There is survival value in successful induction, successful expectation: it expedites our elusion of predators and our pursuit of prey. Natural selection, then, has favored similarity standards that mesh relatively well with the succession of natural events…It…explains the preestablished harmony: the standards are largely fixed in the genes of the race, the species” (2000b, 2).
Our ability to successfully engage in primitive induction or expectation, as well as successfully communicate with each other about the distal scene, is revealed as dependent on this harmony of our subjective standards of perceptual similarity. Natural selection accounts for this through its shaping of our ancestor’s perceptual standards into a partial conformity with our own shared environment. It is through such biological origins that sensory connections between language and the world were forged, further establishing the responsiveness to observation of our later more advanced scientific pronouncements.
In addition to his interest in the acquisition of scientific knowledge, Quine also reflects on our theory as a more or less finished product and considers in a more general way the nature of the relationship between this theory and its evidence:
Within this baffling tangle of relations between our sensory stimulation and our scientific theory of the world, there is a segment that we can gratefully separate out and clarify without pursuing neurology, psychology, psycholinguistics, genetics, or history. It is the part where theory is tested by prediction. It is the relation of evidential support, and its essentials can be schematized by means of little more than logical analysis. (Quine 1992, 1-2)
Examining the logical links between our scientific statements and their connection to observation reveals that as a matter of strict logical implication our theory can be seen to imply its evidence (Quine 1975b). For example, what our scientific theory tells us about the physical composition of metal indicates that it will expand when heated. It then follows from our theory that if we heat a piece of metal this will result in its expansion. The claims made by our scientific theory imply that under certain conditions, specific observations will follow, and such observations count as evidence for the theory being on the right track. When such an implied hypothesis happens as expected (the metal expands) then our confidence in the original hypothesis increases and we provisionally include it within our backlog of theory. But when this hypothesis fails in its predictions, it has been falsified, and the theory requires further revision. These revisions must prevent the false implication but continue to imply the correct claims of our previously unrevised theory. This indicates that in general Quine accepts the hypothetico-deductive method that many philosophers have emphasized as central to scientific inquiry, and further endorses Karl Popper’s view that observation only serves to falsify our hypotheses and never confirms them (1992, 12-16).
However, there remains an issue concerning the nature of the evidence that is implied by our theory. More specifically, we might ask what plays the role of evidence within Quine’s naturalized account of knowledge (see Davidson 1983)? Given Quine’s naturalized account of knowledge, his answer must be in line with scientific practice. Although, he has at times claimed that observation sentences should be seen as evidence, they cannot measure up to this naturalist standard (1969a). This is because observation sentences are also occasion sentences where their truth-value can vary, while our theory and its implications (if true) would be true once and for all. There then appears to be no direct inferential connection between our theoretical statements and observation sentences (Quine 1975b).
In order to better capture scientific practice, Quine then introduces what he calls “observation categoricals” to help bridge this inferential gap between theory and evidence. An observation categorical is a hypothetical expression that links two observation sentences where the first specifies some experimental conditions and the second suggests what will follow from such conditions. In other words, they express the general expectation that whenever one observation sentence holds, the other will also (Quine 1995a, 25). Simple examples might include: “When it rains, it pours” or “Where there is smoke, there is fire.” For Quine, these constructions highlight the way in which evidence for a respective hypothesis is to be found: “The scientist deduces from his hypotheses that a certain observable situation should bring about another observable situation; then he realizes the one situation and watches for the other. Evidence for or against his set of hypotheses ensues, however inconclusive” (2000c, 411).
The observable consequences predicted by the observation categorical are offered in the form of observation sentences that are directly conditioned to sensory stimulation, and in this way remain answerable to observation and evidence as Quine conceives it. But the categorical itself is an eternal sentence (true or false once and for all) implied by our background theory, and if true can be incorporated into our theory (1981, 26). Experimental method then remains the source of justification for our beliefs: “Where I do find justification of science and evidence of truth is…in successful prediction of observations…” (Quine 2000c, 412). The scientist is justified in his belief that whenever X then Y because it has been provisionally supported by an experiment that has yielded the predicted consequences. Concerns over justification and evidence acquire paradigm expression in the experimental situation, with the endorsement of specific hypotheses stemming from their fulfilled prediction as described in observation categoricals.
Quine then takes our scientific theory of the world to imply its evidence, now seen as consisting of a set of observation categoricals. But he explains how the reverse does not hold, since no group of observation categoricals will logically imply our theory (Quine 1975b, 228). This fact further suggests that more than one theory might be compatible with the evidence, that is, imply the same group of observation categoricals. This conclusion is usually referred to as the underdetermination of theory by evidence – the view that our choice of theory is not wholly determined by the evidence. Quine thinks that this general thesis acquires some support from his holistic view of theories, where theoretical statements fail to imply any observation categoricals in isolation from one another, but must be taken together as a larger group if they are to have empirical implications. It is then because of Quine’s claim that there is a significant degree of empirical looseness of fit between theories and their evidence, that the evidence cannot uniquely determine one single theory. And this opens up the possibility that several theories may be compatible with that evidence.
Although such considerations lend some plausibility to the underdetermination thesis, Quine argues that once we attempt to further clarify this thesis, it is revealed as not as intuitively plausible as it originally appeared. The basic problem stems from the consequence suggested by the thesis, namely, that if we have an overall global theory, then there is also another empirically equivalent alternative theory. The trouble then consists of making sense of what “alternative” might mean in this context (1975b, 230-241). Quine wonders if there is way of making sense of such alternatives that rule out trivial cases, leaving us an interesting formulation of the basic thesis. He invokes the idea of translation between theories to highlight their distinctness, where we claim that our global theory has an alternative that is empirically equivalent but which cannot be translated sentence by sentence into our theory.
These theories differ in the predicates they use within their respective languages. A trivial example is given by switching two terms, “molecule” and “electron,” that do not appear in any observation sentence. These two theories would then be empirically equivalent since they imply the same observation sentences, but they say different things because one assigns certain properties to molecules, while the other denies them and attributes them to electrons (Quine 1981, 28-9). Successfully translating one to the other would then require a systematic conversion of one into the other. The underdetermination thesis that emerges from these remarks “asserts that our system of the world is bound to have empirically equivalent alternatives that are not reconcilable by reconstrual of predicates” (Quine 1975b, 242). Quine thinks it remains an open question whether this situation could arise. But, he does endorse the possibility that we might uncover empirically equivalent theories that we see no way to successfully reconcile through translation (1992, 97; see Hylton 2007, 189-196).
Quine’s discussion of issues involving the justification of theoretical statements stands in sharp contrast to the common criticism that his naturalized epistemology eliminates any normative concern with justification. The standard reference for this criticism is found with Kim (1993), who argues that Quine’s naturalized account of knowledge asks us to “set aside the entire framework of justification-centered epistemology” replacing it with “ a purely descriptive, causal-nomological science of human cognition” (224). With his explicit appeal to the resources of natural science, Kim takes Quine’s epistemological program as only describing how we have arrived at our current beliefs, and as incapable of accounting for the rational basis of these beliefs, or providing any recommendations concerning what beliefs we should accept or reject. He concludes that Quinean naturalized epistemology results in a radical rejection of the traditional normative project of epistemology.
Quine’s emphasis on the causal connections between our sensory surfaces and the statements of advanced science forms one element of his attempt to clarify the evidential support of science but one that does not explicitly address Kim’s normative concern. That is, it does not deal with questions of justification, or reasons for belief, and consequently does not establish those standards needed for the evaluation of our beliefs. Moreover, Quine would agree that sensory stimulation is incapable of dealing with normative concerns involving evidence, since this causal source of ‘information’ does not justify our beliefs, because we are unaware of our sensory input and cannot then infer anything from it. This agreement is partly obscured with Quine’s occasional use of “evidence” in summary statements of his position. However, this concept is not clear enough to be used within the more precise scientific formulations required of Quine’s naturalized account of knowledge. By concentrating on “the causal-nomological” element of Quine’s view, and finding there no evident interest in the issue of justification, Kim concludes that naturalized epistemology eschews any such concern. But this mistakenly takes Quine’s description of the causal chains from stimulus to science as all that would remain of epistemology after it has been situated within the empirical constraints of natural science. Quine thinks that concerns over justification find their most explicit expression in experimental contexts, when specific hypotheses lead to their fulfilled prediction. These predicted expectations are captured with his use of observation categoricals that serve to bridge the inferential gap between observation sentences and the more advanced pronouncements of our scientific theory.
This view of justification is also in accord with Kim’s insistence that epistemology indicate the conditions beliefs must satisfy to be considered justified. It further indicates which beliefs we have a rational responsibility to hold and those we do not. Through his appeal to experimental method and the claim that hypotheses are justified through the successful prediction of observational consequences, Quine indicates that these hypotheses are to be accepted while others that fail to lead to their respective predictions are not. Rather than reject normative epistemology, Quine’s theory of knowledge provides an account of the normative that is tempered by scientific resources and empirical methods. The result is a view of justification that remains capable of addressing those justificatory concerns that Kim sees as fundamental to the traditional normative project of epistemology. This suggests that the central normative issue that divides Quine and his critics does not involve the question of whether individual claims are justified but rather centers on his more fundamental denial of any general evaluative perspective on science from some external philosophical vantage point. For more on these issues see Gregory 2008, Johnsen 2005, Roth 1999, and Sinclair 2004, 2007.
Quine’s concern with science or with our overarching “scientific theory of the world” is not confined to the acquisition and evidential support of this theory, but also considers the question of its further ontological commitments. Here, he is interested in what the world is like in its most general structural features, and in further clarifying what our scientific theory tells us about this ontological structure (Quine 1960, 161). Such concerns indicate a philosophical task for the naturalist philosopher: a detailed consideration of how our scientific theory might be organized and systematized. This, as we will see, results in Quine’s attempt to further simply this theory and in the process help to clarify what sorts of objects we must acknowledge as real given our acceptance of this theory.
In carrying out this systemization of our theory Quine speaks of its “regimentation,” in which the theory is to be cast in a logically clear and rigorous language (1960, 157). The results of this regimentation further lead to ontological reduction, in which we appeal to various logical techniques to demonstrate that our theory does not commit us to the existence of certain kinds of things that it may, at first glance, appear to (Hylton 2007, 245). The overall aims of regimentation are to make our theory clearer, more precise and systematic. Quine takes this drive towards greater systematization as central to the improvement of human knowledge generally. It is precisely these further systematic refinements to our knowledge that helps it move beyond the claims of commonsense to more sophisticated science (Quine 1976b, 233-234). By injecting greater system into the precise examination of evidence the scientist is able to take positive steps beyond commonsense understanding. Quine views the philosophical concerns that motivate his use of logical regimentation as a straightforward continuation of the scientific effort to impose greater system upon our theory (see Hylton 2007, 232-233). The scientist is interested in organizing and clarifying some specific area of a theory, such as biology or chemistry, in order to provide a better understanding of that part of human knowledge and further lay the groundwork for future progress in that area. The philosophical aim here is, not surprisingly, broader and more abstract than that of the empirical scientist, but the motivation and result is the same (Quine 1960, 275-276). These ontological interests are another example of the way Quine conceives of philosophy as continuous with the aims and motives of scientific inquiry.
Quine is concerned with making explicit the ontological claims that our theory requires us to accept. In other words, what kinds of objects must we accept as real, given our commitment to this theory (Hylton 2007, 236). In pursuing such issues, he thinks that our ordinary language or system of concepts fails to make explicit the nature of such ontological commitments, because it fails to definitely pick out objects. When dealing with various ontological concerns, we cannot then simply “read them off” our ordinary use of terms and concepts:
The common man’s ontology is vague and untidy in two ways. It takes in many purported objects that are vaguely or inadequately defined. But also, what is more significant, it is vague in its scope; we cannot even tell in general which of these vague things to ascribe to a man’s ontology at all, which things to count him as assuming…It is only our somewhat regimented and sophisticated language of science that has evolved in such a way as really to raise ontological questions. (Quine 1979, 276)
It is only once we have cast our knowledge of the world into a regimented notation that it then makes sense to ask about what it claims to exist. However, there are various logical methods and techniques available for this logical calibration or regimentation. We must then choose a method, and base this choice on that method which does the best job at helping us systematize our theory. Quine argues that the best way to regiment our theory is to formulate it within the terms set by the syntax of classical first order logic. Setting up our theory within such syntactical forms will, he thinks, provide the best way of simplifying and clarifying this theory (see Hylton 2007, 252). Quine’s general concern with clearly and explicitly capturing the nature of our theory’s ontological commitments is then intimately connected with his attempt to regiment our scientific theory into the syntax of modern logic.
One important way that regimentation helps with the simplification and clarification of our theory is through helping us avoid nagging philosophical problems by ‘resolving’ them. Again, this claim needs to be measured against problematic features of ordinary language use. Ordinary language contains idioms and constructions that lead to puzzling questions or paradoxes. For example, to meaningfully speak about some thing not existing, seems to require that there is in fact such an object to talk about. But following Russell, Quine shows how such expressions can be rewritten within a formal language using quantifiers and bound variables (for more details see Quine 1948, 1-19; Hylton 2007, 280-297). The meaningfulness of such expressions is then understood within the resources of a formal language and does not further require that there exist objects such as a round square, or Pegasus, in order for us to speak meaningful of there being no round square, nor Pegasus.
For such reasons, Quine thinks that we can avoid these idioms and constructions and, in turn, sidestep the philosophical puzzlement that accompanies them. This reflects his attitude to progress in philosophy and science, where serious philosophical work is concerned with science or our general systematic structure of human knowledge. The simplification of this theory demonstrates how to avoid puzzling and irresolvable questions that have been part of historical philosophical concerns. Scientific work can than move forward without any distraction from such potential philosophical impediments to progress (Hylton 2007, 244). Quine explains that “problems are dissolved in the important sense of being shown to be purely verbal, and purely verbal in the important sense of arising from usages that can be avoided in favor of ones that engender no such problems” (1960, 261). It should be stressed that Quine does not think that all philosophical problems can be dissolved in this way. His point here is to emphasize that philosophical worries often derive from the vagueness of the terms employed, rather than from a discovery of a genuine issue that needs to be addressed. This itself is revealed once we adopt a proper scientific attitude to the problem, further demonstrating that it is unreal and should placed aside.
We have seen that Quine takes the ontological claims of our theory as only becoming clear relative to some form of logical regimentation. However, at first glance, it appears as if our ordinary discourse comes with ontological commitments. The subject of a given sentence seems to correspond to an object, suggesting that accepting such a sentence is to commit oneself to the existence of that object. It is possible that given our choice of a regimented language, this commitment may remain, or we may be able to do without it, since the sentence can be logically recalibrated without any reference to such an object. This second case is one of ontological reduction, where we have demonstrated how the commitment to the existence of an object does not need to be taken as a real commitment (Hylton 2007, 246; Quine 1960, 257-262).
Quine illustrates this point with his discussion of the definition of an ordered pair. Within set theory, the definition of set is indifferent to the order of its members. The set consisting of my coffee cup and my copy of Word and Object is the same set as that made up of my copy of Word and Object and my coffee cup. There are times, however, when this order makes a difference and we need to specify which member of a set comes first and which comes second. To do so we introduce an entity called an “ordered pair.” For example to define the relation of fatherhood, we would introduce the ordered pair of <Abraham, Isaac> where the first member is male and the second is a child of the first. The father relation can then be defined as the set of all ordered pairs of this kind (Quine 1960, 257). Ordered pairs need to be subject to one fundamental postulate: that the ordered pair consisting of a and b is identical to the ordered pair consisting of x and y if and only if a = x and b = y (Gustafsson 2006, 60; Hylton 2007, 247). Now, the ontological issue concerns the apparent need to be committed to an extra entity called ‘ordered pair’ of which this postulate is true or whether we can define this construction using only the conceptual resources within our existing theory, that is, within set theory. It turns out that we do not need to assume the existence of such entities, since there are, at least, two ways to use set theory to define ordered pairs (for details, see Gustaffsson 2006, 60-65; Hylton 2007, 247). The above postulate can then be translated via a theorem of set theory using one of these proposed definitions. When our explanatory needs require a more precise specification of the order of a set’s members, we are able to meet this demand by simply using the resources of our existing theory. The justification for making such theoretical maneuvers and using these definitions, is found with the demands of overall utility and convenience; we can address our explanatory interests by using the existing resources of set theory while avoiding assumptions and entities that we do not need. For Quine, it does not matter that there are several definitions of ordered pair available, nor that they make different claims about what ordered pairs ‘really’ are. Any definition that is capable of fulfilling the basic postulate is deemed acceptable for his theoretical purposes (Gustaffsson 2006, 61; Hylton 2007, 247-8). Simply put, what these definitions then show is that we can proceed with our explanatory interests without ordered pairs. Despite his focus on this relatively technical point internal to set theory, Quine suggests that we draw a general philosophical moral:
This construction is paradigmatic of what we are most typically up to when in a philosophical sprit we offer an “analysis” or “explication” of some hitherto inadequately formulated “idea” or expression.… We fix on the particular functions of the unclear expression that make it worth troubling about, and then devise a substitute, clear and couched in terms to our liking, that fills those functions. Beyond those conditions of partial agreement, dictated by our interests and purposes, any traits of the explicans come under the head of “don’t-cares” (Quine 1960, 258-259).
This definition or explication of ‘ordered pair’ has this broader ontological significance because the technical issues that motivate it are here viewed as simply a basic part of what it means to address such ontological questions. Due to the inherent vagueness of our ordinary discourse, Quine views ontology itself to be largely an artificial enterprise, which is inseparable from the very sort of logical techniques and regimentation we have discussed (Hylton 2004, 128). The study of ontology requires addressing those technical issues that answer the explanatory needs of convenience, simplicity and overall considerations of utility. For Quine, any serious attempt at clarifying our ontological commitments will then involve the technical considerations found in this explication of the ordered pair.
This definition or explication has resulted in our proceeding without assuming the existence of ordered pairs. There then remains a general question concerning whether such ontological reductions explain or eliminate the entity under consideration. Given Quine’s general attitude to ontological issues, we might expect that he recognizes no sharp difference here between explication and elimination. If the definition results in a rejection of certain uses of a term, then we may be more inclined to view this as a rejection of the entity in question. But if these uses are still recognized as important in different contexts, we may favor the explication of the term rather than its elimination. Given the artificial nature of the ontological enterprise, these are largely rhetorical differences that do not admit of sharp boundaries (Quine 1960, 261).
This is perhaps best seen with Quine’s view of the disagreement within the philosophy of mind between identity theorists and so-called eliminative materialists (see Gustaffsson 2006). Despite a lack of neurophysical detail, Quine thinks that we still can provide an explication of the mental that shows how to proceed without the positing of mental entities. If one grants that each mental state has a corresponding bodily state, then we can simply assign mental predicates to states of the physical body, thus bypassing any need to assign the mental to some non-bodily substance. John’s pain is not located in some mind that is in a state of pain, but we instead take the predicate “is feeling pain” as applicable directly to John’s body. In this way we get rid of all reference to mental entities and appeal to mental predicates as applying only to physical things, in this case John’s body (Gustaffsson 2006, 66). As in the case of ordered pairs, we have a definition that leads to ontological reduction, and we might be inclined to ask whether this reduction explains what mental states really are, or eliminates then completely from our ontology.
Quine’s attitude here is the same as before; a proper scientific regimentation of discourse about minds demonstrates how to proceed without the positing of mental entities. But the further question of whether this identifies the mental with the physical or eliminates the mental is shown to be merely a rhetorical difference. It is only through our choice of a logical framework, a regimented language, that we are capable of settling the question of what identity criteria are available. Once this has been decided we can recognize that scientific discourse about minds does not require a commitment to mental entities. However, this reveals that there are no further objective facts characterized within this formally regimented language that settles the question of the identification or elimination of the mental (see Gustaffsson 2006, 67-68; Quine 1960, 265). We have shown how our commitment to physicalism is compatible with the explanatory need to posit mental states, but how we might further describe this outcome is merely a choice between which way of talking we like best (Quine 1995a, 86).
With regard to Quine’s general attitude within ontology we have seen his insistence on clarity, utility, ontological reduction, and the general simplicity and sparseness of our theoretical commitments. These features coupled with Quine’s early flirtation with nominalism might lead one to conclude that his philosophy be characterized as “nominalist” (Quine 1946, Quine and Goodman 1947). However, this conclusion does not follow. Much of our theorizing uses abstract objects, including for example, mathematics objects such as numbers and functions, which in turn form a crucial part of the overall structure of the sciences. Without abstract objects we would be unable to accommodate mathematics within our overall system of knowledge, and so would deprive ourselves of such knowledge within natural science. Moreover, ordinary statements such as “I own two cars,” appeal to the idea of a type of object, which we may most readily understand in terms of abstract entities (See Hylton 2007, 302-303). Quine is then driven to accept abstract entities, by stressing the overwhelming theoretical and structural reasons for including them into our ontology. It is important to note that no experiment or fulfilled prediction settles this or any other ontological issue (Quine 1960, 276). Rather, the reality of abstract objects gains indirect support through the structural benefits they provide our theory in our ongoing attempt to formulate testable hypotheses.
Quine further clarifies the status and role of such abstract objects through an appeal to sets as the only type of abstract object required. Most significantly, he thinks it is possible to demonstrate how various mathematical entities can be defined using only sets. The use of sets then allows us to preserve the importance of mathematics and its crucial role within the language of natural science, while admitting only one type of abstract object into our ontology.
When Quine’s general ontological viewpoint is characterized as physicalist, we must note its endorsement of physical objects, and abstract objects. This use of “physicalism” is nonstandard, as the term is sometimes equated with materialism (only physical things exist), and as explicitly rejecting the existence of abstract objects (see Hylton 2007, 310). Quine further formulates his physicalism as the view that there is no difference without a physical difference. That is, nothing happens in the world without a redistribution of microphysical states (Quine 1981, 98). Importantly, this does not result in a strict form of reductive physicalism, where, for example, we might claim that a particular type of physical event occurs when someone thinks about their vacation in Mexico. Rather, Quine advocates a form of what is often called “nonreductive physicalism,” in which various vocabularies, including intentional descriptions, cannot be reduced to the language of physics, but that each particular mental event can be identified with a specific physical event. He takes the general significance of this form of physicalism as stemming from the fact that it is physics, as the fundamental science, which aims for the full coverage of all events in the universe:
…nothing happens in the world, not the flutter of the eyelid, not the flicker of a thought, without some redistribution of microphysical states…If the physicist suspected that there was any event that did not consist in the redistribution of the elementary states allowed for in his physical theory, he would seek a way of supplementing his theory. Full coverage in this sense is the very business of physics, and only of physics. (Quine 1981, 98)
It falls to physics to account for all actions and events within its universal and exceptionless laws. The importance that Quine assigns to his physicalism is based on the plausible empirical assumption that there is an adequate physical theory to be found along the lines he suggests (Hylton 2007, 315-316). While physics remains incomplete, it nonetheless provides us with a coherent unified theory with great explanatory power. It is reasonable to believe that, as the details of physical theory are further worked out, the resulting theory will remain a natural extension and continuation of the current physical understanding at hand.
Quine further emphasizes what he describes as a “robust” realism about the objects posited by our overarching theory of world. This realism remains grounded in his naturalistic conception of philosophy, where it is science itself that describes and identifies the most basic features of reality. He emphasizes the way human knowledge is a means for the prediction of observation or, more technically, of sensory stimulation:
Our talk of external things, our very notion of things, is just a conceptual apparatus that helps us foresee and control the triggering of our sensory receptors in the light of previous triggering of sensory receptors. The triggering, first and last, is all that we have to go on. (1981, 1)
This view of knowledge appears to suggest that theories are only instruments, and then conflict with the realist stance Quine further affirms of the objects posited by our scientific theories (Hylton 2007, 18-22). If knowledge is simply viewed as a way of predicting stimulation, then why should we take the further step and proclaim that the objects it claims to tell us about really exist? The basic critical point here claims that despite Quine’s professed realism his view of theories and their relations to sensory stimulation prevent him from taking the things described as real.
This point is reinforced with Quine’s emphasis on what he calls “Ontological Relativity” (Quine 1969b). Suppose we have provided a fully regimented scientific theory in which all of our ontological commitments are now completely transparent. Quine argues that there remains more than one way to interpret such commitments. We can provide a different interpretation of its predicates, and this will give a corresponding change in the ontological commitments of the theory. For example, instead of claiming that x is a dog, we could say that x is a certain temporal stage of a dog. Here, the predicates assigned to the objects of the theory have changed, but the overall structure of the theory remains the same; and its empirical content, that is, its implied observations, also remain unchanged (see Hylton 2004, 115-150). But what the theory tells us is real has changed. Quine thinks it is important that the structure of our theory is built up to accommodate sensory experience, but that the objects used to carry this out can vary. Once again, this may seem to conflict with his further commitment to a realism about the objects posited by our theory. More specifically, in spite of his emphasis on viewing objects as theoretical posits, and how they can vary with no impact on implied observation, he still affirms the reality of the objects posited by our theory. He himself thinks that this represents no serious conflict, and that the key reconciliation of these elements is found with his naturalism (1981, 21). It will then be useful to briefly examine why Quine thinks his naturalism can reconcile the instrumentalist and realist elements of his philosophy of science.
Standard forms of instrumentalism take scientific theories to be instruments for making predictions but view the objects or entities named within such theories as merely useful fictions. They are not claimed to be real, but are simply posited in order to help us make successful predictions. Sometimes this view claims that everyday objects like tables and chairs are real and that the posited non-observable fictions of the theory help us understand the observable behavior of such real objects. Other times it takes all of these objects, including chairs and tables as useful fictions. Either way, such positions rely on a distinction between types or levels of reality, in which one class of objects is depicted as somehow less real than the other, and such objects are then just simple posits for organizing our experience of things (see Hylton 2007, 18-20).
Importantly, Quine’s epistemological and ontological views do not permit any such contrast. He does not think that we can take our sensory stimulations as real while at the same time viewing physical objects as mere fictions. For Quine, sensory stimulations are physical objects and we then need to view them as on par with all other physical objects. But this is a basic corollary of his naturalistic stance in philosophy. Quine’s naturalism emphasizes that we always begin within our ongoing theory of the world, which takes for granted both the existence of the physical world and our knowledge of that world. There is then no neutral, pre-theoretical position that would provide us with access to some other standard of reality. He rejects the claim that in philosophical inquiry we can appeal to a standard of reality that is different from the one we use when we distinguish, for example, a real pool of water from a mere mirage (Hylton 2007, 20). What we have available is our ordinary knowledge of things, where further modifications of this knowledge may lead through a process of internal development. Consequently, we lack any superior standard of reality other than that found within our general overarching systematic theory of the world. Stated somewhat differently, it is only by means of our developing our theory of the world that we have any coherent way of distinguishing what is real from what is not real.
This represents, once again, a rejection of any philosophical perspective that is independent of the general philosophical (and scientific) task of establishing the best theory available for the predicting and making sense of our sensory stimulation. We select scientific theories that best predict sensory input, but, in contrast with the instrumentalist, we cannot simply rest with prediction, and are further committed to affirming the reality of the objects described by the theory.
Quine’s naturalism reconciles the instrumentalist and realist elements of his view by affirming that epistemological and ontological commitments go hand in hand. There is no conflict between our recognition that knowledge is a human-made artifact designed to accommodate observation and our further acceptance of the reality of those objects discussed by that knowledge (Hylton 2007, 22). We can study how we have constructed our knowledge of the world, while at the same time taking for granted the theory we are trying to make sense of with its realistic acceptance of objects, sets, nerve endings, and human beings. Quine’s naturalism then claims that the study of human knowledge takes place within the theory it studies and presupposes the reality of the objects discussed in that theory. There is, as he remarks, “no first philosophy prior to natural science” (Quine 1981, 67).
Few philosophers have been willing to adopt Quine’s strict standards nor have they accepted all the details of his respective views. Nevertheless, his influence has been widespread, and its importance can be measured in several different ways.
From the standpoint of the development of philosophy in America, Quine’s early training in logic and his later promotion of themes from logical empiricist philosophy helped set the stage for the emergence of what would be called “analytic philosophy.” Quine saw the importance of logical empiricism within its marshaling of logical techniques in philosophy, and this would then prove central for his later explicit development of a scientific, naturalist conception of philosophy, which rejected any epistemologically significant understanding of the a priori. His emphasis on the technical, scientific aspects of philosophy fed into the increasing pressure for professionalization in philosophy. In the aftermath of the Second World War, Quine’s understanding of the discipline prevailed, with conceptions of scientific philosophy and various forms of scientific naturalism reaffirming the model of the professional philosopher as empirical technician, rather than as moral and social visionary (for more details see Isaac 2005, 205-234).
Quine’s most explicit philosophical influence is then to be found in his empirical reconfiguration of philosophy, and its suggestion that philosophical inquiry must be intimately tied to empirical scientific work. Following Quine’s emphasis on naturalized epistemology, many analytic philosophers have proceeded to ‘naturalize’ various areas of philosophical inquiry. Such projects emphasize the importance of a greater alignment between philosophy and the empirical sciences, while raising suspicions about many traditional projects in philosophy that trade in objects (such as minds, propositions, meanings, and norms) that are hard to locate in the natural world. Although Quine’s philosophy does not engage in any detailed way with empirical results, his work can be usefully viewed as a general model for how philosophical issues can be interpreted scientifically. It is not surprising to see recent trends in naturalistic philosophy making a more explicit appeal to work in psychology, evolutionary biology, neuroscience, and the cognitive sciences. For some examples, see Churchland 1987 and Kornblith 1994.
The idea that philosophy should be informed by work in the sciences may seem hard to resist. The impressive successes found in modern science make it a compelling example of how to pattern our ongoing attempts to advance human knowledge. Moreover, in the face of scientific prestige and progress, philosophers have faced the difficult question of articulating what they still can contribute to the progress of human knowledge. The inconclusiveness of philosophical speculation has led many philosophers to offer varying ways of making philosophy more scientific in the hopes of partaking in scientific progress. This assimilation of philosophical problems or concerns to science may then help philosophy regain some measure of epistemic respect, and intellectual authority, by adopting a more modest but at least legitimate place alongside, or within, science.
But how we are to understand this relationship between philosophy and science is not unproblematic. Quine’s attempt to situate philosophical inquiry within or alongside empirical science is one pointed and forceful way of thinking about this relationship. His key contribution to our understanding of science does not consist in providing a philosophy of science, but in showing how philosophical concerns can be conceived as scientific. Here, it is useful to further reflect on his specific attempt to bring strict scientific standards to bear on key philosophical issues and problems. Given the ongoing importance of addressing such metaphilosophical worries about the status of philosophy in relation to science, Quine’s view remains useful as a resource, even if many philosophers remain reluctant to adopt his general strategy or its detailed reconstructions of philosophical problems.
Searle’s criticism of Quine’s behaviorism was discussed above. One other important critical response to Quine’s specific rendering of the philosophy-science relationship is found with the work of Michael Friedman (1997, 2001). Quine’s naturalism, with its rejection of any form of a priori knowledge, results in a holistic picture of human knowledge as one large web of belief touching experience only at its edges. Friedman argues that this picture fails to account for a more subtle interaction between the exact sciences, such as mathematics and logic, and the natural sciences, and as a result, cannot properly make sense of their historical development.
Friedman’s alternative picture involves a dynamical system of beliefs, concepts, and principles that can be distinguished into three main elements or levels. There is an evolving system of empirical scientific concepts and principles, a system of mathematical concepts and principles that make possible the framing of empirical science and its precise experimental testing, and lastly a system of philosophical concepts and principles that serve during times of scientific revolution as a source of suggestions for choosing one scientific framework rather than another (Friedman 1997, 18-9; 2001). All of these three systematic levels are constantly changing and interact with each other, but each plays a distinctive role within the general framework of scientific knowledge. For example, consider the revolutionary scientific changes of the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries. Here, the guiding aim was a precise mathematical description of natural phenomena using an atomistic theory of matter that explained natural changes as the result of movement and impact of tiny particles. This guiding ideal requires the use of mathematics to achieve precise results that can then be subjected to exact experimental tests. Here, we have a distinctive contribution at the mathematical level, where this forms the necessary backdrop to empirical testing within the natural sciences. But this achievement lacked the mathematical and empirical resources needed for its successful completion and was sustained by distinct philosophical contributions. It is here that Descartes’ system of natural philosophy, with its careful revision and reorganization of philosophical concepts derived from scholastic philosophy that distinctive philosophical contributions helped to promote this new scientific ideal (Friedman 1997, 14, 16-7).
Although Friedman’s account agrees with Quine that none of our beliefs are forever immune from revision, it further diverges from Quinean naturalism in two fundamental ways. First, it highlights a modified Kantian view of the way mathematical concepts and principles stand as a priori conditions that make possible both the very framing of empirical scientific principles and their experimental testing. Second, it highlights a distinct role for philosophy in relation to science, when it suggests that during deep conceptual revolutions in science, a separate level of philosophical ideas and concepts can be offered as resources for sustaining a new scientific framework. Adopting Quine’s general assimilation of philosophy to empirical science obscures the constitutive a priori role mathematics plays in the formulation of empirical scientific principles, Friedman argues, and further ignores the distinctive role philosophy plays in relation to science during scientific revolutions. Friedman’s alternative conception of the relations between philosophy, mathematics and empirical science suggests a more complicated interaction than seen with Quine’s naturalism, one that arguably is needed if we are to fully understand the historical development of the sciences and philosophy’s contribution to that process.
Brooklyn College, The City University of New York
U. S. A.
Last updated: June 27, 2009 | Originally published: